Perceptual Experience and Perceptual Justification

First published Wed Jun 17, 2015

When you see a ripe lemon in a supermarket, it seems eminently reasonable for you to believe that a lemon is there. Here you have a perceptual experience since you consciously see something yellow. And your experience seems to justify your belief since your experience seems to make it reasonable for you to believe that a lemon is there.

Our perceptual experiences of the world outside us seem to justify our beliefs about how the world outside us is. If that's right, a question in the epistemology of perception remains open: how do our experiences justify beliefs about the external world? And a question in the philosophy of mind remains open as well: what are our experiences themselves like?

This entry will survey interactions between the epistemology of perception and the philosophy of mind. Following the existing literature, the focus will be on visual experience. The reader is invited to consider how generalizations to other senses might or might not succeed.

Section 1 considers theories of experience and what implications they might have for the epistemology of perception. Section 2 considers perceptual phenomena, such as attending or dreaming, with special implications for the epistemology of perception.

1. Theories of Experience

For our purposes, a theory of perceptual experience aims to identify a feature that is constitutive of perceptual experience: it is shared by all perceptual experiences, and identifies at least part of their nature. In this section, we will consider various potential links between theories of experience and the epistemology of perception that can be captured with the following template:

Epistemology-Mind Link
If experiences justify beliefs about the external world, then experiences have property \(P\).

The idea here is that experiences have to be a certain way in order to justify beliefs. Now, philosophers might accept a particular instance of the E-M Link, but disagree about whether experiences are the way they need to be in order to justify beliefs about the external world. For example, Davidson (1986) and McDowell (1994) agree that experiences justify beliefs about the external world only if experiences have contents that can be assessed for truth. Davidson (1986) argues that experiences do not justify beliefs about the external world on the grounds that they lack truth-assessable contents, whereas McDowell (1994) argues that experiences must have truth-assessable contents given that they justify beliefs about the external world (more on their dispute in subsection 1.2).

We can organize our discussion of such agreements and disagreements around the following trio of claims:

Our experiences justify beliefs about the external world.

Epistemology-Mind Link
If our experiences justify beliefs about the external world, then our experiences have property \(P\).

Our experiences do not have property \(P\).

If Epistemology and Epistemology-Mind Link are true, then Mind is false. Something will have to go. Approaches will vary according to their verdict on what exactly must go.

In what follows we survey the most prominent instances of the trio. We will start with sense-data theories, then turn to raw feel theories, and theories on which experiences have propositional contents. We will close the part by considering the conscious character of experiences.

1.1 Sense-datum Theories

On sense-datum theories, whenever you have a visual experience as if there is something present that is red, there really is something present that is red—a sense-datum. Now, in many cases of illusions and hallucination, there won't be any ordinary red thing around for you to experience even if there seems to you to be a red thing present. So sense-data are either going to be mental objects or at any rate very strange non-mental objects. More generally, a sense-datum theory is any view that accepts the following:

The Phenomenal Principle
Whenever you visually experience it to be that case that something is \(F\), then there is something \(F\) that you experience (Robinson 1994).

Let's first examine an epistemological case for sense-datum theories. Here the direction of flow is from epistemology to the philosophy of mind. We can find it in the following famous quote from H.H. Price:

When I see a tomato there is much that I can doubt … One thing however I cannot doubt: that there exists a red patch of a round and somewhat bulgy shape, standing out from a background of other colour-patches, and having a certain visual depth, and that this whole field of colour is presented to my consciousness … (Price 1932: 3).

On Price's line of thought, perceptual experiences do afford us with some certainty. When Price sees a tomato, he may be certain that there is something red and round present. According to critics of the argument, Price is not entitled to be certain of any such thing. For example, his experience might merely represent that there exists something red and round present, where such representation can occur even if nothing red and round is present (for more on this objection see the entry on the problem of perception (section 3.1.2).

Let's now turn to the status of beliefs about ordinary objects in the external world, and the flow from the philosophy of mind to epistemology. We can organize our discussion under the following instance of the trio:

Experiences justify beliefs about the external world.

Epistemology-Mind Link 1
If experiences justify beliefs about the external world, then experiences are not relations to sense-data.

Mind 1
Experiences are relations to sense-data.

In principle, a sense-datum theorist might accept E-M Link 1 and Mind 1, and conclude that Epistemology is false. For example, she might take up a coherence theory of justification, on which our beliefs about the external world are justified by their coherence with each other and not by experiences (for more on this move, see the entry on sense-data (section 3.2).

In the usual line of discussion, philosophers affirm Epistemology and E-M Link 1, and conclude that Mind 1 is false (see Berkeley 1710/2008: sect 18 or Reid 1764/1997: ch. 1). Sense-datum theories tell us that the things we are directly aware of in perceptual experience are not ordinary external objects. As the commonly used metaphor has it, sense-data theories draw a veil of ideas over the world. The usual objection holds that this veil makes it impossible for us to gain knowledge or justified belief from experience about the external world. Philosophers such as Berkeley and Reid reject sense-datum theories on the grounds that we do have epistemic access to the world.

In response, the sense-datum theorist might deny E-M Link 1. In particular, the theorist might say that experiences justify beliefs about the external world when complemented with reflection on how they are best explained (Russell 1912). Call this the IBE approach since it concerns Inferences to the Best Explanation of our experiences (see Vogel 1990 for more contemporary discussion). Setting aside debate about how such an explanation might go, and why it might be the best, the response might not go far enough.

To see why the IBE approach might not go far enough, consider the idea that experiences provide non-inferential justification for beliefs about the external world. If experiences provide non-inferential justification for beliefs about the external world, they justify beliefs through a route that does not involve further beliefs. Compare how your sharp pain might justify you directly in believing that you are in pain, without further beliefs playing any role. Contrast how your thermometer might justify you in believing you have a fever only in conjunction with your having reason to believe the thermometer works. Non-inferential justification is justification that does not involve auxiliary beliefs (see Pryor 2005 for more detail).

On the IBE approach, it seems that experiences at best give us inferential justification for beliefs about the external world. That's because they justify us only in conjunction with whatever beliefs their best explanation brings in. Experiences arguably do better (Johnston 2006). The veil of ideas objection might then be better put as follows:

Experiences give non-inferential justification for beliefs about the external world.

