Port Royal Logic

First published Tue Jul 22, 2014

La Logique ou l'art de penser, better known as the Port-Royal Logic (hereinafter Logic), was the most influential logic text from Aristotle to the end of the nineteenth century. The authors were Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole, philosophers and theologians associated with the Port-Royal Abbey, a center of the heretical Catholic Jansenist movement in seventeenth-century France. The first edition appeared in 1662; during the authors' lifetimes four major revisions were published, the last and most important in 1683. The 1981 critical edition by Pierre Clair and François Girbal lists 63 French editions and 10 English editions (the 1818 English edition served as a text at the Universities of Cambridge and Oxford). The work treats topics in logic, grammar, philosophy of language, theory of knowledge, and metaphysics. The Logic is a companion to General and Rational Grammar: The Port-Royal Grammar, written primarily by Arnauld and “edited” by Claude Lancelot, which appeared in 1660. In general the semantics of the Logic are situated in the context of the Cartesian theory of ideas. Its value to us today resides in its combination of deep insights and confusions.

This entry will briefly discuss Arnauld's connection to the Port-Royal Abbey and the Jansenist movement. Then follows an overview of the work, including a discussion of the Cartesian background and a summary of the main topics treated. The remainder of the discussion will focus on some aspects of the theory of most interest to current logicians and philosophers of language, in particular, the theory of judgment, the semantics of general terms, and the theory of distribution and truth conditions of propositions.

1. Antoine Arnauld, Jansenism and the Port-Royal Abbey

Antoine Arnauld, the primary author of the Port-Royal Logic, was born in Paris on February 8, 1612, to Antoine and Catherine Arnauld. His father was one of the most famous lawyers of his time. The son Antoine, the youngest of their 20 children, originally wanted to study law, but because his father had died in 1619, he decided to honor his mother's wish that he study theology. He entered the Sorbonne, becoming a disciple of Lescot, the confessor of Cardinal Richelieu. In addition to the Port-Royal Grammar and the Port-Royal Logic, Arnauld is best known as the author of the Fourth Objections to Descartes' Meditations. He also engaged in lengthy correspondence with Leibniz, carried on a polemic against Malebranche in the Treatise on True and False Ideas, and wrote several theological essays, including The Perpetuity of the Faith. Pierre Nicole, the secondary author, was born at Chartres in 1625. His father was also a prominent lawyer, with ties to literary circles in Paris. Nicole studied theology at the Sorbonne, where he came into contact with teachers inclined towards Jansenism. When Jansenism came under attack at the Sorbonne, he withdrew and went to the abbey at Port-Royal-des-Champs. He eventually became one of the most prominent Jansenist writers of the seventeenth century; his Moral Essays (1671–7) was his most famous work.

Jansenism was a radical reform movement within French Catholicism based on Augustine's views of the relation between free will and the efficacy of grace. The movement was named after Cornelis Jansen (or Cornelius Jansenius), a Dutch theologian born in 1585 who studied at the Sorbonne. He became the Bishop of Ypres in the Spanish Netherlands in 1636 and died two years later. His major work Augustinus was published posthumously in 1640. A second figure in Jansenism was the Abbot of Saint-Cyran, born Jean Duvergier de Hauranne in 1581. He received his M.A. in theology at the Sorbonne in 1600, where he met Jansen. The two worked together from 1611–1617 on scriptural questions. The issues bringing Jansenism into conflict with Catholic orthodoxy concerned the efficacy of grace, the role of free will in salvation, and the nature of penitence. The attack on Jansen began with Isaac Habert's sermons and writings during 1643–44. By 1653 Pope Innocent X issued an encyclical, Cum occasione, declaring five propositions in Augustinus to be heretical. They expressed the views that a just person who wishes to obey God's commandments cannot do so without the necessary grace to carry them out; that in the state of corrupt nature one can never resist interior grace; and that meritorious actions require only a liberty exempt from constraint rather than one exempt from necessity.

Although he did not agree with all of Jansen's views on grace and free will, Arnauld devoted several major works to defending aspects of Jansenism, including On Frequent Communion, the Defense of Monsieur Jansenius and a Second Defense. These writings resulted in a trial and his expulsion from the Sorbonne in 1656. From 1669 to the late 1670's there was a truce between the Catholic Church and the Jansenists. But in 1679, after attacks had resumed, Arnauld went into exile in the Netherlands; he died at Brussels on August 8, 1694. Pierre Nicole, the coauthor of the Port-Royal Logic, had joined Arnauld in exile. But he returned to Paris in 1683 where he reconciled with the authorities. He died in Paris in 1695.

The Port-Royal Abbey was the center of Jansenist thought in the seventeenth century, thanks largely to the Arnauld family. Two of Arnauld's sisters, Angélique (born Jacqueline) and Agnès (born Jeanne) were nuns at the convent of Port-Royal (later known as Port-Royal-des-Champs), a Cistercian abbey founded in the thirteenth century near Versailles. Angélique had become the abbess of the convent in 1602, at the age of thirteen. Because of unhealthy conditions, in 1626 the nuns relocated to the Faubourg-Saint-Jacques in Paris. The following year the Vatican removed Port-Royal from the Cistercian order and placed it under the jurisdiction of the Archbishop of Paris. In 1636 Saint-Cyran became the spiritual director of the convent, and became associated with a group of men later known as the solitaires of Port-Royal. They eventually included, besides Arnauld, Nicole, and Lancelot, Arnauld's brother Robert and brother-in-law Antoine Le Maistre. Their most important project was founding the Little Schools of Port-Royal, whose most famous pupil was Jean Racine. By that time Saint-Cyran had come into conflict with the Jesuits and Cardinal Richelieu over several theological issues. In 1638 Richelieu had Saint-Cyran arrested and imprisoned at Vincennes on charges of heresy. He was released from prison in 1643 but died a year later.

