The Nonidentity Problem

First published Tue Jul 21, 2009; substantive revision Fri Sep 25, 2015

The nonidentity problem focuses on the obligations we think we have in respect of people who, by our own acts, are caused both to exist and to have existences that are, though worth having, unavoidably flawed – existences, that is, that are flawed if those people are ever to have them at all. If a person’s existence is unavoidably flawed, then the agent’s only alternatives to bringing that person into the flawed existence are to bring no one into existence at all or to bring a different person – a nonidentical but better off person – into existence in place of the person whose existence is flawed. If the existence is worth having and no one else’s interests are at stake, it is unclear on what ground morality would insist that the choice to bring the one person into the flawed existence is morally wrong. And yet at the same time – as we shall see – it seems that in some cases that choice clearly is morally wrong. The nonidentity problem is the problem of resolving this apparent paradox.

The problem raises the question whether the (usually significant) good that an agent confers along with existence counterbalances the (usually limited) bad that an agent confers along with any unavoidably flawed existence in such a way that our existence-inducing act (usually) will be deemed permissible. And if it isn’t – if we think instead that obligations are left unsatisfied despite the good that comes with existence – is the moral of the story that moral obligation extends beyond what we must do for people? If we agree, in other words, that it is our obligation to create additional good, is it enough that we create additional good for each and every existing and future person? Or does the nonidentity problem show that our focus should instead be on creating additional good for the universe? As we query how to evaluate existence-inducing acts for their moral permissibility – as well as outcomes or possible futures or worlds, for their moral betterness against still other worlds – we find that some of our most deeply held intuitions regarding the nature and structure of morality are thrown into doubt.

1. The Problem

Three intuitions are at stake in the nonidentity problem. (1) The first is the person-affecting, or person-based, intuition itself. According to that intuition, an act can be wrong only if that act makes things worse for, or (we can say) harms, some existing or future person. Acts, in other words, that maximize wellbeing for each and every existing or future person cannot be wrong. As Parfit put it: the “bad” act must be “bad for” someone (Parfit 1987, 363).

(2) The second intuition is that an act that confers on a person an existence that is, though flawed, worth having in a case in which that same person could never have existed at all in the absence of that act does not make things worse for, or harm, and is not “bad for,” that person. In other words, conferring the existence that is unavoidably flawed and yet not so flawed that it is less than worth having does not make things worse for, or harm, and is not “bad for,” the person whose existence it is.

(3) The third intuition is what the nonidentity cases themselves seem clearly to show: that at least some existence-inducing acts are wrong even though they don’t make things worse for, or harm, and are not “bad for,” either the very person they cause to both exist and suffer or any other existing or future person at all. Related intuitions similarly collide when our question is whether a given world is morally worse than another. Again the nonidentity cases seem to show that one world can be morally worse than another even though there does or will exist no one for whom that one world is worse.

Since the nonidentity problem became well-known through the work of Derek Parfit, James Woodward and Gregory Kavka in the early 1980s, most philosophers have accepted it as showing that at least one of the aforementioned intuitions must be false. Here, the most frequently identified culprit is intuition (1), that is, the person-based intuition itself. But if that intuition is false, then the question is raised whether morality should be understood to have a structure that is impersonal at least in part. Does moral law, that is, provide that agents on occasion do wrong even though they have at the same time successfully maximized wellbeing for each person who does or ever will exist?

If we answer this question in the affirmative, we must of course then take up the challenge of explaining just how acts that make things worse for no one can be wrong. Classical utilitarians, of course, think we can meet this challenge with ease. They would quickly agree that the person-based intuition is false and could indeed put that result forward to bolster their position that moral law is impersonal in nature and that aggregating wellbeing levels across particular populations at the relevant worlds is exactly the right way to determine whether an act is permissible or one world is better than another. Some non-consequentialists might also be happy to accept the result that the person-based intuition is false. They might consider that result to support their position that wrongdoing must be grounded in facts about the agent’s character, motives or intentions and not in the consequences the act under scrutiny generates for any particular person. Still other impersonalists – philosophers, for example, who reject classical utilitarianism (perhaps on the ground that it leads to the repugnant conclusion; see the entry on the repugnant conclusion) but remain compelled by the idea that acts, as opposed to agents, are to be evaluated in light of their consequences – face a more serious challenge. They must identify a “Theory X” (Parfit 1987, 378) that accounts for the wrongdoing within a consequentialist framework but does not bring to bear either the principles of classical utilitarianism or any pre-analytic sense we think we have that the choice under scrutiny has made things worse for, or harmed, or failed to maximize wellbeing for, the people who have been made to suffer by that wrong choice.

It is hard to appreciate the importance of the nonidentity problem until one understands its sweep. It isn’t just close-to-home choices relating to procreation – for example, the choice to conceive a child with one person rather than another – that seem susceptible to the nonidentity analysis. For that narrow range of cases, the exculpatory implication from intuitions (1) and (2) might seem perfectly on target and the rejection of intuition (3) at least plausible. Thus: was it wrong for my parents to choose to have a child with each other rather than each to have a child with some alternate partner who (let’s suppose) would have brought to the table a superior genetic contribution? We might think that it wasn’t. Even if I suffer from being less tall, strong, smart or healthy than alternate children my parents could have produced with alternate partners in my place, my existence remains worth having. Moreover, there is nothing they or anyone else – consistent with existing medical and genetic technologies – could have done to bring me into a better existence. If in that case an intuitive, person-based moral theory instructs that no wrong has been done, that result might well seem plausible to us. The case might not, that is, strike us as a convincing counterexample against the person-based intuition itself.

It is when we realize that the exculpatory implication applies not just to close-to-home cases of procreative choice but also to a disturbingly large segment of all our future-directed choices – including choices that don’t seem on the face of things to have anything to do with whether one person is brought into existence rather than another – that we begin to appreciate the significance of the nonidentity problem. For at least some of those cases, we are (likely) going to find intuition (3) itself compelling; we are (likely) going to be convinced – as we shall see – that the choice under scrutiny is clearly wrong. We will then seem forced to abandon either intuition (1) or (2). If it’s the former we let go of rather than the latter, then our challenge is to account for the fact that the choice is wrong despite the fact that that same choice seems to be good for – indeed maximizing for – each and every existing and future person. If it’s the latter, then our challenge is to explain how a choice can make things worse for, or harm, or in some way be “bad for,” a given person despite the fact that it is maximizing for that person.

2. Nonidentity Cases

As just noted, many nonidentity cases that have been most persuasive on the point that some “bad” acts are “bad for” no existing or future person involve acts that do not on their face seem to have anything to do with whether one person is brought into existence rather than another. They involve acts, that is, to which no particular person seems to “owe” his or her “very existence.”

That ordinary acts might have such an existence-inducing nature – that the people they bring into flawed existences would not, indeed, could not have ever existed at all in the absence of those acts – is related to the phenomenon Gregory Kavka described as the “precariousness” of existence (Kavka 1982, 93). We understand that the identity of each person who ever comes into existence – the coming into existence, that is, of any one particular person in place of any nonidentical distinct person – depends, among other things, on just who the genetic parents of that person happen to be. As Parfit observes, the woman who wonders who she would have been had her “parents married other people” “ignores the answer,” which is “no one” (Parfit 1987, 351). But it is not just who one marries that determines the identity of one’s offspring. It is also what Parfit and others describe as the timing and manner of conception. When the act of conceiving a child is moved forward or backward in time by months or even moments, or when the manner of conception is itself altered (accomplished, e.g., via in vitro fertilization rather than coitus), the result, very probably, will be the conception of a distinct child altogether. After all, any difference in timing or manner very probably will place a distinct inseminating sperm cell (out of hundreds of millions!) in proximity to the ovum or even result in a distinct ovum being inseminated. And a distinction in sperm and egg cells would seem in most cases sufficient to insure the conception of a distinct child (Parfit 1987, 351–55; 2011 vol. 2, 217–231). Moreover, the exact timing and manner of conception is itself highly susceptible to variations in whatever complex chain of acts and events it is that has come before. Much of what has been done in human history, had it been done differently, would surely have undone the conceptions of vast numbers of persons. “[H]ow many of us could truly claim, ‘Even if railways and motor cars had never been invented, I would still have been born’?” (Parfit 1987, 361).