Epistemology-Mind Link 2
If experiences give non-inferential justification for beliefs about the external world, then experiences are not relations to sense-data.


not-Mind 1
Experiences are not relations to sense-data.

Even still, it is unclear why sense-datum theories should rule out getting non-inferential justification from experiences. Perhaps if a sense-datum theory is true, we at best see external objects indirectly, by means of seeing sense-data. But this is a point in the philosophy of mind about seeing and not yet a point about epistemology. Our justification for beliefs could still be non-inferential (Moore 1953; Silins 2011). The crucial question for epistemology is about the role of background beliefs, and the mental process of indirect perception need not make use of background beliefs. For instance, whether you indirectly perceive objects by means of sense-data might instead just be a matter of how the sense-data are caused, leaving open the possibility that you gain non-inferential justification for beliefs about the external world from sense-data.

Let's now zoom out to a big picture assessment of the epistemic implications of sense-datum theories.

The thought driving the veil of ideas worry is that if experiences fail to put us in direct contact with reality, then they cannot justify beliefs about external reality. This thought is meant to get us to the conclusion that sense datum theory is false. But it might go too far.

The first ramification concerns seeing objects. According to many views, we see ordinary extended objects by seeing their surfaces, rather than seeing them directly (see Moore 1918 or Broad 1952, and Clarke 1965 or Campbell 2004 for dispute). As far as seeing objects goes, their facing surfaces play the same role as sense-data did on many versions of the sense-datum theory—intermediaries not identical with objects that still permit us to see objects by seeing them. But now, if we endorse the veil of ideas objection, the facing surfaces of objects would be a veil over the rest of external reality. Call this the veil of surfaces. Our experiences would fail to give us access to whether we live in a world of ever shifting facades or instead a world of three-dimensional objects as they are ordinarily conceived. Descartes arguably states this problem when he writes:

I remember that, when looking from a window and saying I see men who pass in the street, I really do not see them, but infer that what I see is men, just as I say that I see wax. And yet what do I see from the window but hats and coats which may cover automatic machines? (PW, p. 21 )

If the veil of ideas objection succeeds against sense-data theories, it might also rule out the theory that we directly perceive only surfaces. It is not clear whether the objection can get us that far.

The veil of ideas objection also has controversial ramifications for cases of illusion or hallucination. When something looks red to you when it isn't, or when you have a hallucination of a bloody dagger in front of you, your experience fails to put you in direct contact with reality as it is. According to many approaches, your experience might still—misleadingly—justify you in believing that reality is the way it visually appears to be. However, if the thought driving the veil of ideas objection is correct, experiences only justify in those cases when you are seeing things as they are. This is quite a demanding view, one that rules out justification in a wide range of cases where many think it is present. (For more discussion of views that exclude perceptual justification from cases of illusion or hallucination, see section 2.2.).

1.2 Raw Feel Theories

According to sense-data theories, all visual experiences relate us to objects with the properties attributed by our visual experiences. At an opposite extreme, one might hold that experiences are “raw feels”, failing to present the world to us in any way. To get a feel for this line of thought, consider the experience of “seeing stars”. According to some views, your experience here is a mere sensation, failing to present your surroundings to you (cf. Smith 2002: 130–1). On these views, the expression of “seeing stars” is extremely misleading here, as you do not literally see stars, and do not even figuratively see anything else—it is not as if your experience is of anything in the scene. According to raw feel theory, all visual experiences are in fact like this, not just exceptional ones. As Bonjour puts it, we capture what our visual experiences are like “in terms of patches of color arranged in two-dimensional visual space” (2001: 32). (For a survey of views that could fall under the heading of “raw feel theory” as used here, see entry on contents of perception (section 2.1).

In a passage from “A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge”, Donald Davidson can be read as using raw feel theory to argue for a skeptical epistemological conclusion:

The relation between a sensation and a belief cannot be logical, since sensations are not beliefs or other propositional attitudes. What then is the relation? The answer is, I think, obvious: the relation is causal. Sensations cause some beliefs and in this sense are the basis or ground of those beliefs. But a causal explanation of a belief does not show how or why the belief is justified. (1986: 310)

By itself, the view that experiences are raw feels is silent about whether experiences are able to justify beliefs about the external world. To get to conclusions about epistemology, some sort of linking principle is needed. Davidson's idea is that a source can supply justification only if it has propositional content, so that the source is assessable as accurate or inaccurate, depending on whether the relevant proposition is true. On this way of setting up the issues, an experience has “propositional content” by having content that is assessable for truth (for further discussion of how to clarify the idea that experiences have propositional content, see the entry on the contents of perception; Byrne 2009; Pautz 2009; or Siegel 2012). Given Davidson's demand, experiences would be unable to justify beliefs if they were merely raw feels or sensations. (For important precedents to Davidson here, see Sellars 1956 and Popper 1959: chapter 5. For further contemporary discussion, see Bonjour 1985; McDowell 1994; Brewer 1999; and Pryor 2005.).

We can sketch the issues raised by Davidson with the following instance of our trio:

Experiences justify beliefs about the external world.

Epistemology-Mind Link 3
If experiences justify beliefs about the external world, then experiences have propositional content.

Mind 2
Experiences are raw feels without propositional content.

The Davidsonian response to the trio is to accept E-M Link 3 and Mind 2, but to deny Epistemology.

A different response to the trio accepts E-M Link3, but uses Epistemology to reject Mind 2. This position was occupied by McDowell 1994 and Brewer 1999 (although they later revised their views in Brewer 2006 and McDowell 2009).

Let us focus on debate about E-M Link 3, the common ground between Davidson, McDowell and Brewer. It can be resisted by raw feel theorists, as well as by non-raw feel theorists who fall short of attributing propositional contents to experiences.

Why believe E-M Link 3 at all? Davidson's own case appeals to the claim that, in order for an experience to justify a belief, the experience must make more probable or entail the content of the belief (he also uses the further assumption that only propositional contents can do any such thing). It's not clear why all raw feel theorists must accept the demand. Think back to the experience of “seeing stars”, and suppose that the experience is indeed a raw feel. The experience might still justify the belief that you are having that particular experience, whether or not it is a raw feel. Analogously, if pains are best understood as raw feels, they arguably could still justify you in believing that you have them. Now, if experiences could lack propositional contents and still justify you in believing you have them, why couldn't they still also justify beliefs about the external world? In particular, at least if background beliefs are allowed to play a role, it seems perfectly possible for beliefs about the external world to be justified thanks to the availability of inferences linking particular raw feels with particular conditions of the external world. The justificatory structure here would look like this:

\[ \begin{array}{ccc} \left. \begin{array}{ccc} \text{raw feel} & \rightarrow & \text{self-ascription of raw feel} \\ & & + \\ & & \text{auxiliary belief}\end{array} \right\} & \rightarrow & \text{external world belief} \end{array} \]

(For a contemporary view with this sort of structure, see Bonjour 2001).

