The Literal-Nonliteral Distinction in Classical Indian Philosophy

First published Sat Nov 26, 2016

Indian thinkers demarcate the boundaries between literal and non-literal meaning early in their history. They do so within different intellectual genres, each broadly philosophical, but with varying emphases. Within the grammatical genre, Yāska’s Semantic Explanation (Nirukta), an early (perhaps 6th century to 3rd century BCE) etymological treatise recognizes the difference between ordinary (laukika) and metaphorical language (upamā). This text, possibly pre-dating the renowned Sanskrit grammarian Pāṇini (ca 4th century BCE), employs etymological analysis in order to ascertain the meanings of unfamiliar terms used in the Vedas, a collection of texts including religious hymns, poetry, and rituals. In portions of the Vedas called Upaniṣads, widely recognized as proto-philosophical, the limits of language are made explicit: ordinary speech cannot characterize ultimate reality, though figurative language can hint at it. These early texts focus on topics which would give rise to three intellectual traditions: Grammar, Philosophy, and Aesthetics. (Capital letters distinguish the schools of thought from their subject matter.)

Two of the three textual traditions, Grammar and Philosophy, are identifiable by their relationship to early “root” texts which form the basis of later commentarial reflection. Within Grammar, the aforementioned Yāska, as well as Pāṇini, Patañjali (ca 2nd century CE), and Bhartṛhari (ca 5th century CE), are a few of the most crucial thinkers whose reflections—on the structure of Sanskrit in particular, and by way of Sanskrit, language in general—informed philosophical reflection on meaning. For instance, Pāṇini’s analysis of the morphology, syntax, and semantics of Sanskrit, in his Eight Chapters (Aṣṭādhyāyī) continues to be cited by philosophers a thousand years later. The literal/non-literal distinction is a topic as well for the various philosophical schools, each one known as a darśana, roughly a “viewpoint”. Both those who accept the Vedas as authoritative and those who do not address the distinction in the context of testimony and theories of reference. Among the former, Vedic-accepting thinkers, this article primarily treats the Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā philosophical traditions, and of the Veda-denying, the Buddhists and the Jainas. Finally, the tradition here called Aesthetics (alaṃkāra) is really focused more narrowly on the aesthetics of poetry and drama—especially the courtly poetry known as kāvya. It encompasses topics studied in rhetoric, poetics, and aesthetics within Western traditions. Alaṃkāra, despite meaning “embellishment” or “ornamentation”, (in reference to figures of speech), studies the psychology of utterances, their ensuing emotional states in audiences, and their logical or semantic structures. Until the highly influential Light on Suggestion (Dhvanyāloka) of Ānandavardhana (ca 9th century CE), aesthetic theory was primarily focused on taxonomies of figuration, but after Ānandavardhana, it drew on philosophical work, in particular Mīmāṃsā, to theorize about meaning itself.

What follows lays out the conceptual space for Indian theorizing about literal and non-literal meaning by way of each of these three textual traditions. Since the article’s structure is topical rather than historical, a chronology of major figures is appended to help orient readers. The focus of the article is the period demarcated roughly from 200 CE to 1300 CE, often characterized as the Classical Period of Indian philosophy.

1. Conceptions of language in Indian philosophy

Before delving into the various disputes in Indian philosophy over what is commonly termed “literal meaning”, let us first identify the cluster of concepts and corresponding terms Indian philosophers use in their analysis of meaning. The Sanskrit term for “meaning”, artha, has a semantic range that includes also “object”, “wealth”, and “goal”. It can be used both for external objects to which words refer as well as meanings “in the head”, although the term for occurrent mental states is frequently jñāna, usually translated as “cognition”. Both words and sentences are said to have meanings, although in what manner they have them, and how word- and sentence-meanings interrelate are subjects of debate.

1.1 Identifying Linguistic Capacities

Whether in the form of words or sentences, language has capacities—it can refer to things, cause mental cognitions, impel action, prompt emotional states, and so on. That such an ability exists is accepted by everyone, although thinkers enumerate the linguistic capacities differently, and also identify different results for them. In terms of outcomes, the meaning which results from the most fundamental linguistic capacity of the word is said to be its “primary” meaning (mukhya or abhidhā). This meaning is defined by Patañjali as the meaning which is understood first by hearers. (The extent to which the phenomenology of language comprehension guides distinctions about meaning will be addressed further below.) From the cognition that primary meaning causes, another linguistic capacity can subsequently operate, given certain conditions, to generate a new, secondary meaning. Secondary meaning is sometimes carved into two varieties: indication (lakṣaṇā) and qualitative expression (gauṇa-vṛtti), something like metonymy and metaphor respectively, although this is to generalize over distinctions important especially in Aesthetics. A third and fourth capacity are sometimes adduced: tātparya and dhvani, which we will examine more closely below. Initially, let us characterize the first as something like speaker’s intention and the second, usually translated as “suggestion”, as encompassing phenomena such as connotations and implicatures which the other capacities cannot explain.