In April 1661 the Council of State decreed that all churchmen must sign a formulary drawn up in 1657, condemning the heretical propositions in Jansen's work Augustinus. Arnauld and Nicole had taken the position that the propositions were heretical but did not appear in the Augustinus. In June 1664 the Archbishop of Paris interrogated the nuns at Port-Royal-de-Paris; he removed those who refused to sign to other convents and put those remaining at Port-Royal under supervision of another order. In 1665 the nuns who had been dispersed were permitted to go to Port-Royal-des-Champs. During the 1670s Port-Royal-des-Champs experienced a few years of tranquility, but by 1679 Port-Royal was under siege by King Louis XIV, and all confessors, postulants and pensioners were expelled. In 1709 Louis dispersed the nuns and had the buildings leveled. Despite the end of Port-Royal, Jansenism survived until the Revolution of 1789.

2. The Cartesian Background and Organization of the Port-Royal Logic

Although St. Augustine shaped the theology of Jansenism, René Descartes was the true philosophical father of the Port-Royal Logic. Unlike the Jansenists, who suspected the efficacy of reason, Arnauld and Nicole wholeheartedly embraced Descartes' rationalism. In fact, their theory of knowledge is taken almost verbatim from Descartes. But since Cartesian rationalism is in its broad outlines compatible with Augustinian views, Arnauld and Nicole often cite both philosophers. Furthermore, because Descartes' theory of knowledge is inextricably linked with his metaphysics, Arnauld and Nicole endorse Cartesian dualism as well as the principles of Descartes' mechanistic physics.

Descartes' influence is evident in two basic features of the semantics of the Port-Royal Logic. First is the view that thought is prior to language, that words are merely external, conventional signs of independent, private mental states. Although the association between words and ideas is conventional and thus arbitrary, language can signify thought insofar as the structure of a linguistic expression mirrors the structure of the ideas it expresses. The second feature is the framework of the Cartesian theory of ideas. This includes the traditional view that there are four mental operations required for scientific knowledge: conceiving, judging, reasoning, and ordering. These operations must occur in this order, since each operation takes for its elements the product of the preceding operation. Conceiving consists in the apprehension of ideas by the understanding, whereas judging is an action of the will. One can operate on ideas without making judgments, as in forming complex ideas out of simpler ones, and analyzing complex ideas into their parts. The Logic differs from Descartes in identifying forming a proposition with making a judgment. Descartes himself sharply distinguished the voluntary act of judging from apprehending a proposition, since in mere apprehension the mind is passive, and Descartes thought an idea could take propositional form. Port-Royal has difficulty with this issue in their treatment of assertion. Reasoning takes place when one produces judgments from other judgments. By ordering the authors mean putting knowledge into a methodical system.

The text of the Logic is organized around the four mental operations described above. Introductory material to the final (1683) edition includes a Preface (added 1683), a Foreword and First Discourse (1662), and a Second Discourse (added 1664). The First Discourse lays out the plan of the Logic, explaining that its main purpose is to educate judgment to make it more precise, in order to make the speculative sciences more useful. Thus the Logic contains not only rules for correct reasoning but also examples of how reasoning can go wrong. The Second Discourse offers a reply to objections to the first edition. The main point is to justify their critical treatment of Aristotle, on the ground that knowing how a great mind can err can help others avoid making the same mistakes. But they also take pains to point out how much the Logic owes to Aristotle's Analytics and other works. The main text that follows consists of parts devoted to the four mental operations.

Part I contains “reflections on ideas, or the first action of the mind, which is called conceiving”. It consists of 15 chapters devoted to five topics: the nature and origin of ideas (chapter 1); the objects ideas represent (chapters 2–4); simple vs. compound ideas (chapter 5); the extension and restriction of ideas, including a logical analysis of universal, particular, and singular ideas and the extension and comprehension of terms (chapters 6–8); and clear and distinct vs. obscure and confused ideas, including a discussion of types of definition (chapters 9–15).

Part II consists of 20 chapters treating “reflections people have made about their judgments”. Recognizing that the mind closely links ideas with the words that express them, their discussion begins with an analysis of parts of speech in chapters 1 and 2. Chapters 3 and 4 present a version of the Aristotelian theory of categorical proposition and the square of opposition. Chapters 5–14 treat the properties of simple, compound, and complex propositions, including how to identify and classify them. This section contains the famous distinction between restrictive (“determinative”) and non-restrictive (“explicative”) subordinate clauses (chapter 6), as well as a discussion of logical connectives and non-truth-functional propositions (chapter 9). The theory of definition is the subject of chapters 15 and 16. Finally, chapters 17–20 on the conversion of propositions contain part of the Port-Royal version of the medieval doctrine of distribution.

Part III focuses on the rules of reasoning, and is divided into 20 chapters. Although the authors admit that most erroneous reasoning is based on false premises rather than incorrect inferences, they believe the study of syllogistic forms is helpful to exercise the mind. The authors classify syllogisms into simple and conjunctive, and simple syllogisms into complex and noncomplex. After defining terms in chapters 1 and 2, they present general rules for simple, noncomplex syllogisms in chapter 3. This chapter completes their theory of the distribution of terms, begun in the last four chapters of Part II. Chapters 4 through 8 explain in tedious detail the figures and moods of simple syllogisms, again reproducing traditional Aristotelian views. In chapters 9 through 12 the authors treat in a less formal way principles for recognizing validity in complex syllogisms. Chapters 14, 15, and 16 discuss respectively enthymemes, sorites (syllogisms with more than three propositions) and dilemmas. Despite their view of the uselessness of the theory of topics (the method for finding arguments), the authors treat it in chapters 17 and 18. Here they criticize Aristotle, Ramus and the Scholastics. Finally, chapters 19 and 20 discuss sophisms and fallacies.