One also might try to meet the spirit of the demand that justifiers increase probability or entail without attributing propositional contents to experiences. Here it's important to note the rich range of ways in which experiences might be directed at the world. Many of these ways need not involve propositional content.

First, even if experiences lack contents that are assessable for truth, experiences might still have contents that are assessable for accuracy. Burge 2010 suggests that experience contents have the form ‘that \(F\)’, and are accurate just in case the referent has the property \(F\). Alternatively, consider how a map or picture might be accurate or inaccurate without being true or false. When experiences are accurate in either of these ways, other contents of beliefs will be true. So experiences could lack propositional contents, but still count as close enough to entailing the contents of beliefs or to increasing the probability of the contents of beliefs.

Second, experiences might lack contents altogether, and not be assessable for truth or accuracy, but still be related in important ways to relations to the world such as seeing (Campbell 2002; McDowell 2009; Brewer 2006, 2011). According to these approaches, your experience justifies a belief about the world only when your experience is a case of seeing the world as it is. You can see the world as it is only if it is in fact that way. Here many of your experiences might be supremely positioned to justify whether or not they have any content. (For more about such approaches, see subsection 2.2.).

In sum, raw feel theorists might be in a good position to reject E-M Link 3. Moreover, even if experiences are not raw feels, they might also lack propositional contents, and still be directed at the world in a way that helps them to justify beliefs.

1.3 Perceptual Content

Let us now turn to more fine-grained connections between contents of experience and perceptual justification, focusing on contents of experience that can be assessed for truth.

1.3.1 Necessity of Content

First, is having the content that \(p\) necessary for an experience to justify believing that \(p\)? Here is a first pass at capturing the issue:

Epistemology-Mind Link4
If your visual experience \(e\) gives you justification to believe some external world proposition that \(p\), then \(e\) has the content that \(p\).

A challenge comes from cases when you use an experience and background beliefs to extrapolate far beyond any content the experience might have. For example, when I have an experience in New York with the content that the traffic light is red, my background beliefs enable the experience to justify me in believing that cars are permitted to turn right. But this legally informed belief is in a content that most likely does not figure in my experience.

To accommodate extrapolation beyond experience thanks to auxiliary beliefs, the simplest response is to focus on non-inferential justification that does not involve auxiliary beliefs (we set aside whether there other ways to reformulate the thesis).

Epistemology-Mind Link5
If your visual experience \(e\) gives you non-inferential justification to believe some external world proposition that \(p\), then \(e\) has the content that \(p\).

On this line of thought, if your experience justifies you in believing that \(p\) in a way that does not include auxiliary beliefs, then your experience has the content that \(p\).

If the Necessity thesis is true, it allows for rich connections between theories of perceptual experience and theories of perceptual justification. Consider for instance the debate about “high-level” content. Very roughly, this debate is about whether our experiences merely represent colors, shapes and locations, or whether they represent thicker properties or relations such as causing an explosion, being a fake Louis Vuitton bag, being virtuous, or being glad to see you (for more see the entry on the contents of perception, Siegel 2006, or the papers collected in Brogaard 2013).

If the Necessity thesis is true, and we have non-inferential justification for belief in high-level contents, it will follow that some of our experiences have high-level contents as well. But how to establish that our experiences give us non-inferential justification for some high level beliefs?

One route is to try to leverage the psychological immediacy of our formation of some high level beliefs. When the fashionista sees the droopy bag marked “Louis Vuitton” in a cheap Shenzhen mall, she does not need to puzzle out whether it is a fake, or to pull out her lighter to test whether the material melts likes plastic. Instead she forms her belief that the bag is a fake Louis Vuitton without any conscious reflection. Likewise, we don't need to puzzle out whether our loved ones are present when we see them—we seem to recognize them on the basis of our experiences without reasoning. Still, it may be that auxiliary beliefs are playing a role in all these examples while remaining unconscious. Auxiliary beliefs could play a mediating role without ever being conscious. The psychological immediacy of belief formation needn't go along with non-inferential justification (see McDowell 1982).

For further discussion of how to show we have non-inferential justification from experiences for some beliefs in high-level contents, and of whether the experiences themselves would need to have high-level contents to do so, see Millar 2000, McDowell 2009, or Silins 2013.

For further defense of the claim that an experience justifies a belief only if it has a content identical with that of the belief, see McDowell 1994 and Brewer 1999. For critical responses, see Speaks 2005 and Byrne 2005.

1.3.2 Sufficiency of Content

Is having the content that \(p\) enough for an experience to justifying you believing that \(p\)? Here is a first pass at capturing the idea:

Sufficiency First Pass
If you have an experience \(e\) with the content that \(p\), then \(e\) gives you justification to believe that \(p\).

The Sufficiency thesis is not formulated in terms of non-inferential justification. For all it says, whenever an experience justifies a belief, it does so only in a way involving the assistance of an auxiliary belief. Still, the picture does mesh well with views on which experiences give non-inferential justification, and we may understand it in those terms in what follows.

Our thesis does need to be qualified. For example, suppose that you gain convincing evidence that you are the victim of an illusion, as when you learn that the lines of the Müller-Lyer illusion are the same in length even though they look to be different in length:

[A set of three horizontal lines vertically aligned with the first and third having simple two line arrow heads at each end and the middle having inverted arrow heads. Sighted people tend to perceive the middle line as longer in this set.  Below is the same set with the horizontal lines in red and a dashed line on each side showing that the lines are actually identical in length. ]

Figure 1. Müller-Lyer illusion[1]

Your experience does not give you justification to believe that the lines are different in length once you have gain the evidence they are the same in length. Such cases are ones of “defeat”. To take account of such cases, the fan of Sufficiency can say that

If you have an experience \(e\) with the content that \(p\), then \(e\) gives you defeasible justification to believe that \(p\).