Whatever the number of capacities, they can be characterized functionally; in fact, the term function (vyāpāra) or operation (vṛtti) is often used in place of the word for capacity more generally. In attempts to enumerate the capacities, philosophers consider questions such as what the basis of a linguistic function might be, and whether they are one-to-one or one-to-many functions (Ganeri 2006). Discussion of linguistic functions is important for understanding epistemology, a topic of interest primarily to Philosophy in contrast to Grammar and Aesthetics (see the entry on epistemology in classical Indian philosophy). These thinkers focus on how testimonial uses of language are valid means of knowledge, or pramāṇa, whether in ordinary discourse or religious discourse such as the Vedas or the Buddha’s speech. For one example, consider Nyāya (“Logic School”), established by Akṣapāda Gautama (ca 200 CE). In his Aphorisms on Logic (Nyāya-sūtra, hereafter NS), which is the Nyāya root text, he defines speech as being the assertion of an authoritative person (NS 1.1.17). He then goes on to discuss the relationship between primary and secondary meaning, and the basis for figurative language use. His aim is to determine what the referent of a noun is—a generic property, a particular thing, or some combination.

Aesthetic thinkers, especially beginning with Ānandavardhana, focus on distinctions between the capacities of language. Ānandavardhana himself is primarily concerned to defend the existence of a new linguistic capacity, suggestion (on which see section 3 below). With illustrations drawn from courtly poetry, he argues that phonemes, words, sentences, and entire discourse units can suggest subtle meanings, associated with an aestheticized emotion or “flavor” (rasa). It is up to later Aesthetic theorists to explain the status of suggestion with regard to the ordinary categories of linguistic capacities. Some, like Mukula Bhaṭṭa (ca 9th century CE) give a reductionist account on which it is equivalent to indication, whereas others, like Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka (ca 900 CE) deny that it is a linguistic capacity at all, but argue, rather, that it is psychological. Aesthetic arguments for and against the various linguistic capacities draw on philosophical texts from Nyāya as well as Mīmāṃsā, the philosophers primarily concerned with principles of Vedic exegesis.

1.2 Appeals to Phenomenology

Definitions of meaning often appeal to phenomenology, the way in which a cognition seems to arise from hearing a word or sentence. This focus on the psychology of language use is found in all three textual traditions of Grammar, Philosophy, and Aesthetics. For example, the Mīmāṃsā (“Hermeneutics”) philosopher Kumārila Bhaṭṭa (ca 7th century CE) writes in his Exposition on Ritual Practice (Tantra-vārttika, hereafter TV) that, like a baby’s face as it is being born, the primary meaning is perceived first, before anything else, such as secondary meaning (TV 3.2.1). (The Sanskrit word for a face is mukha, etymologically related to mukhya, the term for primary meaning.) The Grammarian Bhartṛhari argues in his Treatise on Sentences and Words (Vākya-padīya) that division of sentences into words and phonemes is artificial. This is in part based his observation that hearers understand meaning as a unified whole. He claims that what conveys meaning is a sphoṭa, or “burst”, which is partless and different from the sequence of sounds composing a sentence (although see section 4.3 and Matilal (1990: 84ff) for discussion about how precisely to characterize sphoṭa in relationship to meaning.)

Aesthetic theorists focused on the psychology of the poet and the hearer, in part to understand the relationship between ordinary language and poetic language, but also to distinguish among the varieties of poetic utterances. Among the psychological principles widely accepted by Indian thinkers is that ordinary conventional meanings are stronger than analytically-determined ones (Raja 1969). So the term paṅka-ja has constituent parts which together mean “mud-born” but conventionally refers to the lotus, and it is the latter meaning which would come to a hearer’s mind first. Aesthetic philosopher Mukula Bhaṭṭa (ca 9th century) argues in his Fundamentals of the Communicative Function (Abhidhā-vṛtti-mātṛkā) that some words become so conventionalized that their status as secondary meaning is unavailable to the speaker, who takes herself to be speaking literally (McCrea 2008).