The Logic ends in Part IV with a theory of scientific knowledge. Chapter 1 lays the groundwork in Descartes' and Augustine's rationalism, criticizing the role of the senses in providing knowledge, as well as the claims of Academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics. After spelling out the methods of analysis and synthesis in chapter 2, the authors spend chapters 3 through 10 on the methods of geometry, including rules of definitions, axioms, and demonstrations. Chapter 11 then offers eight rules of scientific method. Finally, chapters 12 through 16 contrast the nature of knowledge with faith or belief.

3. The Semantic Theory of the Port-Royal Logic

As mentioned above, the semantics of the Logic is an interesting amalgam of medieval and seventeenth-century theories. Arnauld and Nicole attempt to force a Cartesian view of judgment onto the traditional theory of categorical propositions and a medieval term logic. This attempt to graft a new theory of knowledge onto an existing logical framework inevitably raises problems. This section will focus on three major aspects of the theory, namely their account of the proposition and judgment, the semantics of general terms, and the theory of distribution and truth conditions of propositions. It will highlight two major contributions to semantics -- the analysis of subordinate clauses and the distinction between the comprehension and extension of terms -- as well as some problematic views of the structure of judgment, the nature of assertion, and their treatment of predication.

3.1 The theory of judgment

The Port-Royal theory of judgment (or proposition) is an example of what Geach and others have called the ‘two-name’ view. Every simple judgment is composed of the same three elements: a subject, a predicate, and a copula connecting the two. These elements are expressed linguistically in the simplest case by a proper or substantive noun, a common noun or adjective, and a verb, as in the sentences ‘Socrates is mortal’ and ‘All men are mortal’. The authors use the terms ‘subject’ and ‘predicate’ to refer indifferently to the ideas making up the judgment as well as to their linguistic expressions. As indicated above, Port-Royal is wedded to the theory of categorical propositions, classifying them in terms of quantity as universal, particular, or singular, and in terms of quality as affirmative or negative. The authors take the traditional stand that singular propositions function logically like universals, and so all simple propositions have one of the following four forms, labeled A, E, I, and O: ‘All S is P’, ‘No S is P’, ‘Some S is P’, and ‘Some S is not P’. Also following the tradition, Port-Royal treats the quantifiers ‘all’ and ‘some’ as part of the subject, so that ‘all men’ and ‘some men’ are logically significant units. In explaining the rules of conversion, in Part II, chapter 17, they argue that predicates are implicitly quantified: when one says ‘All lions are animals’, one does not mean that all lions are all the animals, but only some of the animals. So ‘All S is P’ in general means ‘All S is (some) P’ (Logic II.17: 130).

Most propositions, however, are more complex than this classification suggests, for subjects and predicates need not be simple. In the proposition ‘God who is invisible created the world which is visible’, both the subject and predicate include subordinate clauses that appear to contain propositions (Logic II.5–8). But because of the overall subject-predicate structure of all propositions, embedded propositions must be located in the subject or predicate. This becomes problematic when Arnauld and Nicole discuss rules of inference, since they have to force all propositions, including conditionals and disjunctives, into standard categorical forms. Their treatment of the proposition, then, requires that subjects and predicates have unlimited complexity. Thus the Port-Royal theory provides no basic inventory of simple parts permitting a recursive analysis, as in the modern classification of variables, function or predicate symbols, and logical symbols. On the classical view the proposition has a simple organic unity from the outside and a reiterable complexity from the inside.

When it comes to making judgments, the part of a proposition that represents the act of willing distinguishing a judgment from a mere conception is the copula, expressed linguistically by the verb. The copula has two functions in a judgment: it relates the subject and the predicate, and it signifies affirmation or denial. Arnauld and Nicole criticize Aristotle and other philosophers who combine the copula with features of the predicate (time) and subject (person); in a well-formed language there would be only one substantive verb, namely to be. In fact, natural languages often combine the predicate with the verb, as in ‘Peter lives’, and Latin verbs sometimes express all three elements of judgment in one word, as in cogito and sum. Descartes thought that in judging one holds a complex idea or proposition before the mind and then affirms or denies that it corresponds to reality. But the Port-Royal treatment of the copula raises serious problems for the accounts of negation and assertive force.

Negative judgments are those expressed by sentences containing a negative word or syllable attached to the verb, and are understood as denials, or judgments having an effect opposite to affirmations. Since in affirming one unites two ideas, in denying one separates the subject from the predicate:

If I say God is not unjust, the word is when joined to the particle not signifies the action contrary to affirming, namely denying, in which I view these ideas as repugnant to one another, because the idea unjust contains something contrary to what is contained in the idea God. (Logic II.3: 82–3)

Since the ‘not’ is attached to the verb, negation extends to the entire judgment. As Frege points out in his essay ‘Negation’ (1918, for English version see Frege 1966), this account makes it impossible to recognize a false thought or grasp true thoughts that have false thoughts as their components, such as true conditionals with false antecedents or consequents. For example, to recognize that ‘3 is greater than 5’ is false requires having a complete thought, and not merely fragments of a thought. In addition, this account makes it impossible to understand the force of double negation: if denying dissolves the thought into its parts, then double negation would function as a sword that magically unites the parts it had sundered. (Frege 1966: 122–29) The root problem in treating negation as denial is the failure to distinguish the thought or proposition that is grasped from the act of judging it.