Consider, then, an act A that is performed at a possible world w and yields at w positive but low wellbeing levels for one or more people who will but do not yet exist at w. Suppose that wellbeing levels are low in virtue of the fact that act A performed at w causes those persons to endure pain, misery, disease, deprivation or limitation. And suppose that those low wellbeing levels cannot be justified (on the ground, for example, that they save many existing persons from still lower wellbeing levels) and that we are accordingly convinced that act A is wrong. What the precariousness point tells us is that in many cases the very future persons – call them the “A-people” – who endure low wellbeing levels also “owe their very existence” to that act A. Perhaps an act B existed as an alternative for the agents at the time just prior to choice. And perhaps B strikes us as more benign than A in the sense that B would have yielded higher wellbeing levels for whatever future persons may happen to have existed had B been performed in place of A. The problem is that in many cases – and it takes just one to produce the relevant problem case, the counterexample against the person-based intuition – performing B in place of A would also have changed (or very probably would have changed) the timing and manner of the conceptions that take place at w. That means that act B would not have made things better for the A-people but rather would have caused the A-people – each and every one of them – to have (very probably) been left out of existence altogether. The pain, misery and so on that A imposes on the A-people is, in other words, unavoidable if those particular people are ever to exist at all. The same point holds for any other seemingly more benign act as well. Assuming that the A-people are not so miserable that never existing at all would have been better for them than their existence in fact is, we now find it very hard to see how A has harmed, or made things worse for, or been “bad for,” the A-people in any “morally relevant way” (Parfit 1987, 361–63), 374.

2.1 Depletion

The phenomenon of the precariousness of existence is nicely illustrated in Parfit’s depletion case. Suppose that agents as a community have chosen to deplete rather than conserve certain resources. The consequences of that choice for the persons who exist now or will come into existence over the next two centuries will be “slightly higher” than under a conservation alternative (Parfit 1987, 362; see also Parfit 2011 (vol. 2), 218). Thereafter, however, for many centuries the quality of life would be much lower. “The great lowering of the quality of life must provide some moral reason not to choose Depletion” (Parfit 1987, 363). Surely agents ought to have chosen conservation in some form or another instead. But note that, at the same time, depletion seems to harm no one. While distant future persons, by hypothesis, will suffer as a result of depletion, it is also true that for each such person a conservation choice (very probably) would have changed the timing and manner of the relevant conception. That change, in turn, would have changed the identities of the people conceived and the identities of the people who eventually exist. Any suffering, then, that they endure under the depletion choice would seem to be unavoidable if those persons are ever to exist at all. Assuming (here and throughout) that that existence is worth having, we seem forced to conclude that depletion does not harm, or make things worse for, and is not otherwise “bad for,” anyone at all (Parfit 1987, 363). At least: depletion does not harm, or make things worse for, and is not "bad for," anyone who does or will exist under the depletion choice.

The risky policy example, also from Parfit, has a similar structure (Parfit 1987, 371–72), as does John Broome’s example of climate change (Broome 1992).

2.2 The slave child

We see the same kind of argument but at a less global and more local level in Kavka’s slave child case. In exchange for $50,000, a couple enters into a binding, enforceable contract with a wealthy man according to which the couple will conceive and bear a child who will be transferred at birth to the wealthy man as a slave (Kavka 1982, 100). The child is conceived and born pursuant to the contract – and, as a slave, suffers in various ways. We think what the couple has done is “outrageous” (Kavka 1982, 101). And we think that that is so because of what the couple’s choice does to the slave child. But can the latter view be correct? Does the couple’s choice truly makes things worse for, or harm, the slave child? Is there anything else the couple could have done instead that would have made things better for that particular child? The couple certainly had alternatives. They could have not entered into the contract and not taken steps to produce a child, and they could have not entered into the contract and still taken steps to produce a child. The former alternative, of course, would not have been better for the slave child. (We are still assuming that the existence is itself worth having.) But nor is the latter. For, had the couple produced a child but not under contract, the timing and conditions of conception would then (very probably) have changed and any better off child the couple might then have produced would (very probably) have been a distinct child, nonidentical to the slave child (Kavka 1982, 100 n. 15). The slave child, in other words, has no better alternative than what he or she has in fact been given as a slave. Once we appreciate that fact, it becomes hard to see how what the couple has done harms, or makes things worse for, or is otherwise “bad for,” the child. Kavka’s “pleasure pill” case parallels the slave child case (Kavka 1982, 98).

2.3 The 14-year-old girl

Another classic case from Parfit focuses on the simple fact that the egg cell a young girl will produce soon after she becomes capable of conceiving a child will not be the same egg cell as the one she will produce a decade or more later. “This girl chooses to have a child” (Parfit 1987, 358). We think that it would have been better for the girl to wait “for several years” to have a child and that, barring exceptional circumstances, what the girl has in fact done is wrong (Parfit 1987, 358). We also think that the reason her choice is wrong is that it causes the child the girl bears to be given a “bad start in life” (Parfit 1987, 358). On closer inspection, however, we see that that particular child could not have existed at all had the girl waited until she was older to have a child. Given that the child’s life is worth living – given, that is, that it would not have been better for the child that he or she never have existed at all – it seems that the child has not been harmed, or made worse off, by what the girl has done, and that there exists no plausible basis for the position that her act is “bad for” the child.

Since Parfit first described the 14-year-old girl case, reproductive technologies have advanced. The option of cryopreserving gametes or newly formed human embryos now means that there is at least a theoretical possibility that the 14-year-old girl really could have produced the same child – or at least a child from the same gametes – many years later. Even so, the probabilities of the situation would need to be taken into account. Changing the manner of conception – moving, that is, from coitus to in vitro fertilization and cryopreservation followed by embryo transfer ten years later – would have surely meant that very probably it would have been a nonidentical (if better off) child who would have been conceived in place of the one.

2.4 Wrongful life

In any case, not all things are possible in the world of new technologies. Consider, e.g., the legal claim in negligence referred to as wrongful life. The claim there is that medical personnel either (1) have failed properly to advise couples of their risk of producing a child with a serious genetic or chromosomal disorder or of the availability of technologies that would have enabled them to reduce that risk or (2) have failed to implement those technologies effectively. The disorders at issue include Down syndrome, Huntington’s disease and hereditary deafness, and the relevant technologies include preconception genetic testing, in vitro fertilization followed by pre-implantation genetic diagnosis and amniocentesis, which can now be performed as early as the 14th week of pregnancy. Technologies are not yet so advanced that their proper use would have cured the underlying impairment. But their use would have enabled the couple to produce either no child at all or a nonidentical, if (arguably) better off, child instead. At the same time, it seems clear that, in almost all such cases, the impaired child’s life will be (or, at least, can be made to be) unambiguously worth living. It is thus very hard to say in such cases how the negligent act or omission, to whom the child owes his or her very existence, has harmed, or made things worse for, or otherwise been “bad for,” the child. (Still more severe impairments, impairments that we think make the child’s existence unavoidably less than worth having, fall into another category altogether. In those surely rare cases, the claim that bringing the child into existence harms the child – is, that is, worse for that child than never existing at all would have been – becomes imminently plausible. Following Buchanan et al., we might reserve the terminology of wrongful life for that latter case and adopt the phrase wrongful disability to describe the more common case in which we can agree that the existence, despite the impairment, is worth having (Buchanan, et al. 2000, 222–257).)

The question wrongful life raises in the law is whether a gynecologist or obstetrician who has failed to communicate the advisability of genetic testing, or the lab that has negligently generated a falsely reassuring test result, can be held liable to the impaired child under a claim of negligence. In the absence of the negligent act or omission, that particular child would never have existed at all. Yet in most cases the child’s life is unambiguously worth living. In such cases, we seem, then, forced to say that the negligent act has not harmed the child. Harm – in the intuitive, comparative, worse off sense of that term – being an essential element of any claim in negligence, it also seems that the child’s action against the doctor or lab should be dismissed as legally invalid. Yet we may well think that the tort law system should be construed as a way of incentivizing medical personnel to work to insure that the children whom their efforts help to produce are born free of impairment. And we may also think that the parents’ claim – called wrongful birth – against those same medical personnel for the additional expense of caring for an impaired child is not an adequate incentive – especially in light of statutes of limitation that cut off the parents’ claim (in contrast to the child’s) soon after the child is born. Legally, then, we face a dilemma – a case where the law of negligence should be understood as insisting that medical personnel be vigilant in advising and conducting genetic testing but where, thanks to the logic of the nonidentity problem, those same personnel are in a position to understand in advance that any negligence on their part cannot harm their most plausible victims who themselves will be left without any cause of action whatsoever.

Parfit’s “two medical programs” case – more precisely, the program that would encourage women who have a certain condition that “cannot be treated, but always disappears within two months,” to delay pregnancy – is structurally similar to the wrongful life case (Parfit 1987, 367–368; see also Parfit 2011 vol. 2, 221–222). In both cases, the existence is worth having, and in both cases the impairment is not the kind of thing agents can, given existing technologies, either cure or ameliorate.