However, there is a limit to the role that reflection on psychology plays in the analysis of meaning. For early Mīmāṃsā philosophers, only Sanskrit terms have genuine expressive capacities.This conclusion is not due to an investigation of the psychology of non-Sanskrit speakers, but the principle of parsimony. It is explanatorily better to posit a fundamental language, where word and meaning are fixed in one-to-one correspondence, which has been corrupted by mispronunciation over time (see TV 1.3.24ff). So, hearing a foreign word like gavi, people understand its meaning, “cow”, through its similarity with the correct Sanskrit word (gauḥ) whether or not they are aware of the process. This view is challenged by later philosophers.

1.3 Role of Sanskrit Language

Reflection on language in Indian philosophy, for the Brahminical, Veda-accepting traditions at least, begins and ends with the Sanskrit language, in what has been termed “the Sanskrit cosmopolis” (Pollock 2006). It is not merely that Sanskrit is the vehicle for reflection on language, but the Sanskrit language itself is a target of inquiry. Patañjali explains the reasons for this in his Great Commentary (Mahā-bhāṣya), a commentary on Kātyāyana’s 3rd century commentary on Pāṇini’s Eight Chapters. These reasons are largely centered on the preservation and correct performance of Vedic rituals. Along with these pragmatic aims, there comes the belief in a special metaphysical and epistemic status for Sanskrit—it has natural (autpattika, without beginning) connections to its referents, which other languages lack; thus, at least in the context of the Vedas, it can give us infallible knowledge about the world, without the corruption of fallible human intermediaries. This conception is not shared by all orthoprax thinkers, however, as Nyāya argues for the conventionality of language (NS 2.1.55).

Traditions which reject Vedic authority also reject the primacy of Sanskrit, largely preferring to write in Pāli. At a certain point, however, and for unknown reasons, Buddhist thinkers such as Nāgārjuna begin to write in Sanskrit (Kelly 1996). Regardless of which language they employ, Buddhists reject the notion of an inherent connection between the Sanskrit language and reality—indeed, they argue that no language has such a connection—arguing as early on as the famous The Questions of King Milinda (Milinda-pañhā) that language is conventional. The fact that Naiyāyikas and Buddhists agree on the conventional nature of language shows that the religious prominence of Sanskrit does not necessarily lead to specific philosophical commitments about its referential capacities. However, those who take on the assumption of an innate connection between Sanskrit word and referent then had explanatory burdens, such as how to explain linguistic innovation within Sanskrit and the referential capacities of non-Sanskrit languages.

Returning to the orthoprax traditions, we see that they make heavy use of semantic etymology, an approach to language going back as far as Yāska’s Nirukta. (This approach is also called “speculative etymology”, as in Plato’s Cratylus; see the entry on word meaning: classical traditions.) Such etymology was employed to understand Vedic words, not in terms of their actual linguistic history, but by the relationship between similar constituent parts. Names of gods are often explained in this manner: in one place, Indra is said to be “the kindler” (indha) since he kindles (indh), and in another, he is called “Indra” because “no one has withstood this power (idam indriyam) in him” (Bronkhorst 2001). Though semantic etymology has its roots in Vedic explication, this approach to word-meaning is central to later Alaṁkāra analysis of bitextuality or punning (śleṣa), discussed in section 2.3. Further, etymological meaning is one of the three commonly given varieties of word-meaning: conventional (rūḍhi), etymological (yoga), and etymological-and-conventional (yoga-rūḍhi).

2. Primary and Secondary Meaning

One of the most central distinctions in Indian philosophy of language is that between primary and secondary meaning. While this could be characterized as the distinction between “literal” and “non-literal” meaning, for some philosophers, word meanings that seem intuitively literal are classified as being secondary. For instance, the word “cow” in the sentence “A cow is to be led out to pasture” would, according to Mīmāṃsā philosophers following Kumārila (ca 660 CE, see entry on Kumārila), be taken as an instance of secondary meaning, for reasons discussed below. Further, since the literal/non-literal distinction in Western philosophy of language is vexed (see the distinction “literal/non-literal” in the entry on pragmatics), this entry henceforth avoids such terminology.