This same problem surfaces in the Port-Royal view that the copula has assertive force, which makes it impossible to distinguish making a judgment from merely thinking a proposition. According to the Logic, every time one connects a subject and a predicate one is ipso facto judging. Thus there is no room for thinking propositions while suspending judgment, as Descartes advocates in his method of doubt. This view of the copula also creates a problem for embedded generality. Because of the ‘two-name’ view, Port-Royal must locate subordinate clauses in either the subject or the predicate. But some embedded clauses make assertions and some do not. Despite the two verbs in the complex proposition ‘Men who are pious are charitable’, for example, it is clear that one is not asserting of all men or even some men that they are pious. On the other hand, ‘God who is invisible created the world which is visible’ permits three assertions: ‘God is invisible’, ‘The world is visible’, and ‘God created the world’ (II.5: 87). Port-Royal explains the difference between these two kinds of embedding in terms of ‘determinative’ and ‘explicative’ subordinate clauses (or, as they say, relative pronouns) (see II.6–8). Determinative subordinate clauses restrict the signification of the antecedent of the relative pronoun (e.g., ‘men who are pious’) whereas explicative clauses do not (e.g., ‘God who is invisible’). In fact both determinations and explications can be carried out as well without embedded or subordinate clauses, as in the sentences ‘Pious men are charitable’ and ‘The invisible God created the visible world’. So this view of the copula again fails to distinguish complex ideas containing assertions from those that do not, showing how far Port-Royal was from a satisfactory treatment of assertion and embedded generality (see Buroker 1994).

In a recent article Van der Schaar amends the account given above, pointing out that although Port-Royal generally assumes the proposition has assertive force, the authors recognize deviant contexts in which this is not true. She draws attention to their treatment of modality (Logic II.8) where modal terms such as ‘possible’ and ‘necessary’ function to modify the act of judging rather than the content of the proposition (see Van der Scharr 2008: 334–5). The authors label such acts ‘tacit’ or ‘virtual’ affirmations (II.7: 93). She concludes that although for Port-Royal the notion of asserted proposition is prior in the order of explanation, the authors in fact analyze some complex propositions as lacking assertive force.

3.2 Semantics of Terms

The Port-Royal semantics is based on a theory of the relations between words, ideas, and things. Like Descartes, Arnauld and Nicole hold that the representative relation between ideas and things is both objective and natural. They specify that when they speak of ideas, they mean “anything in the mind when we can truthfully say that we are conceiving something, however we conceive it” (Logic I.1: 26). Thus the idea viewed as the element of logic and knowledge is the objective content of thought. And since ideas represent things, the structure of ideas is isomorphic to the structure of the real: one cannot change the content of the idea of a right triangle. By contrast, the relation between words and ideas is not natural, for words are conventional signs of thoughts (I.4: 37). Humans assign words their meaning through acts of institution. So the expressive relation between words and ideas differs in important ways from the representative relation between ideas and things. First, the relation between the linguistic sign and its idea is causal-psychological. That is, words, like natural signs, signify by prompting an idea in the perceiver's mind. In practice, however, Port-Royal tends to assimilate words to ideas, calling both ‘terms’, and treats significance as transitive, claiming the words used to express ideas also signify the things signified by ideas. There is a second difference between linguistic and eidetic significance, namely that the correspondence between words and ideas is imperfect. Port-Royal assumes that if language coincided exactly with thought, each word would express one simple idea, and the structure of the sentence would mirror the structure of ideas. But humans use single words like ‘triangle’ to express complex ideas, and are sometimes confused as to which ideas are connected with which words. Consequently there is no guarantee that the structure of linguistic discourse accurately reflects the structure of ideas. As this overview suggests, the semantic theory in Port-Royal is carried out on two levels, first with respect to ideas, and second with respect to language.

Port-Royal first classifies ideas with respect to their objects. According to Cartesian metaphysics, there are three sorts of things: substances, attributes or primary essential properties of substances, and modes or accidental properties. Port-Royal condenses this framework into the simpler distinction between things or substances and manners of things. A thing is “conceived as subsisting by itself and as the subject of everything conceived about it”; examples of nouns signifying things are ‘earth’, ‘sun’, ‘mind’, and ‘God’. A manner is “conceived as in the thing and not able to subsist without it, determines it to be in a certain way and causes it to be so named”. Manners are expressed by abstract nouns such as ‘hardness’ and ‘justice’, as well as by adjectives such as ‘hard’ and ‘just’ (I.2: 30–31). As will become apparent below, adjectives have a more complex form of signification than nouns. But at this first level the theory depends on a distinction between things, that is, complete or independent entities, and manners of things, incomplete or dependent entities. The table below gives a general sketch of the theory so far:

Simple Port-Royal

\[ \begin{array}{rcccl} \text{Language} & \xrightarrow[\text{expresses}]{} & \text{Idea} & \xrightarrow[\text{represents}]{} & \text{World} \\ \begin{matrix} \text{Name of} \\ \text{Substance} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[\substack{ \text{‘earth’, ’sun’,} \\ \text{‘mind’, ‘God’} }]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Idea of} \\ \text{Substance} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[\text{represents}]{} & \text{Substance} \\ \begin{matrix} \text{Name of} \\ \text{Attribute} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[\substack{ \text{‘hardness’, ’hard’,} \\ \text{‘justice’, ‘just’} }]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Idea of} \\ \text{Attribute} \\ \text{or Manner} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[\text{represents}]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Attribute or} \\ \text{Manner of a Thing} \end{matrix} \end{array} \]

This treatment in some ways resembles a modern analysis of predication: ideas of substances would function as subjects of judgment; ideas of attributes or manners would be predicates. The analysis also looks Fregean given the emphasis on the distinction between complete and incomplete objects of thought. Thus Cartesian metaphysics has the resources to analyze an atomic proposition as composed of an expression for an attribute and a name of an object. But because of the subject-predicate analysis of all judgment and their semantics of general terms, the final theory is more complex. What results is a systematic confusion between names and predicates. (This discussion is based on Buroker 1993.)