2.5 Historic injustices

The nonidentity problem raises the issue of whether historic injustices can properly be said to harm, or make things worse for, persons who exist today (Sher 2005; Herstein 2008; Cohen 2009; Smilansky 2013). According to the nonidentity problem, historic injustices – including, e.g., U.S. slavery and the Holocaust – lead to the very existence of many of the persons whom they have also caused to suffer in various ways. Persons conceived well after the events themselves take place are thus not, according to the nonidentity problem, victims of those events at all, but rather, if anything, their beneficiaries. “[H]ow can any person have a claim to compensation for a wrong that was a condition of her existence?” (Cohen 2009, 81) If we think that the taking of funds from presumptively innocent existing and future persons so that those funds can be paid in compensation for historic injustices to still other persons can be justified only to the extent that those other persons really are victims – really have been harmed or damaged or made worse off – then we seem forced to conclude that such takings cannot themselves be justified.

3. Proposed solutions to the nonidentity problem

3.1 Seemingly wrong act is in fact not wrong; “biting the bullet”

Some philosophers have understood the exculpatory implication of the nonidentity analysis – and specifically the application of intuitions (1) and (2) – to form the basis of a perfectly good argument in favor of an interesting conclusion we should just accept: that intuition (3) is false and that the acts under scrutiny are not after all morally wrong.

As before, an assumption of the argument is that the existences under consideration are worth having. In cases where that assumption fails and the existence is less than worth having – in cases where the new person would be so miserable that it would have been better for that person never to have existed at all – the strategy splinters. David Heyd holds fast to the conclusion that the acts under scrutiny are not wrong. According to Heyd, comparisons between the wellbeing level a given person has at a world at which that person exists and the wellbeing level that same person has at a world where that person never exists are not cogent and hence we have no basis for the claim that a wrong has been done (Heyd 1992, 30–33). Philosophers who think, however, that such comparisons can cogently be made – who accept, we can say, Comparability – remain free to limit their “bite the bullet” conclusion to the case where the assumption holds and the existence is worth having. Thus, in contrast to Heyd, David Boonin is at least neutral on Comparability. That is, he doesn’t reject the view that we can isolate and set aside those cases in which “life [is] worse than no life at all” (Boonin 2008, 130 and 135; see also Bayne 2010). Moreover, he implicitly limits his own “bite the bullet” strategy to cases in which the life is worth living. Only in those cases does he press the point that the acts under scrutiny are not morally wrong.

In those cases, moreover, Boonin thinks we can reach a stronger conclusion than Heyd does. Thus Heyd is willing to say that the acts under scrutiny are not morally wrong but not to say that those same acts are morally permissible. Heyd’s view is that we aren’t in a position to evaluate them at all – that they fall into the category of the genethical rather than the straightforwardly ethical. Boonin, in contrast, thinks we can evaluate them. And, given, again, that we are in a case in which the existence is worth having, he thinks we can evaluate them as morally permissible (Boonin 2008, 146–149).

One other note on Heyd’s approach is in order. At least some of Heyd’s language suggests that he accepts a certain principle that, to be sure, implies intuition (2) but also goes well beyond intuition (2). According to that principle, the “no harm done” result is in order, not just in the case where the flawed existence is unavoidable if the person is ever to exist at all and where, in that strong sense, the person’s coming into existence “depends on” the act under scrutiny being performed, but also in the case where agents simply retain “control” over whether that person comes into existence or not (Heyd 1992, 105 and, generally, 99–106; Heyd 2009, 15–17). According to that principle, even if the couple has the alternative of bringing the same child into a better existence – even if the existence is not unavoidably flawed – if the couple also has the alternative of not bringing the child into existence at all, the act under scrutiny cannot harm, or make things worse for, the child. The idea here would be that, until we actually produce them, “we might decide not to make them the subject of any kind of moral status whatsoever” – a situation that leaves them, even if they are in fact on their way into existence, with “no moral status of any kind, not even a weak one,” relative to the act under scrutiny (Heyd 1992, 99). It’s doubtful, however, that the best reading of Heyd includes this principle. More generally, theorists who want to employ the “bite the bullet” strategy may find their positions easier to defend if they refrain from going far beyond the boundaries of the very stringent intuition (2).

Not surprisingly, the “bite the bullet” strategy has encountered substantial resistance. If forced to choose between the disconcertingly abstract person-based intuition and the concrete moral judgment that what the agents have done in the depletion case or slave child case is wrong, we may well opt for the latter. Among other things, it seems implausible that our future-directed conduct should get a free moral pass whenever it affects the timing and manner of conception. So much affects the timing and manner of conception! But – even given the assumption that the existences we are dealing with are worth having – it seems implausible that all such acts are morally permissible.

Of course, as Heyd notes, in many cases an act that creates a low wellbeing level for a person whose existence depends on that act will also create low wellbeing levels for people whose existences are independent of that act. If an agent buries glass in the wood prior to conceiving a child, then even if that act affects the timing and manner of conception and thus (according to the logic of the nonidentity analysis) would not make things worse for the agent’s own child that act might still make things worse for a neighbor’s child. On that ground, the act can be declared wrong (Heyd 1992, 193–203). The choice of wrongful life, as well, can have deleterious effects on persons other than the impaired child (Roberts 2008).

In fact, Parfit himself points out that the 14-year-old girl’s choice to have a child has “effects on other people” besides the girl’s child (Parfit, 1987, 361). However, as Parfit also points out, the problem arises in a “purer form,” e.g., the depletion example (Parfit, 1987, 361). As Heyd himself is fully aware, the “harm to others” response isn’t available in all of the nonidentity cases.

Boonin offers another suggestion for making the “bite the bullet” strategy plausible. According to Boonin, our intuition that the acts under scrutiny – in, e.g., the depletion case and the slave child case – are wrong is itself rooted in the fact that we have a hard time keeping “present before our mind’s eye” what makes the nonidentity cases “atypical” and “idiosyncratic” – namely, that in the nonidentity cases low wellbeing levels do not correlate in the usual way or the way we have come to expect to a person’s having been made worse off (Boonin 2008, 146–149). We then confuse the atypical case with the ordinary case in which low wellbeing levels do signify a person’s having been made worse off. We then, mistakenly, see wrongdoing not just in the ordinary case but in the atypical case as well. Once we appreciate that confusion, we should find ourselves more comfortable abandoning the view that a wrong has been done in the atypical case.

Boonin’s theory is, however, hard to test, especially since we – post-Parfit – at least feel that we always have the relevant distinction clearly in mind but continue to consider the depletion choice wrong.

3.2 Act is wrong in virtue of impersonal effects

This proposal accepts the standard nonidentity cases as counterexamples to the person-based intuition. Thus, it rejects the person-based intuition itself, that is, intuition (1); it has no need for but doesn’t necessarily reject the “no harm done” test provided in intuition (2); and it accepts intuition (3), according to which the choices under scrutiny are indeed wrong. Having rejected intuition (1), however, this proposal can then succeed only if combined with a plausible account of just how an act can be wrong even though it makes things worse for no existing or future person. Several such impersonal accounts have been proposed. The question will be whether they are plausible.

3.2.1 Traditional utilitarianism

Traditional forms of utilitarianism, including both the total form (“totalism”) and the average form (“averagism”), have the resources to explain how an act can be wrong while making things worse for no existing or future person. If, by waiting a few years to have a child, the 14-year-girl could have produced a child who is better off but nonidentical to the child the girl in fact produced, both totalism and averagism will imply (other things being equal) that what the girl has done is wrong (Singer 2011, 107–119). The key for both views is the reference to aggregate wellbeing in contrast to the wellbeing of the individual. On the aggregative approach, it is immaterial whether we create additional (average or total) wellbeing (a) by creating additional wellbeing for a particular existing or future person or (b) by bringing a nonidentical but better off person into existence. If we have no way of accomplishing the former – and one part of the nonidentity analysis claims that we don’t – then we must do the latter. (See the entry on consequentialism.)

The nonidentity problem thus seems to show, as Parfit notes, that the moral principle we seek – our “Theory X” – “will not take a person-affecting form” (Parfit 1987, 378). The question is, then, what form it will take. The answer is not obvious since, as Parfit also notes, the nonidentity problem is not our only problem. Thus, totalism can easily explain how an act that makes things worse for no existing or future person can be wrong. But it immediately generates – for example – the repugnant conclusion (Parfit 1987, 381–90; see also repugnant conclusion). Averagism does a good job with the repugnant conclusion but implausibly seems to prohibit bringing an additional very happy child into existence if it so happens that prior generations have had especially wonderful lives (Parfit 1987, 420; Feldman 1995, 192–93). It also seems to condone what Temkin calls “Hell Three” (Temkin 2012, 319–320). Both totalism and averagism, moreover, face objections based on considerations of justice, fairness and equality. Fashioning a cogent response to the nonidentity problem that does not create at least as many problems as it solves has thus emerged as a critical challenge in contemporary moral philosophy.