2.1 Lexical Meaning

Most classical Indian thinkers (the Buddhists being an important exception, see section 4.1) understand word meaning, or padârtha, to refer to objects in the world, and to do so directly. For these thinkers—the Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika, Mīmāṃsā—the referential function is primary. However, despite broad agreement about the basic referential function of words, they disagree about what its objects are. One such dispute, which has implications for the primary/secondary distinction, is over the relationship between words and universals. Kumārila, following Śabara, argues that the primary referent of words is a universal. Kumārila’s reasoning is that, without words denoting the universal property belonging to, for example, all cows, there would not be a permanent (nitya) relationship between word and referent. For if “cow” means a specific cow, Bessie, when Bessie goes out of existence, the word lacks denotation (ŚV). Further, the Vedic injunction, “A cow is to be tied up”, can be followed in numerous rituals—but if a specific cow were intended, it could be followed only once. (This argument is found in early Grammatical thought as well, see below.) Still, despite the fact that all Mīmāṃsakas accept the requirement of fixity of word and referent, they do not all accept the universal-denotation view. Some agree with another philosopher, roughly contemporaneous with Kumārila, Prabhākara (his followers are known as the “Prābhākara”, with the long “ā” equivalent to the English “-an” as in “Fregean”). They reject the universal-denotation view in connection with their view of sentence meaning (see section 5.1).

In contrast, in the Aphorisms, Gautama argues that words refer to universals, qualities, and individual things. He points out that universals are never instantiated without particular things, and so the universal itself cannot be the referent. Mīmāṃsā philosophers following Kumārila continue to defend and refine the universals-denotation view, just as Nyāya philosophers defend and refine the context-dependent view. Vātsyāyana, for example, in the Commentary on the Aphorisms on Logic (Nyāya-sūtra-bhāṣya, hereafter NySBh), argues for an epistemic point, that “It is not known which among these is the object or meaning of the word, or whether all of them might be meant” (NySBh ad 2.2.59; Dasti and Phillips, forthcoming). He takes on arguments from interlocutors who argue that only the individual or the universal is meant by words. Commenting on Gautama’s central point, Vātsyāyana observes that, to take the example of “cow” again, one never encounters a bare particular (individual). Rather, the individual cow, Bessie, is always found to be qualified by the universal. Ceteris paribis for universals, which do not exist apart from individuals. So it is not possible to disambiguate whether the universal or the particular is meant when we speak.

Grammarians also consider the question of word reference. Pāṇini takes at least a partial position on the question, claiming that if words only refer to particulars, then someone who ties up one cow for a sacrifice, in response to a Vedic command, would be in error if they, in a later ritual, tie up another cow, as the command could only refer to a single specific animal (Eight Chapters 1.2.64). After him, Patañjali, in the Great Commentary, refers to two earlier grammarians (whose work is not independently available), Vyāḍi and Vājapyāyana, who differ on this topic. Vyāḍi argues that words primarily refer to particulars and Vājapyāyana claims they refer to universals. Patañjali splits the difference, claiming that both aspects are part of word-meaning, but which one is primary may vary (see Deshpande 2003; VM; and Matilal 1971.) Matilal illustrates the moves in the debate with the example of a compound, “a brave-man” (Sanskrit: vīra-puruṣaḥ). Vājapyāyana would argue that if “brave” refers to the attribute of braveness, and “man” to the attribute of manhood, then these two referents can be related together in an underlying, unifying substratum (the sāmānâdhikaraṇya). But if his opponent, Vyāḍi, were correct, there would be no way to make sense of the compound, since both terms would refer to the same individual, and thus there would be repetition. However, by making use of the distinction between expressed meaning and the implied ground for the meaning, Vyāḍi could reply: yes, ‘brave’ strictly refers to a brave man, but this word is used because of the man’s braveness, whereas the other word is used because of the man’s being a man.

Whether the primary word-function results in a particular or universal, its aim is to form a basis for unhesitating action. Word meaning is treated in the context of epistemology and the topic of verbal testimony. The two sets of philosophers above, Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya, both agree that verbal testimony is a source of knowledge. However, for Nyāya philosophers, testimony carries justificatory weight because of the features of a speaker while Mīmāṃsā emphasizes the innate, though defeasible, justificatory nature of statements, regardless of speaker. While they believe that sentences (vākya) are truth-bearers, and not individual words, since sentences are composed of words, Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā focus on the invariable contributions of words to sentences—their primary meanings. This emphasis, we will see, is not shared by everyone, as the grammarian Bhartṛhari rejects any real distinction between words and sentences, arguing that such divisions are unreal and arbitrary, even if useful in some contexts.