Here the core idea is that your experience gives you justification unless you have gained evidence that your experience is misleading.

For defenses of theses along the lines of Sufficiency, see Pollock (1974), Pryor (2000) or Huemer (2001, 2007). Their strategies put much weight on what it is like to have an experience (see more in section 2.4 on this sort of strategy). A different approach looks at how experiences come to have their contents. For examples of this strategy, see Burge 2003; Peacocke 2004; Sawyer and Majors 2005; and Setiya 2012: ch. 3.

The Sufficiency thesis also promises to establish rich connections between epistemology and the philosophy of mind. Consider again the debate about high-level contents of experience. If one is able to establish that experiences have high-level contents, one could then use the Sufficiency thesis to reach the conclusion that experiences justify beliefs in high-level contents as well.

Assuming that experiences with the content that \(p\) will give non-inferential justification for a belief that \(p\), we could then have an answer to an important question for foundationalist views in epistemology. These are views on which our inferentially justified beliefs about the external world are inferred from a foundation of non-inferentially justified beliefs (for more see the entry on foundationalist theories of epistemic justification). Which beliefs get to be in the foundation? This question for foundationalist views is pressing. As Nozick remarks in Philosophical Explanations, it is of little use to have a foundation for our knowledge that is only one brick wide (1981: 3). In general, the more restrictive foundationalist views are about the breadth of our foundational beliefs, the harder it will be to build up to everyday beliefs about the world. However, if beliefs concerning causation, emotions, or morality get to be foundational, the foundationalist project can look much more promising (Masrour 2011). If Sufficiency were true, and our experiences had contents concerning causation, emotions, or morality, we could then start enquiry from such beliefs.

As helpful as the Sufficiency thesis could be for foundationalists, it faces a lot of criticism. Many objections proceed by proposing requirements for justification that are not always satisfied when one has an experience with a given content. Such cases would then be ones in which you have an experience with a certain content, and yet it does not give you reason to believe that content. For example, one might demand that the experience be a case of seeing (section 2.2 of this entry), or demand that the experience be suitably free of top-down influence from one's own mind (section 2.4 of this entry).

Here we will focus on objections that turn on the character of perceptual content. The objection here is known as “the problem of the speckled hen” (see Chisholm 1942; Sosa in Sosa and Bonjour 2003; Markie 2009 for different versions of the problem).

To get a feel for our problem, suppose you get a look at a speckled hen in good light, but without enough time to carefully count the number of speckles on it.

[A Speckled Sussex chicken mostly black with lots of white

Figure 2. “Speckled Sussex Hen named Mata Hari”[2]

The objection to Sufficiency can be put as follows. First, your experience does have a content about how many spots face you—say to the effect that \(H\) has 17 spots. Second, your experience does not justify you in believing that \(H\) has 17 spots. After all, forming a belief that \(H\) has 17 spots without carefully counting might seem no more likely to be right than a guess. So, the critic concludes, some experiences have the content that \(p\) without giving you justification to believe that \(p\).

In response, some argue that your experience is actually silent about the exact number of speckles facing you on the hen (see Tye 2009; for more on experience and numeracy, see Beck 2012).

One can raise the core challenge to Sufficiency in other ways. Another source of examples can be found in Block's (2007) empirically informed work on “phenomenal overflow” (drawing on Sperling 1960 and Lamme 2003). Consider for example the Sperling paradigm, in which subjects are flashed a grid of letters, and only subsequently given a tone that indicates which row to report (high for the top, medium for the middle, etc). Subjects are able to report any row singled out without being able to report them all. (For an online demo without sound, see Other Internet Resources). Arguably subjects experience all the letters as they are without being able to report them all (but see Stazicker 2011 or Phillips 2011 for criticisms of Block). The objector add that we do not have justification from our experience to believe the proposition that enumerates all the letters present. (For a further way to set up the speckled hen problem, using the example of highly determinate colors, see Smithies 2012a).

Even if one allows that some experiences have enough determinacy to set up the speckled hen problem, the option remains of maintaining that the experiences do give you justification to believe the relevant determinate proposition. For example, perhaps your experiences do give you justification to believe the determinate proposition, even though you are unable to take advantage of the justification you have by forming a belief on their basis (see Smithies 2012a for a view with this structure).

Alternatively, perhaps speckled hen cases are compatible with Sufficiency since they turn out to be cases of defeat. Given that we are generally aware of our poor ability to make snap judgments about the details of the scene before, perhaps we have defeasible but defeated justification to believe detailed propositions about the scene before us.

1.3.3 Intentionalism

So far we have focused on the ramifications for epistemology of the view that experiences have propositional contents. Intentionalism is a more ambitious view in the philosophy of mind that aims to find necessary connections between the conscious character of an experience—what it is like to have it—and the content of that experience. According to intentionalists, at a minimum,

Minimal Intentionalism
If experiences \(e_1\) and \(e_2\) have the same content, then what it is like to have \(e_1\) is the same as what it is like to have \(e_2\).

In a slogan, “same content, same character” (for discussion of further variations in the camp, see Chalmers 2004).

Here we will point to some epistemological ramifications of the view.

One way to defend Intentionalism examines how we become introspectively aware of what it's like to have our experiences. Arguably we become introspectively aware of what it's like to have our experiences only by being aware of what we are experiencing. Perhaps awareness of the world is the sole route to introspective awareness of what it's like to have a given experience. And perhaps this point about introspection supports at least a minimal version of Intentionalism. For further discussion of this broadly epistemological argument for intentionalism, see the entry on qualia (section 6), also the entry on representational theories of consciousness (section 3.3).

Another defense of Intentionalism examines how we become able to think about certain properties by having experiences. Perhaps experiences are sufficient for certain cognitive abilities, and perhaps Intentionalism gives the best explanation of how experiences are sufficient for certain cognitive abilities. For an exposition of this broadly epistemological line of argument for Intentionalism, see Pautz 2010.

For an epistemological argument against some versions of Intentionalism, see Kriegel 2011. He targets versions of the view that aim to find what constitutes experience in terms of awareness of properties (or a suitably similar relation to properties). According to Kriegel, just as sense-data theories are unable to provide an adequate epistemology because of the “veil of appearances” they impose between perceivers and the world, the targeted versions of Intentionalism fail to provide an adequate epistemology for the same reason. As we saw in section 2.1, sense-data theorists have ways to respond to veil objections. Perhaps intentionalists do as well.