3.2.2 Impersonal pluralism and substitutional consequentialism

In response to objections, some consequentialists have proposed that what makes an act permissible or a world better is determined by reference to overall good, where overall good itself is a matter both of how much aggregate wellbeing a world contains and the extent to which that world realizes still other ideals or values, including, for example, fairness, desert, equality, human flourishing and the prioritization of the needs of the least well-off (Temkin 1993, 221–27; see also Broome 1991 and Feldman 1997). Such theories retain the aggregative element we see in (for example) totalism and hence seem able to provide a plausible response to the nonidentity problem. But they also may have the ability to avoid the repugnant conclusion – to explain, for example, by reference to the ideal of human flourishing (Temkin) or the concept of desert (Feldman) how it can be morally better to produce a smaller number of extremely well off individuals rather than a very large number of people whose lives are only barely worth living.

Still other philosophers have suggested principles that require agents to create additional wellbeing, including, when necessary, by bringing a better off person into existence in place of a nonidentical less well off person, but limit that obligation to the case where agents can substitute in the better off person for the less well off person on a one-to-one basis. Such principles address the nonidentity problem without giving rise to the repugnant conclusion. They, in other words, avoid the obligation to create more wellbeing on an aggregate basis by bringing ever more people into existence (Holtug 2009; Holtug 2010, 160–162; see also Parfit 1987, 369–71 (discussion of Principle Q); Peters 2004, 27–39 (concept of injury by failure to substitute); and Savulescu 2001 (principle of procreative beneficence)).

3.2.3 Radical pluralism

Some more radical forms of pluralism incorporate both person-based and impersonal elements. The impersonal elements of such an approach may themselves take either an aggregative or a substitutional form. Thus: consider whether a couple ought to produce a third child, a child who would be very happy if he or she were to exist but whose coming into existence would create significant burdens for the two already-existing children. Then, we might say that the goal of maximizing wellbeing in the aggregate provides the couple with a reason to have the third child while the person-based goal of avoiding burdens on behalf of the two already-existing children provides the couple with a reason not to have the third child. What the couple ought to do is then determined by how these opposing reasons balance against one another (McMahan 2006; 2009).

In contrast, Buchanan, et al., favor putting the person-based approach together with a substitutional form of pluralism. On their view, many of our obligations are person-based in nature, including the obligation to avoid making a particular person worse off or to avoid causing that person to suffer a “serious loss of happiness or good” when the agent can do so without imposing “substantial burdens” on others. This is their “Principle M” (Buchanan, et al. 2000, 226). In some cases, however, we have obligations that go beyond Principle M. It is here that their impersonal “Principle N” is triggered, prohibiting agents from letting their dependents – including their children – “experience serious suffering or limited opportunity or serious loss of happiness or good” if “they can act … without affecting the number of persons who will exist and without imposing substantial burdens … on themselves or others …” (Buchanan, et al. 2000, 249).

The need to address not just the nonidentity problem but the full range of population problems leads Larry Temkin as well to recognize impersonal as well as person-based values. Finding that terminology itself unenlightening, Temkin describes what he calls the internal aspects view of when one world, or outcome, is morally better than another as well as what he calls the essentially comparative view (Temkin 2012, 363–456). We take for granted that our ultimate goal is to evaluate a given world for its moral betterness against other worlds. But on the internal aspects view the good of that one world can be discerned without comparing the features of that world against the features of other worlds. Totalism is a paradigm instance of the internal aspects view (though not a view Temkin, given his emphasis on equality, human flourishing and so on, himself endorses). In contrast, on the essentially comparative view the good of the one world cannot come to light in the absence of the interworld comparison. Moreover, we find that when we engage in such comparisons it is the person-based features of those worlds that bear on betterness-between-worlds. Thus, suppose that the only difference between two worlds is the addition to the second world of a single person whose existence is there worth having. That second world may nonetheless turn out to be morally worse than the first, on the essentially comparative view, if that same person exists in a third world and there has a still better existence (Temkin 2012, 364–400).

Temkin’s and most other forms of pluralism face an important challenge. They have ample resources for generating what many philosophers will consider plausible accounts of (for example) both the nonidentity problem and the repugnant conclusion. The problem is going to be one of containment. The theories are too rich, and we don’t yet know by what principle the particular view can be stopped from generating what we consider to be implausible accounts of the problem cases as well.

3.3 Act is bad for person without making that person worse off

Some philosophers who accept that the acts under scrutiny in the standard nonidentity cases are wrong still urge that our best account of just why those acts are wrong will take a person-based form. They, in other words, accept intuition (3). Moreover, they accept what they consider to be the heart of the person-based intuition itself. They accept, in other words, a weakened form of intuition (1), one that ties wrongdoing in a general way to what has been done to a particular person without requiring that the act under scrutiny make an existing or future person worse off or harm that person (in an intuitive, comparative sense of that term). Conforming changes are then made to intuition (2), which is rejected as false.

The positions surveyed in this part 3.3 are all to some degree reminiscent of an idea that Kavka explores. According to that idea, even if the acts under scrutiny do not make things worse for, or harm (in the intuitive, comparative sense of that term), the child, they may nonetheless constitute instances in which the agent acts (by creating a less “intrinsically desirable,” “restricted” life) “wrongly toward” the child (Kavka, 1982, 97 and 104–105) and thus acts wrongly.

3.3.1 Act violates future person’s rights

Thus, one suggestion has been that what makes the act under scrutiny wrong is that it violates the apparent victim’s right against being brought into a flawed existence (Woodward 1986; Elliot 1989; Elliot 1997; Smolkin 1999; Velleman 2008; Cohen 2009). Consider, for example, the slave child case. The nonidentity analysis has it that the couple’s entering into the slave child contract does not make things worse for the child since (very probably) that particular child would never have existed at all in the absence of that act. Yet we may agree that everyone has a right not to be made, or born, a slave. The couple’s entering into the slave child contract and then proceeding to have a child under that contract thus violates the child’s right. On that basis, we can then say that the couple’s act is itself wrong.

Similarly, the ticket agent who refuses to sell an airline ticket to Smith on the basis of Smith’s race violates Smith’s right against racial discrimination even in the case where the plane subsequently “crashes, killing all aboard” (Woodward 1986, 810–11, citing Adams). “What makes racial discrimination wrong is that it is unfair and that it stigmatizes … and an action may have this character – and be wrong for this reason – regardless of how it affects [a person’s] other interests” (Woodward 1986, 811).

We thus explain – and explain in person-based terms – how an act can be wrong even though it makes things worse for no existing or future person.

Woodward goes so far as to say that the act that brings a person into a flawed existence and thereby violates that person’s right “harms” that person under what he calls a “nonconsequentialist approach” to harm (Woodward 1986, 818). It might be objected, however, that that use of the term harm seems particularly artificial. Moreover, having establish that the right has been violated, it is unclear why – to establish wrongdoing – we would need to show harm as well.

The rights-based account does not require that we compile a defined list of rights. We might take the more general view that each person has a right to be created with “due consideration for his or her humanity”; we can understand that life itself is a “predicament” for which one’s children need to be well-equipped (Velleman 2008, 266 and 276). A “child has a right to be born into good enough circumstances, and being born to [e.g.] a fourteen-year-old mother isn’t good enough” (Velleman 2008, 275). That a child was “glad to be born” doesn’t mean that that child has waived “his birthright” (Velleman 2008, 277). If we find this unclear, we might alternatively take the position that it is wrong to bring a child into existence when many of his or her rights as outlined in, e.g., the United Nations Convention, would be violated (Archard 2004, 403–20).

The rights-based solution faces at least three challenges. The first, from Parfit, is that it is questionable whether an act an individual would not “regret” and would even applaud can violate a right. If it can, surely it does so only in some formal way but not in a way that is sufficient to show that the act is morally wrong. When respect for the right can be seen in advance not to promote the interests of the rights-holder in any way, the better view might be that the right has been implicitly “waived” or the violation implicitly consented to (Parfit 1987, 364–65 and 373–74). Similarly, the right against bodily injury may be considered waived, or the violation consented to, when one arrives at the hospital unconscious and in immediate need of open heart surgery. We don’t think that whatever formal rights violation there may have been in such a case supports the inference that what the surgeon has done is morally – or even legally – wrong.