2.2 Varieties of Secondary Meaning

The distinction between primary and secondary meaning is such that any kind of derivative meaning, whether it be metaphor, metonymy, irony, hyperbole, punning, etc., is classified as “secondary”. Again, we are in the realm of word-meanings, although there is discussion of sentence-level secondary meaning, primarily in Mīmāṃsā, Vedānta, and Alaṁkāra. While the task of precisely carving up varieties of secondary meaning was frequently left to the aesthetic theorists, philosophers also took an interest in this question. Many stock examples of secondary meaning are shared among the textual traditions, although it is not until much later, in the seventeenth century, that Indian linguistic analysis becomes robustly interdisciplinary. There are various ways to classify secondary meaning: it may be based on the logical relationship between primary and secondary meaning, on the semantic distance between them, or on the role of speaker intention.

For instance, Mukula Bhaṭṭa, the aforementioned Aesthetic theorist, distinguishes between secondary meaning that is qualitative and secondary meaning free from qualities. The qualitative includes cases which Western rhetoric would call “metaphorical”, such as “The person is an ox”, where the stubbornness of the person and the ox are understood to be shared qualities. In contrast, cases like “The village is on the Ganges” are free from qualities. Here, the word “bank” is understood so as to avoid the interpretation that the village is floating on the river itself—but there are no properties shared between the village and the Ganges (or the bank). In point of fact, this case becomes more complex after Ānandavardhana points out that the reason someone might utter this sentence is to suggest that the village and the Ganges do share qualities—the holiness of the Ganges river could be attributed to the village due to their proximity. Thus whether a speaker intends or does not intend a secondary meaning becomes relevant. Mukula argues that a speaker may intend different secondary meanings with the same utterance type. Finally, both the qualitative and quality-free varieties may differ in terms of how closely related the primary and secondary meanings are. Mukula describes highly conventional language use as cases of “absorption”—for instance, using the term “ruler” for to someone who is not from the ruling class (so not strictly a ruler), but who performs the functions a ruler does (such as protection of people). In contrast, metaphors such as “The person is an ox” are not absorption, but superimposition, since some difference is understood. (See Keating 2013 and McCrea 2008 for further discussion of Mukula and Ānandavardhana on these topics.)

All of these varieties of secondary meaning are necessitated by three conditions. First, there must be an obstacle in the primary meaning of the words. Second, there must some relationship—of which kind, more below—between the primary and secondary meaning. Third, there must be a warrant for the secondary meaning, such as a motivation on the speaker’s part or some accepted conventional sense. To take a stock example, “Feed the sticks”, the word “sticks” refers to something which is inanimate and which cannot be fed. Thus, the first condition is met—an obstacle to what is called “semantic fit” (yogyatā) which is necessary for a unified sentence. Second, there is a relationship of association between brāhmin priests and sticks—they carry walking sticks. Association is not the only possible relationship between primary and secondary meaning, but it is one, and it fulfills the second condition. Finally, a speaker using this phrase would be trading on a conventionalized use, and thus meets the third condition, of warrant.

While this three-fold set of conditions is commonly accepted, given different analyses of primary word-meaning, the boundary between primary and secondary meaning will be drawn differently. For instance, Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā, which understands the primary word-meaning as being a universal, find cases of secondary meaning more pervasive than the Nyāya, for whom word-meaning in the primary sense is more flexible. Given the command, “A cow is to be tied up”, the correct thing to do is to find some single cow to fasten to a post. However, Mīmāṃsā argues that the primary meaning of “cow” in the command is cowhood and cannot be fastened by means of a rope. Thus there is an obstacle to the semantic fit of the sentence. To resolve this difficulty, Kumārila invokes the secondary meaning function known as indication (lakṣaṇā). In TV 1.3.10, he argues that indication causes hearers to understand that an individual cow is meant. Hearers understand this from the knowledge that “cow” means cowhood, that individual cows are qualified by cowhood, and yet that the sentence is uttered for the purpose of fulfilling sacrificial aims. Thus the relationship between the primary and secondary meanings here is inherence (a universal inheres in an individual), and the speaker aims to pick out a particular cow.