1.4 Consciousness

1.4.1 Does consciousness play a justifying role?

An uncontroversial theory of perceptual experiences holds that they all have a conscious character—for any experience \(e\) there is something it is like to have \(e\). Further, part of what it is for something to be an experience is for it to have a conscious character. There is much debate about how to explain the nature of perceptual consciousness, but there is little debate about whether something is an experience only if it has a conscious character.

There is much more room for debate about the importance of consciousness for the epistemology of perception. One strategy of explaining how experiences justify beliefs focuses on their conscious character. We may call it the phenomenal approach.

To see why this approach is a contender, consider subjects who have “blindsight”. They have unconscious visual representations of what's in their blind field without having conscious visual experience of anything in their blind field (see Weiskrantz 2009 for a survey). These subjects are better than chance at identifying objects in their blind field, but they have to be prompted to make a guess. For our purposes, imagine a hypothetical blindsighted subject who does not need to be prompted to form a belief that there is an \(X\) to the left. Now compare that subject with an ordinary sighted subject who forms a belief that there is an \(X\) to the left on the basis of visual experience.

There are various questions here whose answers might support the phenomenal approach (see Smithies 2012a for more).

First, is the blindsighted subject completely unjustified in believing that there is an \(X\) to the left? If you think the answer to this question is yes, and you're not a skeptic about the sighted subject, you arguably should be sympathetic to the phenomenal approach. What else would explain this difference between them?

Second, is the blindsighted subject at any rate less justified than the sighted subject in believing that there is an \(X\) to the left? If you think the answer here is yes, again you arguably should be sympathetic to the phenomenal approach. What else would explain this epistemic difference between them?

In response, one might deny that the epistemic differences obtain (see Lyons 2009). Even if one accepts that the epistemic differences obtain, one might still insist that they are equally or better explained by alternative candidates than consciousness. For example, perhaps the blindsighted subject does not count as seeing the \(X\), and perhaps the sighted subject is more justified than the blindsighted subject simply thanks to seeing the \(X\) (as an \(X\)). Here the explanatory burden would be borne by bearing a perceptual relation to the thing, rather than having an experience with a certain character.

Here it might help to compare the sighted subject with a conscious subject for whom things are just the same from the inside, but who fails to see any \(X\) because she is hallucinating. If the sighted subject and the hallucinating subject are equally justified in believing there is an \(X\) to the left, visual experience might be a better candidate than seeing to explain the epistemic symmetry between the sighted and the hallucinating subjects.

Suppose the blindsighted subject and sighted subject are equally justified—is the phenomenal approach then doomed? Speaking loosely, even if the blindsighted subject has the same epistemic effect as the sighted subject, it's not entirely clear that there must be the same cause. Analogously, even if there are physical duplicates of us without consciousness who perform the same bodily movements as us, the possibility remains open that some of our own bodily movements are explained by conscious pains and the like.

To support the claim that consciousness doesn't supply perceptual justification, one might look to other real-life cases of unconscious visual representation. One sort of case is that of unconscious priming. Here you are exposed to a stimulus too quickly for it to register in visual experience, but for all that it still does affect your behavior. For example, an unconsciously registered numeral might improve your ability to report that a subsequently seen numeral is greater or lower than 5, depending on whether the priming one is itself greater or lower than 5 (Naccache and Dehaene 2001). Now this sort of case is arguably not one in which unconscious visual representations justify. The subjects concerned plausibly do not form beliefs that are good candidates to be justified by their unconscious visual representations. But consider people with visual hemi-neglect, who seem to lack conscious visual experience of their neglected field.

Some neglect patients seem to take in information about the neglected stimuli, and to form beliefs about it. For instance, some of them, when presented with a burning house in their neglected field and a normal house in their normal field, prefer the one that isn't on fire (Marshall and Halligan 1988; Bisiach and Rusconi 1990). Here they do form a belief that is a candidate to be justified by their unconscious visual representation. Their belief that the house in their neglected field isn't preferable might be justified by the information they take in, even if the intake is through unconscious perception. If this case is one in which the subject is justified, and justified to the same degree as in ordinary cases of conscious perception, one might then start to wonder whether consciousness must play a role even in ordinary cases of perceptual justification. Perhaps it is side-stepped by unconscious visual representations even then. (For a rich range of examples of unconscious perception, see Hassin, Uleman, and Bargh 2006. For approaches to the epistemology of perception that minimize the role of consciousness, see Burge 2003 and Lyons 2009).

1.4.2 What aspect of consciousness plays a justifying role?

If the conscious character of experiences does play a justifying role, a further question remains about why it does so. One might hold that there is no further explanation to be provided here. Perhaps the capacity of consciousness to justify is a fundamental fact of epistemology. According to another proposal, consciousness justifies thanks to being introspectively accessible. On this internalist conception of justification, a special kind of access to a source is necessary for the source to provide justification, and consciousness stands out for allowing this sort of access (see e.g. Smithies 2012b).

Here we will focus on a particular aspect of the conscious character of experiences, one highlighted by Pryor (2000) among others. To get a feel for the feature, first look away from this surface and imagine a black circle in front of you. Now look at this surface and have a visual experience of a black circle in front of you.

In the former case, you were not justified in believing that there is a black circle in front of you. In the present case, you are. One candidate way to explain the epistemic difference is to focus on a difference between what it is like to imagine and what it is like to have a visual experience (see Martin 2002 for more).

The salient feature of experience here is not easy to pin down. The rough idea is that, when you visually experience, as opposed to when you visually imagine, things are presented to you as actually being the case. How this feature of experience is best to be understood is open to debate. For now let us leave open its exact nature and simply use the term “presentational phenomenology” as a place-holder for whatever it is (for more see Chudnoff 2012 or Bengson forthcoming).

Even if presentational phenomenology is epistemically privileged, there remains an important question about its scope. Suppose you see a cow through a picket fence. There is arguably some way you perceptually “get” that there is an extended cow there. For a dramatic contrast, start by considering Damien Hirst's Some Comfort Gained From the Acceptance of the Inherent Lies in Everything, that consists of a cow vertically sliced into a series of boxes arranged like dominos. Now suppose you know you are seeing the Hirst sculpture through a picket fence, where the segments align exactly with the gaps in the fence. Here you arguably would not perceptually “get” that there is an elongated cow there.