The second objection asks whether the rights-based approach proves too much. Consider the case where a couple is enslaved and has no means of escaping that status. Any child that the couple will produce is thus sure to born a slave. If producing a child in the original slave child case is wrong in virtue of the fact that it violates the child’s right, it seems that producing a child in the revised slave child case must be wrong as well. But the evaluation in that latter case is surely implausible. If a right has been violated, that violation surely does not rise to the level of a wrongdoing.

A third objection notes that, if the child has the right not to be brought into an existence of a certain sort, it is plausible that the child’s parents have various rights as well. Thus, the couple who opts to produce a child with Huntington’s disease or hereditary deafness in place of a relatively unimpaired child may be simply exercising their right of procreative liberty; they may be using their gametes and their labor, as a matter of right, in a way that suits them. We quickly see that the offspring’s rights and the couple’s rights cannot both be respected – a fact that may be construed to mean that the underlying account of rights is inconsistent (Persson 2009).

3.3.2 Non-comparative harm; list account of harm; threshold account of harm; wronging without harming

The preceding discussion takes for granted that an intuitive account of harm will be comparative in nature. On such an account, an act harms a person only if that act makes that person worse off than he or she would have been under an alternative act; a person p is not harmed at a given world w unless there exists some alternate world w’ such that p has more wellbeing at w’ than p has at w; an act that maximizes wellbeing for a person at a world w cannot harm that person at w. At least: it cannot do so in any “morally relevant sense” (Parfit 1987, 374).

Some philosophers have suggested that we also have – or can construct – a second morally relevant concept of harm, one that is non-comparative in nature. Though narrower in some ways than the comparative concept, in others the non-comparative concept is broader. Specifically, it can count bringing a person into a flawed existence, even in the case where there is no better existence to be had for that person, as harming that person. Having established that the act under scrutiny harms the person it both brings into existence and causes to suffer, we can then give an account – and a person-based account at that; an account that retains, not the original person-based intuition (1), but rather a weakened version of that intuition – of why that act is wrong.

Seana Shiffrin uses examples to motivate the view that we have a concept of non-comparative harm and, just as important, that non-comparative harm has moral relevance. Thus she argues that, if you are hit on the head by a gold bar dropped from the sky, you have been harmed even if you have been more than compensated for that harm in virtue of the fact that you are now in possession of the gold bar (Shiffrin 1999, 120–135).

In the wrongful life case, a child is born with a serious genetic or chromosomal impairment, an impairment that is unavoidable if the child is to exist at all. On a comparative account of harm, bringing that child into existence does not harm that child – provided, of course, that that existence is not less than worth having. But, as Elizabeth Harman notes, it’s indisputable that bringing that child into existence does cause the child to experience “pain, mental or physical discomfort, disease, deformity, disability, or death”; more generally, it produces a state that is bad for the child to be in – a “bad state.” (Harman 2009, 139). On Harman’s view, an act’s imposing any of the listed effects on the child is sufficient to establish that that act harms the child, whether the child has been made worse off or not (Harman 2004, 92–93 and 107; Harman 2009, 139). It would be hard to argue, moreover, that harm in that form has no moral relevance. Thus, even those who think that wrongful life doesn’t involve harm – harm, that is, in the intuitive, comparative sense of that term – agree that any pain and suffering experienced by the child must be taken into account in order to determine that the child’s existence is not less than worth having. (In the rare case in which the child’s existence is less than worth having – in which, that is, the child would have been better off never existing at all – we would say that the child sustains both comparative and non-comparative harm.)

A related proposal that avoids the difficulties of tethering non-comparative harm to any particular list of adverse conditions makes use of the concept of a threshold-dependent concept of harm (Rivera-Lopez 2009, 342; see also Meyer, 2004). On this view, bringing a child into existence whose wellbeing level falls below “some normal threshold of quality of life” counts as harming that child even if that existence is itself worth having (Rivera-Lopez 2009, 337).

Objections to proposals that rely on a non-comparative concept of harm to solve the nonidentity problem focus on whether that concept itself can be clearly worked out. Thus, it may be hard to see how one whose wellbeing has been maximized can at the same time have been harmed in any sense of that term that remains clearly within our grasp. Moreover, as Parfit suggests, even if we think it correct on occasion to say that a person who has not been made worse off has been “harmed,” we may still be unclear whether that person has been harmed in a “morally relevant sense” (Parfit 1987, 374). Finally, there is the question of limits: what adverse conditions are to appear on the non-comparative harm list? What is the threshold level below which existence counts as harm? What is “normal”? And are we really willing to eliminate or at least to mix up the distinction we think we now can so cleanly draw between, e.g., the case in which opening up one’s chest to expose the heart serves no purpose at all and the case in which opening up one’s chest to expose the heart is an essential part of an open-heart procedure that is itself both necessary and sufficient for the restoration of life and health?

A strategy that avoids disputes surrounding the concept of harm would be to argue that, even if the act does not harm the child, the fact that it causes the child to suffer may mean that it nonetheless wrongs the child. Bonnie Steinbock thus recognizes how hard it is to establish that the child brought into the unavoidably flawed existence has been genuinely harmed (Steinbock 2009, 157–158). But she argues that we still have room to insist that such a child has been treated unfairly or has been wronged in cases in which the child’s existence fails to meet or exceed a certain “decent minimum,” which is itself achieved “only if life holds a reasonable promise of containing the things that make human lives good,” such as “an ability to experience pleasure, to learn, to have relationships with others” (Steinbock 2009, 163–165). Another approach would be to draw the line at average wellbeing (for discussion, see Rachels 1998; Tooley 1998); and still another approach would be to focus on whether the child will face unusual or severe hardships (Benatar 2000; Kamm 2002).

Matthew Hanser underlines an issue raised by all of the proposals sketched in this part 3.3.4. Does an act that causes a person to endure even serious hardship necessarily harm that person even if we agree that that person suffers harm (in a non-comparative sense)? Hanser’s own view is that an act harms a person only if the agent stands in some “appropriate relation” to the harm that is suffered, where that relation will involve a counterfactual element and accordingly may not obtain if the suffering is due to a genetic disease or disorder (Hanser 2009). While Hanser puts the point in terms of harm, it could be extended to the notion of wronging without harming that Steinbock suggests.

In raising this issue, Hanser suggests that we can bifurcate the nonidentity cases, analyzing, for example, the wrongful life case in one way and the depletion case in another. We can, that is, say that the future persons in both sorts of cases have suffered harm but only the victims of depletion have been harmed by the choice under scrutiny. Or in terms of wronging: the future persons in both sorts of cases are made to exist in a wronged state but only the victims of depletion have been wronged.

3.3.5 Harming, or wronging, one person by failing to substitute that person for another

Several proposals fall under this heading. Proposal (a) below accepts that the future person p is nonidentical to the person q conceived from distinct gametes and then exploits the fact that p and q may fall under the same description; proposal (b) argues p and q may be identical despite a distinction in gametes (despite, that is, a distinction in the timing and manner of conception); and proposal (c) exploits certain mistakes many people will make in thinking about the identity between p and q.

(a) Though Parfit briefly discusses and sets aside the descriptive proposal (Parfit 1987, 359–60), interest in that proposal has been renewed in recent years (Hare 2007, 512–23, advocating concept of “de dicto” harm; Reiman 2007, 78–90, describing a “veil of ignorance” with respect to the identity of the person harmed). The proposal makes use of the fact that the same definite description can pick out distinct children in distinct scenarios. Consider the slave child case. Let p be the child who in fact exists and suffers as a result of the couple’s entering into the slave child contract. And let q be any one of the children who might have existed had the couple not entered into the slave child contract yet still produced a child. The nonidentity problem argues (among other things) that p and q are, at least very probably, numerically distinct, that is, nonidentical. At the same time, on one construction, p and q, even if nonidentical, fall under a common description: they are equally, for example, “the child produced by the couple.” Moreover, since one choice makes p worse off than the other choice makes q, the one choice, on a certain construction, makes “the child produced by the couple” worse off than the other choice makes “the child produced by the couple.” And on that basis we can then say that the one choice makes things (“de dicto”) worse for “the child produced by the couple” than the other choice does.

Parfit’s own concerns about proposal (a) – the descriptive proposal – are based on the apparent explanatory gap between the claim that the couple’s act makes things worse for “the child produced by the couple” and the result we seek to explain – that the act of entering into the contract is wrong. The question is whether there is anything we can grasp in what the couple has done to the child in fact produced that explains why the couple’s act is wrong. No “familiar moral principle” takes us from the shorthand claim to the assessment we are aiming to explain (Parfit 1987, 359; Wasserman 2008, 529–35).