One of the central categories of secondary meaning is those meanings which have similarities with the primary meaning. For instance, Kumārila takes qualitative expression (gauṇa-vṛtti), figures based on similarities, to be one of the two major types of secondary meaning, where indication (lakṣaṇā) is a catch-all category for figures based on any other kind of relationship. The figure of speech which Western rhetoric calls “metaphor” would fall under qualitative expression, although Indian thinkers generally focus on the logical structure underlying figures rather than a syntactic structure by which metaphor in the West is often characterized (Gerow 1971). Kumārila discusses the common example “Devadatta is a lion”, saying that when people hear the utterance, they find the word “lion” to be inexplicable as referring to Devadatta, and therefore conclude that the term must be used figuratively. However, while some thinkers would describe metaphors as involving a superimposition of lion on Devadatta, Kumārila explicitly rejects this analysis, saying that all that is meant is that there are similar properties that the two have, such as bravery. Otherwise, superimposition would mean there is confusion about the genuine difference between people and lions. One might object that the three examples just given: “Feed the sticks”, “A cow is to be tied up”, and “Devadatta is a lion” do not all have the same kind of obstacle. Philosophers and aesthetic theorists alike work to make the nature of this failure precise. While initially the emphasis is on the semantic connection within the sentence itself, for Nyāya and Mīmāṃsā both, by the time of Maṇḍana Miśra (ca seventh century CE) and Vācaspati Miśra (ca tenth century CE), the failure is taken to be wider, including problems with the larger context. In the ninth century work of Mukula Bhaṭṭa, such a widening is apparent as he distinguishes between multiple features of context which may require a word to be taken in a secondary sense: a speaker, sentence, time, place, and circumstance. Sometimes there is a clash between a speaker and a sentence meaning, as in the case taken from courtly love poetry—a common source of linguistic examples—where a young woman utters words, “I go alone to the forest along the riverbank” to a neighbor. She is to be understood as conveying the opposite (she is not going alone) to her neighbor, but intending her husband to overhear and believe she is telling the truth. Since we know facts through the poetic context about the woman’s personal life, Mukula argues that the sentence cannot be taken to mean the literal truth.

2.3 Bitextuality and Polysemy

An important phenomenon in Indian poetry, double meaning (śleṣa), garnered the attention of Alaṅkāra thinkers and, to a lesser extent, philosophers and grammarians. At its most basic level, the figure involves using a single word in two or more different senses. It is akin to what is described as “punning” in Western rhetoric, but without the connotation of triviality that often accompanies puns, hence the term “bitextuality” rather than “punning” (Bronner 2010). In fact, according to Rudraṭa, in his Ornaments of Poetry (Kāvyâlaṅkāra, ca 855 CE), bitextuality is the perfect figure of speech (Gerow 1977). The phenomenon in Sanskrit was not limited to a word or two, here and there, but entire compositions were written which admit of two different meanings. One of the most prominent examples is of poems which, read one way tell the story of the Rāmāyaṇa, and read another way, narrate the Mahābhārata. Examples are difficult to translate into English, since they rely on particularities of Sanskrit: word breaks which are frequently joined together, the ubiquity of compounds, and the fact of phonemic transformation at word-boundaries (sandhi) which can be reconstructed in multiple ways. For instance, dāsyasītyuktvā can be disambiguated as dāsy asīty uktvā (saying, “you are my slave”) or dāsyasīty uktvā (saying [to myself] “you will give!”) (Bronner 2010: xvii).

This particular linguistic device is not merely a figurative ornament, but is at the center of a major intellectual and literary movement. Lexicons are created containing stipulated meanings for syllables in order to assist in creating bitextual compositions and commentaries are written which tease out the multiplicities inherent in poems, whether or not they are intended by the author. Bronner (2010) identifies several ways in which the existence of bitextuality was a sticking point for theorists trying to give an account of word-meaning and the relationship between meaning and aesthetics. First, there is the difficulty of identifying a particular logical structure underpinning bitextuality. Second, there is the question of whether bitextuality’s effects are due to word-meaning or to the sounds of words. Finally, there is the problem of the psychology of bitextuality.