The first complication occurs in Chapter 6 of Part I, where the authors distinguish singular from general or universal ideas. Although everything that exists is singular, ideas can represent more than one thing, such as the general idea of a triangle. They then distinguish proper nouns which indicate single individuals, such as ‘Socrates’, ‘Rome’, ‘Bucephalus’, from common or appellative nouns such as ‘man’, ‘city’, ‘horse’, which can indicate more than one thing. Throughout the text, the authors call both universal ideas and common nouns ‘general terms’. The question that arises is the relation between these two ways of classifying ideas, the first in terms of complete or incomplete objects, the second into singular or general ideas. It is tempting to identify the two, but this is not easy for Port-Royal. The best way to appreciate the complexity in the theory is to use Frege's simpler theory as a point of reference.

For Frege, meaning takes place in a three-fold structure, comprised of linguistic expressions, the entities they designate or refer to, and the sense of the expression, which is a mode of presenting the entity. In ‘The Thought’ (1918, for English version see Frege 1966) Frege carefully distinguishes the subjective nature of ideas considered as mental states from the objective nature of thoughts expressed in judgments (Frege 1966: 302). Despite the difference in terminology, Fregean senses function very much like ideas in Port-Royal: they are the objective contents of thoughts and utterances. Frege maintains that connected to every linguistic sign there is a reference and a sense. The sense is the mode of presentation of that to which the sign refers. Frege divides linguistic signs into three groups: proper names (singular terms), function expressions (including concept-expressions), and sentences. Proper names and sentences are complete names; function-expressions are incomplete names. In ‘On Sense and Reference’ Frege specifies that proper names such as ‘Socrates’ and ‘the teacher of Plato’ express individual or complete senses, which refer to individual complete entities. Declarative sentences also express senses—the thought contained in the sentence—and designate or refer to complete objects, namely the truth value of the sentence. In ‘Comments on Sense and Meaning’ Frege makes clear that the reference of a function-expression is a function, an incomplete entity. Function-expressions contain one or more gaps corresponding to the ‘unsaturated’ or incomplete nature of the sense they express and the entities they designate. For example, the expression ‘is a man’ names a concept under which all humans fall. Here is a sketch of Frege's theory:


\[ \begin{array}{rcccl} \text{Language} & \xrightarrow[\text{expresses}]{} & \text{Sense} & \xrightarrow[\text{refers to}]{} & \text{World} \\ \\ \text{Proper Name} & \xrightarrow[\substack{ \text{(complete) singular} \\ \text{term ‘Socrates’} }]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Individual Sense} \\ \text{(saturated)} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[]{} & \text{Object} \\ \\ \begin{matrix} \text{Function} \\ \text{Expression} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[\substack{ \text{(incomplete, gappy) concept} \\ \text{expression ‘is mortal’} }]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Incomplete Sense} \\ \text{(unsaturated)} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Function} \\ \text{(Concept)} \end{matrix} \\ \\ \begin{matrix} \text{Declarative} \\ \text{Sentence} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[\substack{ \text{(complete) ‘Socrates} \\ \text{is mortal’} }]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Complete Thought} \\ \text{(saturated)} \end{matrix} & \xrightarrow[]{} & \begin{matrix} \text{Truth} \\ \text{Value} \end{matrix} \end{array} \]

So far there is an overlap between this view and Port-Royal's theory of ideas. For Arnauld and Nicole meaning has a three-fold structure, with ideas taking the place of Fregean senses. Linguistic signs express ideas, which represent or refer to entities, either things or their attributes. Names of entities are either proper or common, depending on whether they express singular or general ideas. If the distinction between ideas of things and ideas of attributes coincided with the distinction between singular and general ideas, the parallel with Frege would be complete. But Port-Royal actually says that general ideas represent or refer to more than one individual. On this view the reference of a general term is not an attribute, but the collection of individuals possessing the attribute. This is one way Port-Royal assimilates the relation of a name to its bearer with the relation of a predicate or concept-expression to the objects falling under it. Had the authors stopped here, the picture would be fairly simple. But they develop the theory in two ways. First, they contribute to the history of semantics by distinguishing the comprehension (or intension) of a general term from its extension (denotation). And second, they are led astray by grammatical considerations into blurring their own distinction between expressions for complete and incomplete entities.