A concern Rivka Weinberg has expressed about this proposal is rooted in the metaphysical doctrine of actualism. If talk about the merely possible but better off and nonidentical child is not fully cogent, then so (presumably) is talk about an act’s being wrong in virtue of the fact that it makes the person who actually exists – exists, that is, at the uniquely actual world – and falls under a certain description worse off than a more facially benign act makes a merely possible person – a person, that is, who does not exist at the actual world but does exist at some non-actual world – who falls under that same description (Weinberg 2008). Of course, this objection may itself fail if we are convinced that such an unyielding form of actualism cannot be correct – if, that is, whether actualist or not we are convinced that claims about the merely possible can be both true and cogent.

(b) Proposal (b) challenges the metaphysical claims about cross-world identity that are inherent in the nonidentity problem. On this proposal, the child p produced as a slave when the couple chooses to enter into the slave child contract and the child q produced as a non-slave when the couple refrains from entering into the contract but still produces a child should not necessarily be considered distinct. p and q may, in other words, be the very same child despite the fact that (due to variations in the timing and manner of their conceptions) they have ended up with distinct genomes (Wolf 2009).

(c) Proposal (c) involves a form of rule consequentialism that, rather than struggling to avoid, simply exploits two naïve mistakes that many people may well make when they first begin to think about their obligations in respect of future persons. The first is the mistake of thinking that the population produced when, for example, agents choose conservation will be identical, at least in part, to the population produced when agents instead choose depletion. The second is the person-based intuition itself – the idea that an act that makes things worse for no existing or future person cannot be wrong. Tim Mulgan suggests that the “ideal code” – the code whose internalization by most of a given society will maximize wellbeing on an aggregate basis – will incorporate both these mistakes. They are both, after all, easily and efficiently “taught” since (Mulgan thinks) we are prone to make them in any case and they in effect cancel each other out. Because the ideal code is violated by the depletion choice and the 14-year-old girl’s choice to have a child, both are declared wrong (Mulgan 2006, 155–56 and 204; Mulgan 2009).

3.3.6 Is there an explanatory gap?

An ongoing controversy raised by the proposals described in this part 3.3 is whether they successfully explain the wrongness of the wrong act in terms of the adverse consequences that act has for the person whose plight has drawn our concern to begin with. Or do these proposals, instead, trace the wrongness of the wrong act to something other than what is bad for that particular person? Do they (in other words) retain the person-based intuition in a sufficiently robust form? Or are they person-based in name only and in fact root their explanation of wrongness not in what is bad for the person but rather in what is bad for the world?

Now, if we do take care to confine our scrutiny to what has been done to the child, a second concern immediately arises. As David Wasserman notes, if the child’s life is itself, though flawed, worth living and if that flaw is unavoidable if that particular child is ever to exist at all, it may seem that any difficulty the child then faces is a “perfectly acceptable price to pay for a life he [or she] could not have without it” (Wasserman 2006, 145). We again are left with the kind of explanatory gap that Parfit noted in connection with the descriptive view. Confining our scrutiny just to what has been done to the child and properly taking into account the good that has been done for the child as well as the bad, we cannot discern why what has been done is, by any stretch, bad for the child and hence cannot discern any basis for the claim that what has been done is wrong.

3.4 Nonidentity problem as nonidentity fallacy

This proposal claims we can retain the person-based intuition in its original form and recognize that bringing a person into an existence that is worth having but unavoidably flawed does not make things worse for, or harm (in a morally relevant sense), that person and yet insist that the acts under scrutiny in a large class of nonidentity cases are clearly wrong. The argument in support of that claim is that it has been a mistake to think that the acts under scrutiny have not made things worse for the people they bring into the flawed existence (Roberts 1998; 2003; 2006; 2009).

The proposal thus retains intuitions (1), (2) and (3) but argues that the condition described in intuition (2) has not been satisfied for that particular class of cases.

The strategy here is limited to the large class of nonidentity cases that reason from (a) had the act under scrutiny not been performed, the person who exists and suffers as an effect of that act very probably would never have existed at all and (b) that existence is worth having to the conclusion (c) that act does not make things worse for, or harm, that person. But that large class of cases also happens to be a very significant class of cases. It includes Kavka’s slave child and pleasure pill cases, Parfit’s depletion and risky policy cases, Broome’s climate change case and cases involving historical injustices. The proposal does not, however, support the view that there is some smaller class of nonidentity cases that does challenge the person-based intuition. Rather, it sees that smaller class of cases – which includes cases of wrongful life; cases, that is, in which existence is worth having but unavoidably flawed due to a genetic or chromosomal disorder – as less worrisome in the sense that it is surely less clear to us that the acts under scrutiny are themselves wrong.

The broader argument, then, is that, in any case in which it is clear to us that what is done is wrong, we can, on closer inspection, identify just how the people caused to exist have been made worse off. And, in any case in which we are forced to concede that the person caused to exist has not been made worse off – any case in which the existence is unavoidably flawed but still worth having – we should acknowledge that it is not really clear to us at all that what has been done is wrong. (If the act is wrong, it’s wrong because it makes things worse for still other people (Roberts 2008)).

What, then, is the argument for the claim that such a significant mistake in reasoning has been made? The first step in unwinding that mistake is to clarify that when we say an act makes a person worse off, we are not trying to press the (false) claim that the act makes the person worse off than that person would have been had that act not been performed. The simple, counterfactual, “but for,” account of harm that that kind of effort would derive from was – rightly – rejected decades ago. The better view is that an act makes a person worse off at a given world if there is some alternate act agents could have performed instead at an alternate world that would have made things better for that person at that alternate world. If, in other words, it is (physically and metaphysically) possible for agents to make things better for a given person, then what they have done makes things worse for that person.

The second step is to note that in the large class of nonidentity cases at issue here agents did have some way of making things better for the person who has been brought into a flawed existence. Thus, nothing in the laws of nature or in metaphysics or in the acts of other agents bars the agents in the slave child case from not entering into the slave child contract and still following the identical timetable for conception they in fact followed and bringing into existence as a non-slave the very same child they in fact brought into existence as a slave.

The rebuttal, of course, is that while such a better-for-the-child outcome is physically and metaphysically possible, it is surely highly improbable. The third step thus begins by addressing this objection. It acknowledges Kavka’s point about the precariousness of any given person’s coming into existence: the probability that that identical child will come into existence, given that the agents do anything other than perform the clearly wrong act they in fact perform, is very low. We might say: the probability that agents will follow the identical timetable for conception – that the timing and manner of conception will be at least close enough to the original to result in the conception of the identical child – is very low. But it notes that that probability calculation must itself be made as of that moment just prior to choice. (It is, after all, that calculation that is relevant to a calculation of the act’s expected value. If it is actual value we are interested in instead, we’ve already shown that some alternate act exists that has more actual value to offer the child than does the act in fact performed.) It then notes further that – again calculating probability just prior to choice – the probability of the particular child’s coming into existence is also very low, even given that the agents do enter into the slave child contract.

Suppose, that is, that it is Harry who is in fact brought into existence as a slave, the couple having entered the slave child contract and conceived and produced a child. What we are noting here is just that the probability, calculated just prior to choice, that Harry will exist, given that the couple enters into the slave child contract, is also very low. We might say: prior to choice, the probability that the couple will follow exactly the timetable they in fact end up following (or anything sufficiently like it) is just as miniscule whether the couple enters into the contract and conceives a child or the couple doesn’t enter into the contract and still conceives a child. The probabilities, either way, are very low and, indeed, a wash.

One might object that in fact there is no probability Harry would exist in the absence of the couple’s entering the contract, for without the contract the probability that that couple would together have produced any child at all is 0. That may be right, but it doesn’t bear on whether Harry has been made worse off. As noted above, the simple, counterfactual, “but for,” account of when a person has been made worse off (or harmed) is false. It isn’t what agents would have done, but what they could have done, that determines whether what they have done makes a person worse off or harms that person. If I shoot you in the arm and would have shot you in the heart had I not shot you in the shoulder, I have still made you worse off. I have made you worse off – not worse off than you would have been had I not shot you in the arm, but rather off worse off than you would have been had I just stood there quietly instead. It’s the best I could have done that should be our baseline in Feinberg’s sense – not what I would have done – for purposes of determining when a person has been made worse off (or, in a morally relevant sense, harmed) (Feinberg 1988).