One reason that bitextuality resists easy classification is that the multiple “registers” (ways of reading the text), such as the story of the Rāmāyaṇa and the Mahābhārata mentioned above, are not merely two distinct sets of unrelated meanings. Rather, similes or metaphors frequently connect the readings. For instance, Dhanañjaya’s “Poem of Two Targets”, through setting the Rāmāyaṇa and the Mahābhārata “side-by-side” allows the reader to contrast the protagonists of the two epics (Bronner 2010: 110). Further, even where such relationships are not obvious, given the important principle that non-literal utterances must be supported by some warrant, whether conventional or due to speaker aims, most Sanskrit thinkers argued that no one would utter a sentence with two meanings that are unrelated. Mahima Bhaṭṭa (11th century CE), in his Analysis of “Manifestation” (Vyakti-viveka), argues that paranomasia, as a kind of meaning, must be coherent in the sense of having semantic fit, even if, as a kind of secondary meaning, there are cues which lead the reader to go beyond the strictly literal sense. However, unlike cases of metaphor, where there is an obstacle to semantic fit, as in “Devadatta is a lion”, bitextuality requires that there be (at least) two sets of coherent meanings which have semantic fit and also that there be a way to bring both meanings together. Further, since the trigger for bitextuality cannot be a failure of semantic fit, there must be some cue other than just the mere possibility of reading a sentence in two ways (McCrea 2008). Ānandavardhana, however, who comes two centuries before Mahima Bhaṭṭa, argues that there may be bitextual poems in which two sets of meanings do not cause a further metaphor or simile (Bronner 2010: 204; McCrea 2008: 434).

3. Suggested Meaning and Speaker’s Intention

During the ninth century CE, Ānandavardhana argues for a new linguistic capacity, suggestion (dhvani or vyañjanā), which he argues accounts for important phenomena not included within existing theories of secondary meaning. His proposal is elaborated on by his commentator, Abhinavagupta, who engages more explicitly with existing philosophical theories, and as a result of these two writers (authoring the Light on Suggestion and The Eye, respectively), a new debate opens . It is not much taken up in philosophical circles in the Classical period—the Nyāya philosopher Jayanta Bhaṭṭa (ca ninth century CE) has a stray remark disparaging suggestion in his Flower Garland of Logic (Nyāya-mañjarī) but with little development. The debate centers on whether the existing theories of language can account for the subtleties of meaning found in courtly poetry, kāvya. Those who agree that suggestion must be accepted discuss what kinds of suggested meaning ought to be adduced; those who reject suggestion generally try to show that for each putative category of suggested meaning, an equivalent explanation can be given, through existing explanations such as indication or inferential reasoning.

3.1 Insufficiency of Existing Capacities

Ānandavardhana proceeds by citing passages which are generally accepted to have various kinds of poetic effects, and then analyzing how these effects are attained by suggestion. He divides the content of what is suggested into implied meanings, implied figures, and aesthetic moods (rasa). He also distinguishes among varieties of suggested meaning according to other criteria such as the speaker’s intention, how rapidly the hearer recovers the suggested content, and whether expressions or phonemes are the basis for what is suggested. When suggestion is a way of conveying the rasa, the dominant aesthetic mood described or intimated within a poem, it is called rasa-dhvani. Ānandavardhana tries to give an account of when it is that suggestion causes poetic beauty, and argues that rasa is the proper aim of all poetry. It is important to mark that, for Ānandavardhana, rasa is found within the text, and not the reader. The reader simply comes to have a cognition of the text’s rasa. Thus it is easily understood as meaning, and not a reader’s emotional state. After Abhinavagupta’s commentary on Ānandavardhana, the emphasis shifts onto the reader’s emotive experience, and how to understand rasa in relation to other kinds of meaning becomes more difficult. Even though many things may be suggested (figures of speech, facts), the ultimate aim of dhvani or suggestion in the poetic context is to suggest rasa.

Take the case of “The village is on the Ganges”. Here, Ānandavardhana argues that suggestion operates after both primary and secondary meaning. What is suggested is the purity of the village which is on the bank of the holy Ganges river. Note, though, that he does not think that both primary and secondary meaning are always necessary for suggestion. For instance, the word “Ganges” itself could suggest purity without being in a metaphorical or otherwise figurative context (here, it is metonymical). Ānandavardhana also contrasts the function of suggestion with the primary meaning function. As for the latter, he says the relationship between the composition of words in a sentence and its primary meaning is a “natural relation”. The sense in which the word—referent relation is “natural” is that it is fixed. A word’s primary meaning is that meaning which is cognized in every single instance the word is employed. Suggestion, in contrast, is an “artificial relation” since it is a meaning that is not given by its natural word, and the relationship between suggested meaning and a suggestive word is not one—to—one.