In the ordinary case of seeing a cow through a picket fence, it is debatable whether presentational phenomenology includes the presence of an extended cow, or whether it includes only those regions of the cow not occluded by the fence (see Noe 2005 for further discussion). If your presentational phenomenology includes only the non-occluded regions, and only presentational phenomenology supplies perceptual justification, the rational powers of experience threaten to be limited. You would not have justification to believe that an extended cow is present just by taking your experience at face value. Analogously, if only the facing surface of an object is phenomenally present, you might have justification to believe only that the facing surface is present by taking your experience at face value. Here we might find ourselves back at the “veil of surfaces” discussed in section 2.2. Some might accept this prediction. Some might prefer to take a more expansive view of presentational phenomenology. Others might conclude that presentational phenomenology is not the key supplier of perceptual justification.

We have now surveyed the epistemic implications of some central theories of experience. We have by no means covered all theories of experience. Here we will simply point to further important areas to consider. For discussion of naïve realist theories of experience, and of their interaction with issues about skepticism, see the entries on epistemological problems of perception and the disjunctive theory of perception. For discussion of how dualist theories of experience might lead to epiphenomenalism, where epiphenomenalism might lead to skeptical problems, see the entry on epiphenomenalism (section 2.3). For discussion of the theory that experience is actually a special case of belief, where that theory might affect our understanding of how we base beliefs on experiences, see the entry on the contents of perception (section 2.2).

2. Perceptual Phenomena

Let us now consider the significance for epistemology of a range of perceptual phenomena. On most views, these phenomena do not occur in all cases of perception, but still have important ramifications for the epistemology of perception.

The first array of phenomena are concerned with the relation between experience and the world. Here we will consider different kinds of perceptual error, as well as forms of perception that occur only in the absence of error. The remaining phenomena we will consider are characterized by the internal etiology of experience. Here we will look at the influence of attention and of other mental states on our experience.

2.1. Perceptual Error

2.1.1 Illusion and Hallucination

In cases of perceptual error, we form a false belief on the basis of an experience, as when an uninformed subject concludes there is motion below (to get the effect, let your eyes drift over the image):

visual illusion.  The object looks like 18 overlapping circles with an
intricate repeating pattern.  For most sighted people the circles seem
to rotate.]

Figure 3. “Rotating snakes”[3]

This is a paradigm case of an illusion, where you do see a scene, but misperceive what the scene is like. In a paradigm case of hallucination, you have a perceptual experience, but do not perceive anything in the scene before you.

Few dispute that there are cases of perceptual error (although some disagree about whether perceptual error is ever properly at the level of experience as opposed to that of beliefs formed on the basis of experiences, cf. Brewer 2006). Many skeptical arguments use the occurrence of perceptual error to conclude that experiences do not do a particular job in epistemology. We can understand these arguments as using different versions of the Epistemology-Mind Link:

Epistemology-Mind Link6
If experiences sometimes deceive us, then experiences do not give us knowledge of the external world.

Epistemology-Mind Link7
If experiences sometimes deceive us, then experiences do not give us justified beliefs about the external world.

For discussion of how to supplement or defend such principles, see the entries on skepticism and epistemological problems of perception.

Here we will focus on a weaker principle that addresses the kind of justification we can get from perceptual experiences:

Epistemology-Mind Link8
If experiences sometimes deceive us, then experiences at best give us inferential justification for beliefs about the external world.

If our experiences sometime deceive us, there is a “gap” between our having of the experience and the truth of the proposition they putatively justify. On E-M Link8, some intermediate belief will then be needed to close the gap between experience and truth, for example a belief to the effect that our experiences are reliable. Given the need for an intermediate belief, our experiences will then arguably fail to give us non-inferential justification for beliefs about the external world. This conclusion is endorsed by philosophers who still reject skepticism about perceptual justification (Cohen 2002; Wright 2004; or White 2006).

E-M Link8 might still lead to skepticism. Consider an auxiliary belief meant to bridge the gap between experience and truth, and ask whether whatever process that lead to it might sometimes deceive us. For example, consider your belief that your experiences are reliable, and whatever process led to your belief that your experiences are reliable. That process could arguably lead you to falsely believe your experiences are reliable in a situation where you are radically deceived by an evil demon.

We now have a gap between the occurring of the process that led to an auxiliary belief and the truth of the auxiliary belief. So then, according to the reasoning behind E-M Link8, we would need another auxiliary belief to bridge the gap. Since an evil demon could presumably deceive us yet again, we threaten to have a vicious regress here. E-M Link8 might end up having undesired skeptical implications. (White 2006 articulates this line of thought without endorsing it).

2.1.2 Dreaming

We have considered the significance of illusion and hallucination. Let's now examine the case of dreams. Dreams are often understood to be paradigms of perceptual error, for example by Descartes when he writes that

this would not happen with such distinctness to someone asleep. Indeed! As if I did not remember other occasions when I have been tricked by exactly similar thoughts while asleep! (PW, p. 13)

The picture of dreaming as a case of perceptual error is challenged by Sosa (2005).

We can frame the issue with a simplified argument for skepticism:

Epistemology-Mind Link9
If our experiences justify beliefs about our present surroundings, our experiences do not frequently deceive us while we dream.

Our experiences frequently deceive us while we dream.


Our experiences do not justify our beliefs about our present surroundings.

Sosa responds (to a more complex skeptical argument focused on knowledge) by defending an alternative conception of dreams known as “the imagination model”. On this model, we actually do not form beliefs about our surroundings when we dream, or even have perceptual experiences when we dream.

To see a defense of the imagination model, consider that, when I go to bed, I form and store a belief that I am lying in bed. If I were to form a belief while I am dreaming that I am running away from lions, I would then have a belief that contradicts my stored belief that I am lying in bed. Now we arguably do not have such contradictory beliefs while we are dreaming. The view that we form beliefs while dreaming might then be what has to go (Sosa 2005: 6).