Nor is it appropriate to determine whether a person has been made worse off by a given act by comparing the actual value produced for that person by that act against the expected value produced for that person by any alternate act. The proposal here takes no position on whether the expected or actual value approach is correct. But it does take into account that the view that an act can be considered at least as good for a person than an alternate act if the actual value the one act generates for that person is at least as great as the expected value the alternate act generates for that person is inconsistent (Roberts 2009).

That philosophers would mistakenly reason to the result that the apparent victim has not been made worse off is understandable. We see how things in fact are for the slave child under the act in fact performed, we see how precarious the child’s coming into existence is under any alternate act and we fail to notice that – calculated as of that moment just prior to choice – the child’s coming into existence is just as precarious under the act in fact performed.

Probabilities under the act under scrutiny may decline even further in cases that involve clearer risks to health and wellbeing. Consider a man whose great-grandparents suffered in the Holocaust and who now must ask himself what his attitude should be toward those atrocities. Since he is grateful for life itself, should he feel bad that he must also be grateful to those atrocities for the role they played in bringing him into existence? On this proposal, he need not be torn; his gratitude is misplaced. The atrocities may indeed have been a part of the causal chain ending in his existence. But there were alternate causal chains as well that equally would have ended in his existence had the agents of the Holocaust triggered them instead; those agents had alternate ways of helping his great-grandmother and great-grandfather find each other (as the shooting-in-the-shoulder example shows, that such agents wouldn’t have bothered isn’t material); if anything, by jeopardizing the lives of his own forebears on a daily basis, the atrocities only served to further reduce his chances of ever coming into existence at all. (For an alternate view, see Smilansky forthcoming.)

3.5 Act is wrong in virtue of agent’s reasons, attitudes and intentions

3.5.1 Act violates principle of mutual respect

A contractualist approach to the nonidentity problem will focus on the legitimate expectations future persons have in respect of the agents whose acts cause them both to exist and suffer. Such expectations can be violated – and future persons wronged – even in cases where those persons have not been made worse off, or harmed, by what the agent has done. What is important is not the outcome for the person but rather the “culpable failure” on the part of the agent, including the failure to respect a future person’s “value as capable of rational self-governance” by way of failing to take “risk-managing” measures (including, e.g, pre-conceptual genetic testing) on behalf of that future person (Kumar 2003, 104–114). An issue will be whether a measure that means that the person who will suffer can never exist at all is genuinely risk-managing in respect of that person. Again, however, that issue can be sidestepped to the extent this proposal is understood, given its focus on the agent’s act and not what the consequences of that act are for any particular person, to reflect an impersonal rather than a person-based approach.

3.5.2 Act’s agent fails to have appropriate concern for future person’s plight

A second approach that shifts the analysis of wrongdoing away from what has been done to the future person and toward the situation of the agent focuses on the agent’s reasons for making one choice rather than another. On this approach, whether the agent’s act wrongs the future person will depend on whether the agent is motivated by an appropriate level of concern for the needs and interests of (among others) the future person. Is the agent appropriately sensitive both to the degree of suffering that person can be expected to endure and to the various aspects of that person’s life that can be expected to render that life (on balance) worth living (Wasserman 2006, 146)? The parent may have a principled objection against pre-implantation genetic diagnosis but also have an appropriate level of concern for the child’s plight. In that case, the parent’s producing the impaired child in place of the better-off but nonidentical child does not wrong the impaired child. On the other hand, if a parent fails to undergo genetic testing out of laziness and never considers the challenges that the child will have to face as a result of being born impaired, then what the parent has done is wrong. Thus, on this view, the act’s permissibility is a function not of the expected good for the child in fact being counterbalanced by the expected bad but rather of the parent’s careful determination of whether it does or not (Wasserman 2006, 146–151). Choices by policymakers (in, e.g., the context of the depletion example) can be similarly evaluated. The parent’s and the policymaker’s roles may differ in respect of the future persons their choices will cause to exist but agents in both roles can plausibly be held to a role-appropriate standard of concern (Wasserman 2009).

4. Further challenges to the person-based intuition: “The Asymmetry”

Part of the reason the person-based intuition has been so attractive is its good fit with what Jeff McMahan calls the Asymmetry (McMahan 1981; 2009). According to the Asymmetry, it is wrong (and makes an outcome morally worse) to bring a miserable child – a child whose life is less than worth living – into existence but it is perfectly permissible (and does not make an outcome worse) to leave the happy child out of existence. While (arguably) leaving the happy child out of existence makes things worse for that child, the person-based intuition requires for wrongdoing not that things be made worse for a person who never exists but rather that things be made worse for a person who does or will exist.

Jan Narveson was an early advocate of both the person-based intuition and the Asymmetry. His defense of the Asymmetry, however, has been subject to close criticism by McMahan, Persson, Singer and Parfit. At this juncture, conceptual concerns about the Asymmetry have been just as important in leading philosophers to question the person-based intuition as the nonidentity problem has been.

The conceptual concerns arise when attempts are made to explain the Asymmetry by reference to principles that assign a special moral status to actual people (or people who will exist if the act under scrutiny is performed; or people who will exist independently of whether that act is performed) that they do not also assign to merely possible people (or to never existing people; or to people whose existence depends on that act being performed) (McMahan 1981; 2009; Persson 2009; Singer 2011, 114; Parfit 2011 vol. 2, 224–225).

An alternate defense of the Asymmetry avoids the claim that there is a critical distinction to be drawn between classes of persons (between, e.g., actual and merely possible persons, or between people who do or will exist at the world at which the act under scrutiny is performed and people who will never exist at that world). Instead, the alternate defense (Variabilism) distinguishes, for any given person p in any such class, between p’s being made worse off at a given world (compared to how well p fares at any alternate world) where p does or will exist and p’s being made worse off at one world (compared, again, to how well p fares at any alternate world) where p never exists. Variabilism then asserts that p’s being worse off at a world w has moral significance if and only if p does or will exist at w. In other words: even conceding that leaving the happy child out of existence makes that child worse off than that child might have been – even conceding, that is, that the happy child incurs a "loss" or sustains a "harm" when left out of existence – that loss, according to Variabilism, has no moral significance. It does not, that is, count against the choice to leave the happy child out of existence or in favor of the choice to bring that child into existence. After all, the happy child never exists at the world where that child incurs that loss. In contrast, bringing the miserable child into an existence that is less than worth having has full moral significance. It counts, that is, against the choice to bring that child into existence and in favor of the choice to leave that child out of existence. Why? Because the miserable child exists at the world where he or she incurs that loss (Roberts 2010, 2011a, 2011b).

The principle can be stated in terms of gains just as well--though preserving the Asymmetry, and indeed the intuition behind Variabilism itself, means that a mere substitution of the term "gain" for "loss" will not do the trick (indeed, it leads to an inconsistent position). Thus we must instead say that, according to Variabilism, p’s being made better off at any given world as compared against how well p fares at an alternate world w has moral significance if and only if p does or will exist at that alternate world w. Hence, as before: making the happy child better off by bringing that child into existence at a given world has no moral significance because that child never exists at that alternate world, while making the anguished child better off by leaving the anguished child out of existence at a given world has full moral significance because that child does exist (and suffer) at that alternate world.

Variabilism, in combination with other plausible claims, implies the Asymmetry, seems cogent and retains the good fit between the person-based intuition and the Asymmetry. But it remains controversial because it is considered itself to draw an improper asymmetry between gains and losses and because its account of why it is wrong to bring the miserable child (the child whose existence is less than worth having) into existence presumes that it is cogent to say that that child is better off never existing at all.