Medieval philosophers explained the significance of general terms by a complex theory of supposition (see Spade 1982). Port-Royal condenses this framework so that the significance of general ideas has two aspects: the comprehension and the extension. The comprehension consists in the set of attributes essential to the idea. For example, the comprehension of the idea ‘triangle’ includes the attributes extension, shape, three lines, and three angles. The extension of the idea consists in the inferiors or subjects to which the term applies, which for Port-Royal includes “all the different species of triangles” (I.6: 39–40). Here the authors confuse the species with the individual, or the relation of set inclusion with set membership. Usually, however, they take the extension of a general idea to be the individuals possessing the attributes in its comprehension. There are three key features of this theory of signification. First, the comprehension rather than the extension is essential to the function of a general idea: one cannot remove an attribute without destroying the idea, whereas one can restrict its extension by applying it to only some of the subjects that fall under it. Second, the comprehension governs the extension: the set of attributes determines the individuals (and species) in its extension. Finally, comprehensions and extensions are inversely related. In adding attributes to the comprehension of an idea one restricts its extension (assuming attributes are independent and instantiated). For example, if the comprehension of the idea ‘mammal’ includes that of the idea ‘animal’, the extension of ‘animal’ includes that of ‘mammal’. Port-Royal implicitly assumes this principle throughout the text. In recognizing these two modes of signification—the comprehension and the extension—Port-Royal imports the distinction between incomplete and complete entities into the signification of general terms.

Completing the theory of signification of terms is the noun system, taken largely from Part II of the Grammar. As explained in Part II of the Logic, nouns are names of entities, that is, substances and attributes. Substantive nouns such as ‘earth’ and ‘sun’ signify substances, and adjectival nouns such as ‘good’ and ‘just’ signify attributes, “indicating at the same time the subject to which they apply…”. Just as substances are ontologically prior to their manners or modes, nouns preceded adjectives in the genesis of language. From the adjective one then creates a secondary substantive, an abstract noun:

after having formed the adjective human from the substantive word man, we form the substantive humanity from the adjective human. (Logic II.1: 74)

Thus there are three kinds of nouns: concrete substantives, adjectives, and abstract substantives. The Logic says that adjectives have two significations: a distinct signification of the mode or manner, and a confused signification of the subject. Although the signification of the mode is more distinct, it is indirect; by contrast the confused signification of the subject is direct (II.1: 74–75). So on their account every noun picks out or distinctly signifies one thing, either an individual, a collection of individuals, or an attribute. Concrete substantives distinctly signify complete objects, that is, individual substances: ‘man’ distinctly signifies human beings. The adjective ‘human’ distinctly signifies the incomplete object, the attribute of being human. And abstract substantives such as ‘humanity’ also pick out this attribute distinctly. But the adjective ‘human’, unlike the concrete substantive ‘man’, is linguistically incomplete, since it means ‘a human [being]’. Linguistically adjectives are gappy and require completion by a substantive to refer. Port-Royal identifies this incomplete signification as the connotation or confused (but direct) signification of an adjective. So adjectives signify substances directly and confusedly, and attributes indirectly and distinctly. Because substantive nouns of both kinds are linguistically complete, they lack connotation altogether, and have only distinct and direct signification to the individual substances or attributes they name. The following chart represents these signification relations:

\[ \begin{array}{rl} \begin{array}{rc} \text{Concrete Substantives} & \xrightarrow[]{\text{‘man’}} \\ \text{Adjectives} & \left\{\begin{array}{c} \xrightarrow[\text{‘human’}]{} \\ \xrightarrow[]{} \end{array} \right. \\ \text{Abstract Substantives} & \xrightarrow[\text{‘humanity’}]{} \end{array} & \begin{array}{cl} \left. \begin{array}{c} \substack{\text{distinct and} \\ \text{direct}} \\ \substack{\text{confused and} \\ \text{direct}} \end{array} \right\} & \text{Substances} \\ \left. \begin{array}{c} \substack{\text{distinct and}\,\, \\ \text{indirect}} \\ \substack{\text{distinct and} \\ \text{direct}} \end{array} \right\} & \text{Attributes} \\ \end{array} \end{array} \]

It looks as though Port-Royal is led to this notion of the double signification of adjectives only because they transfer metaphysical categories to language. Originally, concrete nouns were words naming substances or complete entities, and adjectives were names of attributes or incomplete entities. But Arnauld and Nicole blur this distinction by taking signification to depend on whether the word is capable of referring alone in discourse. Incorporating this last analysis into the overall semantics yields this final result:

Revised Port-Royal

\[ \begin{array}{rcccc} \substack{ \textbf{Language} } & \xrightarrow[\text{expresses}]{} & \substack{ \textbf{Idea} } & \xrightarrow[\text{represents}]{} & \substack{ \textbf{World} } \\ \\ \substack{ \textbf{Proper} \\ \textbf{Name} } & \xrightarrow[\substack{ \text{singular term} \\ \text{‘Socrates’}}]{} & \substack{ \textbf{Singular} \\ \textbf{Idea} } & \xrightarrow{} & \substack{ \textbf{Single} \\ \textbf{Substance} } \\ \\ \substack{ \textbf{Common} \\ \textbf{Noun} } & \left\{ \begin{array}{c} \substack{ \text{Concrete} \\ \text{Substantive} \\ \text{‘man’} } \\ \substack{ \text{Adjective} \\ \text{‘human’} } \\ \substack{ \text{Abstact} \\ \text{Substantive} \\ \text{‘humanity’} } \end{array} \right\} & \substack{ \textbf{General or} \\ \textbf{Universal Idea} \\ \text{(comprehension,} \\ \text{extension)} } & \left\{ \begin{array}{c} \left. \begin{array}{cc} \xrightarrow{} & \substack{\text{distinct and} \\ \text{direct}} \\ \xrightarrow{} & \substack{\text{confused and} \\ \text{indirect}} \end{array} \right\} \\ \left. \begin{array}{cc} \xrightarrow{} & \substack{\text{distinct and}\,\, \\ \text{indirect}} \\ \xrightarrow{} & \substack{\text{distinct and} \\ \text{direct}} \end{array} \right\} \end{array} \right. & \begin{array}{l} \substack { \textbf{More Than} \\ \textbf{One Substance} \\ \text{(Extension of Idea)} } \\ \\ \substack{ \textbf{Attribute or} \\ \textbf{Manner of a Thing} \\ \text{(Comprehension)} } \end{array} \end{array} \]