Let's now consider the case of visual experience. On the imagination model, when dreaming we do not even have visual experiences with the same conscious character as those we have when awake (we leave open whether we have “visual experiences” while dreaming in some extended sense). The argument at this stage can exploit the earlier conclusion that we do not form beliefs about our surroundings while dreaming. Sosa defends the further thesis on the grounds that, if we did have experiences when dreaming with the conscious character of those we have when awake, we would be open to epistemic criticism for failing to form beliefs that take our experiences at face value. However when I dream that I am being attacked by a lion, but do not believe while I dream that I am being attacked by a lion, I arguably am not open to epistemic criticism.

If the imagination model of dreaming is correct, the skeptical argument above is unsound because Mind is false. For discussion of whether Sosa succeeds in blocking the best dreaming arguments for skepticism, see Ichikawa 2009. For further discussion specifically of the visual character of dreams, see Schwitzgebel 2011: ch. 1.

2.2 Successful Perception

Some epistemologists privilege perceptual states that you are in only if you are not in cases of illusion or hallucination. On their views, these states are either the only sources of perceptual justification, or at any rate the best sources of perceptual justification. In the terminology of Hawthorne and Kovakovich 2006, we may call these perceptual states “success states”.

To get a sense of some of the candidate states, consider the following table:

(Successful) vision



Having a visual experience with the content that \(a\) is \(F\)




Seeing \(a\) as being \(F\)




Seeing that \(a\) is \(F\)




Seeing \(a\)'s \(F\)ness




(In setting up this table, we assume that hallucinations of a particular object are possible. For discussion, see Johnston 2004 or Schellenberg 2010.)

Epistemologists differ according to which success states they privilege, what job they assign to the state, and how severely they regard the absence of the privileged state.

For views which privilege seeing that \(p\), see McDowell (1982, 1995) or A. Jackson (2011). For views which privilege something along the lines of seeing \(a\)'s \(F\)ness, see Johnston (2006). These states are fact-entailing, since as a matter of necessity, you see that \(a\) is \(F\), or see \(a\)'s \(F\)ness, only if \(a\) is in fact \(F\). For a view that potentially favors the sort of perceptual state you find in cases of vision and illusion rather than hallucination, see Burge (2003). This sort of state is relational, since you can be in it only if the relevant object of perception is present in your scene. Assuming that each conscious success state has a counterpart in unconscious perception, notice that versions of these views might focus on perceptual states in common between conscious subjects and subjects without conscious perception.

In principle, you might get perceptual justification from a success state in the good case of vision or illusion, and get the same amount of perceptual justification from a non-success state in the bad case of hallucination (Lord forthcoming takes up a view with this structure regarding reasons for belief). We bracket that sort of approach here. It is more common to hold that you get no perceptual justification in the case of hallucination (e.g., Jackson 2011), or at least a lower degree or different kind of perceptual justification in the case of hallucination (e.g., Schellenberg 2013).

Let's group views that privilege success states under the label “Success Theory”, and leave open how to adjudicate within the camp.

In support of Success Theory, one can emphasize the tight connection the approach draws between perceptual justification and truth. Especially if you privilege seeing that \(a\) is \(F\) or seeing \(a\)'s \(F\)ness, the state that gives you justification to believe that \(a\) is \(F\) guarantees the truth of the belief that \(a\) is \(F\). Moreover, the source of your justification remains mental and arguably accessible to you, thus satisfying the demands of some “internalist” approaches in epistemology that privilege what is inside the subject or accessible in a special way by the subject (Prichard 2012). Moreover, Success Theory has a promising connection with issues about skepticism. They promise to block skeptical arguments that assume our evidence is the same between the good case of successful vision and the bad case of radical deception or hallucination (McDowell 1995, for a critique, see Wright 2004).

As an objection to Success Theory, many bring in demands on justification that are not satisfied by the most versions of the view. For instance, consider the “internalist” thesis that, if things seem the same to each of two people from the inside, then those two people are equally justified in their beliefs. More specifically, if two people have the same conscious perspective on the world, and the same stored beliefs, then they are the same with respect to the degree of justification of their beliefs. This sort of thesis is often motivated by considering radically deceived counterparts to us, and appealing to the intuition that such subjects and us are equally justified (Lehrer and Cohen 1983; Cohen 1984; Wedgwood 2002; for dispute, see Sutton 2007 or Littlejohn 2012). Now, if a version of Success Theory predicts that a subject in perceptual error has less justification than a corresponding perceiver, that version might be rejected on the basis of its conflict with the internalist thesis.

In response, one might attempt to explain away the intuition of equal justification as instead concerning equal blamelessness, or at any rate as being correct only if restricted to blamelessness (e.g., Williamson 2007). Internalist theorists often retort by distinguishing the sort of blamelessness one finds in cases of cognitive delusion or brainwashing, and the epistemic status of the victim of an evil demon (Pryor 2001).

Alternatively, someone with a “disjunctive theory of perception” might insist that the radically deceived subject does not have the same conscious perspective on the world as the successful perceiver (Fish 2013). On this line of thought, to have the conscious perspective of someone in a case of perceptual success, you need to be in a case of perceptual success. Here the antecedent of the internalist thesis is not satisfied in cases of radical deception. One challenge here is that there are many ways to be deceived. For example, when someone sees that a lemon is yellow, they might well lack a conscious counterpart who hallucinates, but they arguably still have a conscious counterpart who sees a fake lemon that is yellow. If the subject in a case of vision and the subject in a case of illusion are equally justified, that will be trouble for approaches that give justifying privilege to the states of seeing that \(a\) is \(F\) or seeing \(a\)'s \(F\)ness.

Some philosophers might attack Success Theory on the grounds that it is too internalist rather than not internalist enough. According to theorists such as Ginsborg 2006 or Roessler 2009, the justifiers of perceptual beliefs are best understood to be facts about the external world rather than facts about perceivers' mind.

2.3 Attention

Standard cases of perceptual justification are ones in which you attend to what you see, as when you attend to your mail and form a justified belief that you have mail. But are all cases of perceptual justification ones in which attention is involved? According to the Attention Needed view, only attentive experiences can provide justification. According to the Attention Optional view, inattentive experiences can provide propositional justification.

If you only experience what you attend to, as is maintained by philosophers such as Prinz 2012, all cases of justification by experience will trivially involve attention as well. Here we'll pursue the issue on the assumption that we sometimes experience something we do not attend to, as is held by theorists such as Searle 1992 and Mole 2011.