  • Adams, R.M., 1972. “Must God Create the Best?” The Philosophical Review, 81(3): 317–332.
  • Archard, D., 2004. “Wrongful Life,” Philosophy, 79(3): 403–420.
  • Archard, D. and D. Benatar, 2010. Procreation and Parenthood: The Ethics of Bearing and Rearing Children, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Arrhenius, G., 2009. “Can the Person-Affecting Restriction Solve the Problems in Population Ethics?” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 289–314.
  • Bayles, M. (ed.), 1976. Ethics and Population, Cambridge, MA: Schenkman.
  • Bayne, T. 2010. “In Defense of Genethical Parity,” in Archard and Benatar (eds.) 2010, pp. 31–56.
  • Benatar, D., 2006. Better Never to Have Been: The Harm of Coming into Existence, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2000. “The Wrong of Wrongful Life,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 37: 175–83.
  • Boonin, D., 2008. “How to Solve the Non-Identity Problem,” Public Affairs Quarterly, 22(2): 129–159.
  • Broome, J., 1992. Counting the Cost of Global Warming, Cambridge: The White Horse Press.
  • –––, 2004. Weighing Lives, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Buchanan, A., D. Brock, N. Daniels and D. Wikler, 2000. From Chance to Choice: Genetics and Justice, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Carter, A., 2001. “Can We Harm Future People?” Environmental Values, 10: 429–54.
  • Cohen, A. I., 2009. “Compensation for Historic Injustices: Completing the Boxill and Sher Argument,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 37(1): 81–102.
  • de-Shalit, A., 1995. Why Posterity Matters, London: Routledge.
  • Elliot, R., 1989. “The Rights of Future People,” Journal of Applied Philosophy, 6(2): 159–169.
  • –––, 1997. “Contingency, Community and Intergenerational Justice,” in N. Fotion and J. Heller (eds.), Contingent Future Persons, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 157–170.
  • Feinberg, J. 1988. “Wrongful Life and the Counterfactual Element in Harming,” Social Philosophy & Policy, 4(1): 144–178.
  • Feldman, F., 1995. “Justice, Desert, and the Repugnant Conclusion,” Utilitas, 7(2): 567–85.
  • Glover, J., 2006. Choosing Children: The Ethical Dilemmas of Genetic Intervention, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Gosseries, A., 2001. “What Do We Owe the Next Generation(s)?” Loyola of Los Angeles Law Review, 35(1): 293–354.
  • Hanser, M., 1990. “Harming Future People,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 19: 47–70.
  • –––, 2009. “Harming and Procreating,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 179–199.
  • Hare, C., 2007. “Voices from Another World: Must We Respect the Interests of People Who Do Not, and Will Never, Exist?” Ethics, 117: 498–523.
  • Harman, E., 2004. “Can We Harm and Benefit in Creating?” Philosophical Perspectives, 18: 89–113.
  • –––, 2009. “Harming as Causing Harm,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 137–154.
  • Herissone-Kelly, P., 2009. “Two Varieties of ‘Better-For’ Judgments,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 249–263.
  • Herstein, O.J., 2008. “Historic Injustice and the Non-Identity Problem: The Limitations of the Subsequent-Wrong Solution and Towards a New Solution,” Law and Philosophy, 27: 505–531.
  • Heyd, D., 1992. Genethics: Moral Issues in the Creation of People, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • –––, 2009. “The Intractability of the Nonidentity Problem,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 3–25.
  • Holtug, N., 2009. “Who Cares About Identity,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 71–92.
  • Kamm, F.M., 2002. “Genes, Justice, and Obligations to Future People,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 19: 350–88.
  • Kavka, G., 1981. “The Paradox of Future Individuals,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 11: 93–112.
  • Kumar, R., 2003. “Who Can Be Wronged?” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 31(2): 99–118.
  • Lillehammer, Hallvard, 2009. “Reproduction, Partiality, and the Non-Identity Problem,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.), pp. 231–248.
  • McMahan, J., 1981. “Problems of Population Choice,” Ethics, 92(1): 96–127.
  • –––, 2006. “Paradoxes of Abortion and Prenatal Injury,” Ethics, 116: 625–55.
  • –––, 2009. “Asymmetries in the Morality of Causing People to Exist,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 49–68.
  • Meyer, L., 2004. “Historical Injustice and the Right of Return,” Theoretical Inquiries in Law, 5(2): 305–316.
  • Mulgan, T., 2006. Future People: A Moderate Consequentialist Account of Our Obligations to Future Generations, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Narveson, J., 1976. “Moral Problems of Population,” in Bayles (ed.), pp. 59–80.
  • Parfit, D., 1976. “On Doing the Best for Our Children,” in Bayles (ed.), pp. 100–115.
  • –––, 1982. “Future Generations: Further Problems,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 11: 113–72.
  • –––, 1986. “Comments,” Ethics, 96: 854–62.
  • –––, 1987. Reasons and Persons, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • –––, 2011. On What Matters (volumes 1 and 2), Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Parsons, J., 2003. “Why the Handicapped Child Case Is Hard,” Philosophical Studies, 112: 147–162.
  • Persson, I., 2009. “Rights and the Asymmetry Between Creating Good and Bad Lives,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 29–47.
  • Peters, P., 2004. How Safe Is Safe Enough? Obligations to the Children of Reproductive Technology, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2009. “Implications of the Nonidentity Problem for State Regulation of Reproductive Liberty,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 317–331.
  • Rachels, S., 1998. “Is It Good to Make Happy People,” Bioethics, 12(2): 93–110.
  • Reiman, J., 2007. “Being Fair to Future People: The Non-Identity Problem in the Original Position,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 35(1): 71–92.
  • Rivera-Lopez, E., 2009. “Individual Procreative Responsibility and the Non-Identity Problem,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 90: 99–118.
  • Roberts, M., 1998. Child Versus Childmaker: Future Persons and Present Duties in Ethics and the Law, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield.
  • –––, 2002. “A New Way of Doing the Best That We Can: Person-Based Consequentialism and the Equality Problem,” Ethics, 112(2): 315–50.
  • –––, 2007. “The Nonidentity Fallacy: Harm, Probability and Another Look at Parfit’s Depletion Example,” Utilitas, 9: 267–311.
  • –––, 2008. “What is the Wrong of Wrongful Disability? From Chance to Choice to Harm to Persons,” Law and Philosophy, 28(1): 1–57.
  • –––, 2009. “The Nonidentity Problem and the Two Envelope Problem: When Is One Act Better for a Person than Another?” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 201–228.
  • –––, 2010. Abortion and the Moral Significance of Merely Possible People: Finding Middle Ground in Hard Cases, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • –––, 2011a. “The Asymmetry: A Solution,” Theoria, 77: 333–367.
  • –––, 2011b. “An Asymmetry in the Ethics of Procreation,” Philosophy Compass, 6(11): 765–776.
  • Roberts, M., and D. Wasserman (eds.), 2009. Harming Future Persons: Ethics, Genetics and the Nonidentity Problem, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Robertson, J. A., 1994. Children of Choice: Freedom and the New Reproductive Technologies, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 2004. “Procreative Liberty and Harm to Offspring in Assisted Reproduction,” American Journal of Law and Medicine, 30: 7–40.
  • Savulescu, J. 2001. “Procreative Beneficence: Why We Should Select the Best Children,” Bioethics, 15(5/6): –413.
  • Schwartz, T., 1978. “Obligations to Posterity,” in Obligations to Future Generations, R. Sikora and B. Barry (eds.), Philadelphia: Temple University Press, pp. 3–13.
  • Sher, G., 2005. “Transgenerational Compensation,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 33: 181–200.
  • Shiffrin, S., 1999. “Wrongful Life, Procreative Responsibility, and the Significance of Harm,” Legal Theory, 5: 117–48.
  • Sikora, R. and B. Barry (eds.), 1978. Obligations to Future Generations, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • Singer, P., 2011. Practical Ethics, 3rd ed. Cambridge University Press.
  • Smilansky, S., 2013. “Morally, Should We Prefer Never to Have Existed?” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, [available online].
  • Smolkin, D., 1999. “Toward a Rights-Based Solution to the Non-Identity Problem,” Journal of Social Philosophy, 30: 195–96.
  • Steinbock, B., 2009. “Wrongful Life and Procreative Decisions,” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 155–178.
  • –––, and R. McClamrock, 1994. “When Is Birth Unfair to the Child?” Hastings Center Report, 24: 15–21.
  • Temkin, L., 2012. Rethinking the Good: Moral Ideals and the Nature of Practical Reasoning, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Tooley, M., 1998. “Value, Obligation and the Asymmetry Question,” Bioethics, 12(2): 111–124.
  • Velleman, J. David, 2008. “Persons in Prospect,” Philosophy & Public Affairs, 36: 221–288.
  • Wasserman, D., 2005. “The Nonidentity Problem, Disability, and the Role Morality of Prospective Parents,” Ethics, 116: 132–52.
  • –––, 2008. “Hare on De Dicto Betterness and Prospective Parents,” Ethics, 118(3): 529–33.
  • –––, 2009. “Harms to Future People and Procreative Intentions,” in M. Roberts and d. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 265–285.
  • ––– and M. Roberts (eds.), 2009. Harming Future Persons: Ethics, Genetics and the Nonidentity Problem, Dordrecht: Springer.
  • Weinberg, R., 2008. “Identifying and Dissolving the Non-Identity Problem,” Philosophical Studies, 137(1): 3–18.
  • Wolf, C., 2009, “Do Future Persons Presently Have Alternative Possible Identities?” in M. Roberts and D. Wasserman (eds.) 2009, pp. 93–114.
  • Woodward, J., 1986. “The Non-Identity Problem,” Ethics, 96: 804–31.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2015 by
M. A. Roberts <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.