In spite of the complexity a few observations are possible. First, both concrete nouns and adjectives directly signify the objects in the extension of the term. This makes it look as if Arnauld and Nicole are equating ‘direct signification’ with ‘being predicable of’ (or denotation), except that this does not apply in the case of the abstract noun. On the other hand, the distinct but indirect signification of the adjective looks equivalent to Frege's view of the reference of concept-expressions, except that Frege treats the distinction between complete and incomplete reference as invariant across grammatical form. On his view both common nouns and adjectives are incomplete expressions. Their predicative nature is more easily seen when they are correctly formulated, as in ‘is a man’ and ‘is human’.

It is not so clear whether Port Royal wants to apply the distinction between the comprehension and extension of an idea to singular terms. In fact, they treat singular terms, including definite descriptions, as afterthoughts. One passage does, however, address the nature of definite descriptions. In chapter 8 of Part I the authors elaborate on the “error of equivocation” that can occur when people interpret a complex singular term differently. For example, adherents to different faiths can disagree over the referent of the complex singular term ‘the true religion’. Stoianovici argues that in their explanation Arnauld and Nicole come close to recognizing Donnellan's distinction between attributive and referential uses of definite descriptions. According to the account of general terms, adjectives or ‘connotative terms’ signify substances (the extension) confusedly and directly, but attributes (the comprehension) distinctly but indirectly. The authors treat definite descriptions such as ‘the true religion’ as connotative (general) terms rather than singular terms, claiming they refer confusedly to a distinct individual. The error occurs when different thinkers substitute different individuals for this reference. As Stoianovici notes, their analysis explicitly recognizes only the referential use, although it implies the possibility of the attributive use of definite descriptions.

3.3 The theory of distribution and truth conditions of categorical propositions

Very little has been written on the Port Royal views of truth conditions of propositions, and the rules of valid syllogisms, including their account of the distribution of terms. Recently Parsons addresses their views in his article on the history of the theory of distribution. Parsons' main concern is to respond to criticisms of the doctrine of distribution raised by Geach, who maintains both that the doctrine originated in the medieval theory of the ‘distributed supposition’ (reference) of terms and that it is incoherent. Parsons argues to the contrary that it appeared much earlier, in connection with the test for validity of syllogisms in the theory of inference. Although Aristotle did not have a term for distribution, he did express the concept of a term's being taken universally in On Interpretation. In his defense of the doctrine, Parsons argues that the Port Royal theory of truth conditions of propositions, although incomplete and idiosyncratic, can be extended to provide a coherent account of distribution. This section will briefly treat the Port Royal theory of distribution and some aspects of the related account of truth conditions of judgments.

As explained in 3.1 above, the Logic classifies simple categorical propositions into four forms: universal affirmatives (All S is P), universal negatives (No S is P), particular affirmatives (Some S is P) and particular negatives (Some S is not P). Simple categorical syllogisms are arguments with two premises and a conclusion, each statement taking one of these four forms. Port Royal gives this example of a categorical syllogism:

  • Every good prince is loved by his subjects.
  • Every pious king is a good prince.
  • Therefore every pious king is loved by his subjects. (Logic III.2: 137)

In this syllogism the term “good prince” is the middle term, because it appears in both premises but not in the conclusion. In chapter 3 of Part III, Port Royal gives six rules or “axioms” for valid simple categorical syllogisms, rules conforming to standard medieval logic. The first two concern the distribution of terms, where a distributed term is expressed as one ‘taken universally’:

  • Rule 1: The middle term cannot be taken particularly twice, but must be taken universally at least once.
  • Rule 2: The terms of the conclusion cannot be taken more universally in the conclusion than in the premises. (Logic III.3: 139–40)

The remaining four rules express the standard views that at least one premise must be affirmative, the conclusion must be affirmative if both premises are affirmative, if one premise is negative the conclusion must be negative, and nothing follows from two particular premises (III.3: 141–42).

In general, a term is distributed if it is ‘taken universally’ or refers to all the individuals it denotes; otherwise it is undistributed. As Parsons explains, the denotation of a term is its extension on its own, whereas its reference is its extension in a proposition (Parsons 2006: 61). Thus the term ‘prince’ denotes (i.e., is predicable of) all princes, but in the proposition ‘Some princes are just’, the quantifier ‘Some’ restricts its extension in the proposition (its reference) to a subset of its extension on its own (denotation). According to the rules for distribution stated by medieval logicians, the subject terms of universal propositions and the predicates of negative propositions are distributed or taken universally throughout their extension; all other terms are undistributed. Port Royal accepts these rules in chapters 17–20 of Part II, in explaining the conversion of propositions, accounting for them in terms of the truth conditions of propositions. The First Axiom of affirmative propositions states that the subjects of universal affirmatives are distributed (taken universally) and the subjects of particular affirmatives are not (II.17: 130). According to the Fourth Axiom of affirmative propositions,

The extension of the attribute is restricted by that of the subject, such that it signifies no more than the part of its extension which applies to the subject. For example, when we say that humans are animals, the word ‘animal’ no longer signifies all animals, but only those animals that are humans. (Logic II.17: 130–31)