To make our discussion concrete, consider Simons and Chabris's (1999) famous “Selective Attention Test” on youtube (see the link in Other Internet Resources). When subjects were asked to count passes of basketballs—spoiler alert!—a fair number failed to notice a person in a gorilla suit who came into the scene. Given how hard it is to track the passes of basketballs, it is natural to assume that the non-noticers were attending only to the basketballs, and did not attend to the person in the gorilla suit. Now suppose that some of non-noticers still did experience a person in a gorilla suit in the scene, as a person in a gorilla suit. According to the Attention Needed view, their inattentive experience cannot provide them with justification to believe that someone's there in a gorilla suit. According to the Attention Optional view, their inattentive experience might still provide them with justification to believe that someone's there in a gorilla suit.

Both views have their attractions. Typically, if you look carelessly at a scene, your experience will put you in a worse epistemic position if you look attentively at the scene. Perhaps at the limit, if attention is gone but experience remains, experience no longer provides justification.

On the other hand, you can have evidence you don't notice you have, and this point might favor the Attention Optional view. Consider everyday cases of “change blindness” discussed by Dretske 2004. For example, your friend gets a haircut, and asks you “do I look different?” You are stumped. On Dretske's account, you might still have a perfectly accurately experience of how his hair now looks. Here your experience plausibly gives you justification to believe that your friend got a haircut (when combined with your background beliefs). You also fail to notice that your experience gives you justification to believe your friend got a haircut. If experiences provide un-noticed evidence, such cases are arguably good precedents for the sorts of cases allowed by the Attention Optional view. (For more striking cases of change blindness, see the link in Other Internet Resources.)

For further discussion of the potential epistemic roles of attention, see Campbell 2002, 2011; Roessler 2011; Smithies 2011; Wu 2014; and Silins and Siegel 2014.

2.4 Cognitive Penetration

According to one empiricist tradition, experience functions as a mirror, reflecting what is before the subject, without any manipulation by the subject's mind. Given that experience is supposed to not be influenced by one's theories or expectations, it is thereby supposed to be in an optimal position to confirm or disconfirm hypotheses about the world. According to a wide range of philosophers and scientists, such a picture of the nature of experience is mistaken, putting limitations on the ability of experience to justify belief. In the philosophy of science, the challenge has been put in terms of the “theory-dependence of observation”, and the implications thereof. In more recent epistemology and philosophy of mind, the challenge has been put in terms of “cognitive penetration” or “top-down” effects and the implications thereof.

To survey the debate, we'll start with the philosophy of mind by considering potential examples of the phenomenon, and we will then turn to questions in epistemology.

One potential source of examples comes from ambiguous figures such as the Necker cube (Hanson 1958; Kuhn 1962; Churchland 1979, 1988).

[two identical
squares overlapping and with lines connecting the four vertices of
one to the equivalent vertex of the other]

Figure 4. Necker Cube[4]

You can see this figure as a downward-tilted cube with the left face closest to you, or as an upward-tilted cube with the right face closest to you. Critics dispute whether such examples support any thesis of theory-dependence of observation. An alternative response is that you experience the figure in different ways merely because you attend to different parts of the figure at different times. Here the difference in your experience is not explained by differences in what theory you hold (Fodor 1984).

Theorists such as Hanson, Kuhn and Churchland also made much of work by so-called “New Look” psychologists such as Bruner and Postman. Consider for instance Bruner and Postman's classic 1949 experiment involving anomalous playing cards. In this experiment, subjects were briefly shown the following sort of card:

[The 6 Spades playing card but red instead of the normal black]

Figure 5

What did you just see? When subjects were exposed to this sort of card, many reported it to be a six of hearts. The card is actually a red six of spades.

One might claim that the card looked to you the way red sixes of hearts look to you. However, there is much skepticism about whether there is an effect here on perceptual experience itself (Fodor 1983; Pylyshyn 1999. Perhaps the card fails to look like a red six of hearts to you, and you simply jumped to the conclusion that it is a red six of hearts when you form your belief. The effect might merely have been on beliefs formed on the basis of perceptual experience.

The current debate about cognitive penetration is informed by more recent experiments in psychology. For a case of a top-down effect in the current literature, consider “memory color” in Hansen et al.'s banana (2006). When subjects were asked to adjust an image of a characteristically yellow object until it was achromatic, they overcompensated by adjusting until the image was slightly bluish. Subjects did not overcompensate with objects that were not characteristically yellow. According to recent discussions Macpherson 2012, the type of case presented by Hansen et al. is much harder to explain away than those in the classic philosophy of science literature. (For related examples, see Delk and Fillenbaum 1965 or Olkkonen, Hansen, and Gegenfurtner 2008. For further philosophical discussion, see Deroy 2013).

Let us now turn to the epistemology of cases of cognitive penetration.

It's not clear whether all cases of top-down effects are problematic for perceptual justification. Consider the possibility of top-down effects from expertise. For example, perhaps the expert radiologist sees more than the novice when looking at an x-ray, and perhaps the expert chess-player sees more than the novice when looking at a chessboard in mid-game (see the papers in Ericsson 2006 for discussion of such examples). Further, suppose that the expertise examples are genuine cases of top-down influence. Here the expert is presumably at an epistemic advantage thanks to top-down effects, where her experience justifies her with respect to those contents that her experience has thanks to her cognitive background (Siegel 2012).

To see why some cases of top-down effects might be epistemically problematic, consider Siegel's (2012) hypothetical case of “Angry Looking Jack”. Suppose that Jill antecedently has an unjustified belief that Jack is angry at her. The next time she sees him, he does look angry to her—as a result of a top-down effect from her belief. In response to her experience, Jill then reaffirms her belief. Is she now justified in believing that Jack is angry at her? (Markie 2005 presents a related example of a gold prospector whose wishful thinking makes a nugget visually seem to be gold).

You could appeal to an intuition that Jill is not justified by her experience in believing that Jack is angry at her (Siegel 2012). But others may not share the intuition. Pryor (2000) for instance discusses the apparent irrelevance of etiology to the justificatory power of experience, and would seem to lack an intuition that Jill is not justified by her experience.

Another strategy is to give a further argument that Jill is not justified by her experience in believing that Jack is angry at her. For arguments that appeal to an analogy with the unjustified formation of a belief on an unjustified belief, see McGrath (2013) and Siegel (2013). For an argument that appeals to an analogy with the unjustified formation of beliefs on the basis of emotion, see Vance (2014).


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