The rules for conversion of affirmative propositions follow from these truth conditions, namely that universal affirmatives can be converted “by adding a mark of particularity to the attribute which becomes the subject”, and particular affirmatives can be simply converted (II.18: 132). Chapters 19 and 20 of Part II similarly treat the truth conditions of negative propositions and their respective rules of conversion. The nature of a negative proposition “is to conceive that one thing is not another”, that is, the subject is not the attribute. Thus the Sixth Axiom states that “The attribute of a negative proposition is always taken generally” or is distributed. Parsons notes that as stated the theory of truth conditions is in fact incomplete because the authors do not explicitly discuss the extensions in the proposition of the subject terms of particular negatives, but one can presume that the rules for extensions of subject terms in affirmative propositions apply (Parsons 2006: 70). When completed to preserve the logical relations in Aristotle's square of opposition (which Port Royal clearly intends), the theory fits both with the traditional doctrine of distribution and more modern views of the truth conditions of categorical propositions. Thus Parsons takes the Port Royal account of truth conditions to give a coherent basis for the traditional theory of distribution.

More recently Martin offers a more detailed interpretation of the Port-Royal theory of truth-conditions for categorical propositions. Like Parsons, he discusses the relation between the truth-conditions of propositions and the theory of distribution. Martin disagrees with Parsons' view that the doctrine of distribution developed independently of the medieval theory of distributive supposition. According to his analysis, the Port Royal theory of truth-conditions depends on the idea of a universal (distributive) term, as well as the notion of a conservative quantifier and the distinction between affirmative and negative propositions (see Martin 2013).

As is clear, the Port-Royal Logic is full of confusions as well as insights. This discussion has emphasized their confusions between complex idea and proposition, proposition and judgment, and especially name and predicate. Other topics that deserve more attention include singular terms and definite descriptions, logical operators and quantifiers, the theory of truth conditions, and the theory of inference. It may be more profitable to regard the work as incorporating several logics, and to view the confusions as the inevitable results of the tensions among these different views.


Recent Editions of the Port-Royal Logic

All quotations and citations to the Port Royal Logic are to the Buroker translation, 1996, listed below.

  • Arnauld, Antoine, et Pierre Nicole: La Logique ou l'art de penser, édition critique par Pierre Clair et François Girbal, Paris: J. Vrin, 1981.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, et Pierre Nicole: La Logique ou l'art de penser, édition critique par Dominique Descartes, Paris: Champion, 2011.
  • Arnauld, Antoine, The Art of Thinking, Port-Royal Logic, translated by James Dickoff and Patricia James, New York: Library of Liberal Arts, 1964.
  • Arnauld, Antoine and Pierre Nicole, Logic or the Art of Thinking, translated by Jill Vance Buroker, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.

Works on the History of the Port-Royal Abbey

  • Clark, Ruth, Strangers and Sojourners at Port Royal, New York: Octagon Books, 1932; reprint 1972.
  • Sainte-Beuve, C. A., Port Royal (3 vols.) Paris: Bibliothèque de la Pléiade, 1961–5.
  • Sedgwick, Alexander, Jansenism in Seventeenth-Century France, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia, 1977.

Secondary Works Cited or Recommended

  • Buroker, Jill Vance, 1993, “The Port-Royal Semantics of Terms”, Synthese, 96(3): 455–75.
  • –––, 1994, “Judgment and Predication in the Port-Royal Logic”, in Kremer (ed.), The Great Arnauld and some of his Philosophical Correspondents, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, pp. 3–27.
  • –––, 1996, “Arnauld on Judging and the Will” in Kremer (ed.), Interpreting Arnauld, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, pp. 3–12.
  • Donnellan, Keith, 1966, “Reference and Definite Descriptions”, Philosophical Review, 77: 281–304.
  • Finocchiaro, Maurice, 1997, “The Port-Royal Logic's Theory of Argument”, Argumentation, 11: 393–410.
  • Frege, Gottlob, 1918, “Der Gedanke. Eine Logische Untersuchung”, in Beiträge zur Philosophie des deutschen Idealismus, Volume I (1918–1919), pp. 58–77.
  • Frege, Gottlob, 1966, Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, P. Geach and M. Black (ed. and trans.), Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Martin, J. N. 2010, “Existential Commitment and the Cartesian Semantics of the Port-Royal Logic”, in J-Y Beziau (ed.), New Perspectives on the Square of Opposition, New York: Peter Lang.
  • –––, 2011, “Existential Import in Cartesian Semantics”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 32(3): 211–39.
  • –––, 2013, “Distributive Terms, Truth, and the Port Royal Logic”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 34(2): 133–54.
  • Miel, Jan, 1969, “Pascal, Port-Royal, and Cartesian Linguistics”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 30(2): 261–71.
  • Ott, Walter, 2002, “Propositional Attitudes in Modern Philosophy”, Dialogue, 41(3): 551–68.
  • Pariente, Jean-Claude, 1985, L'analyse du langage à Port-Royal, Paris: Editions de Minuit.
  • Parsons, Terence, 2006, “The Doctrine of Distribution”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 27(1): 59–74.
  • Spade, Paul, 1982, “The Semantics of Terms”, in Kretzmann, Kenny, and Pinborg (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 188–96.
  • Stoianovici, Dragan, 1976, “Definite Descriptions in Port-Royal Logic”, Revue Roumaine des Sciences Sociales, Série de Philosophie et Logique, 20: 145–54.
  • Van der Schaar, Maria, 2008, “Locke and Arnauld on Judgment and Proposition”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 29(4): 327–41.

Other Internet Resources

  • Antoine Arnauld, entry by Eric Stencil, Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

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Jill Buroker <jburoker@csusb.edu>

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