On Ānandavardhana’s view, the suggested meaning is a further step beyond the secondary meaning, but is not necessarily understood through what is secondarily meant. For example, what is suggested in this case is understood through the primary meaning of “Ganges”, since it is the river and not the bank which is associated with purity and coolness. The crucial aspect of Ānandavardhana’s view is that while secondary meaning requires a failure of semantic fit, suggestion does not. A hearer’s understanding of “on the Ganges” as meaning “on the bank of the Ganges” is necessary in order for the sentence not to cause a cognition of a village as floating upon the Ganges. In contrast, the suggested sense does not rectify any apparent semantic incompatibility in the literal meaning of the sentence.

3.2 Varieties of Suggested Meaning

While one can present a definitive number of types of suggestion (Abhinavagupta says there are thirty-five), Ānandavardhana himself says there are an endless number of combinations if we take into account all of the facts involved in creating suggested meaning. Whether this should be taken literally or as a rhetorical flourish, the point is that Ānandavardhana does not view his analysis as a complete taxonomy of suggested meaning. In keeping with this spirit, only a few of the important divisions are discussed below.

Ānandavardhana subdivides suggestion in two ways based on two kinds of intentions a speaker has with regard to the expression she utters. This is consistent with his view that underlying all cases of suggestion there is a purpose (prayojana) the speaker has in choosing a particular expression. In particular, these intentions are defined in terms of the speaker’s attitude towards the primary meaning of an expression. First, a speaker may intend to convey the primary meaning plus some suggested meaning. Second, she may not intend to convey the primary meaning, but only have an intention to convey a suggested meaning.

As an example of the first type, Ānandavardhana cites love poetry written by the Buddhist philosopher Dharmakīrti (ca 6th to 7th century CE, see the entry on Dharmakīrti). The poem describes images of birds and fruit which are meant to be taken literally. However, these images are juxtaposed in a way which suggests an additional sense consistent with the romantic tone of the poem. There is no explicit comparison between the images, but the comparison is suggested. This kind of suggestion is something like the phenomenon in Ezra Pound’s famous imagist poem, “In a Station of a Metro”

The apparition of these faces in the crowd;
Petals on a wet, black bough. (Pound 1913)

The poet does not necessarily want the hearer to take the natural imagery as a metaphor but to see comparisons between the two images. Thus there is both primary and suggested meaning. Other times, Ānandavardhana says, the speaker intends only to convey a suggested meaning, so the primary meaning may be entirely replaced or set aside in some manner. For example, in this passage from the Rāmāyaṇa, the phrase “blinded” is not being used in a primary sense, but in a suggestive manner:

The sun has stolen our affection for the moon,
whose circle is now dull with frost
and like a mirror blinded by breath,
shines no more. (DL: 209)

Since a mirror cannot, strictly speaking, be made blind—breath merely fogs it—this is a case where suggestion is intended to replace the primary meaning.

While the previous categories are distinguished by the speaker’s aims, the next two categories are distinguished by the hearer’s experience. Ānandavardhana says that when hearers come to understand the suggested meaning of a poem, they can do so either instantaneously or else after a “reverberation”—some experienced temporal gap between recovering the literal meaning and recovering the suggested meaning. The suggested content characterized by reverberation is similar to what contemporary philosophers talk about in terms of the metaphorical “felt gap” between literal and metaphorical meanings in particular (e.g., Camp & Reimer 2008). However, it also includes the idea of a temporal gap between understanding the literal and suggested meaning. The phenomenological observation can, and should, be distinguished from a claim about content recovery. Ānandavardhana does not appeal to the phenomenology of suggested meanings as evidence that they are recovered in a certain way, though such a move was certainly available to him, as we have seen in section 1.2.

Ānandavardhana categorizes a case of bitextuality (śleṣa) as reverberation, as both meanings do not occur to the reader simultaneously. Further he describes this as a case where the sentence (rather than individual words) suggests a second meaning, which comes like a “reverberation” or some time after the first. This supports the idea that reverberation is about processing time, rather than (or in addition to) a felt tension. Elsewhere, Ānandavardhana points out that for many kinds of suggestion, hearers do not have a “reverberation” or awareness of a gap between the primary meaning and what is suggested. Abhinavagupta gives an analogy to explain cases where there is no such reverberation. He says that when someone has taken to heart the relationship between smoke and fire, she will be able to reason inferentially to the existence of fire simply on the perceptual basis of smoke. There need not be any awareness of inferential processes on the part of the thinker.

Ānandavardhana distinguishes in a number of other ways between varieties of suggestion. He identifies the basis of suggestion: word meanings, sentence meanings, discourse unit meanings, and even the sounds of individual phonemes can all give rise to suggested meaning. A poem’s entire “meaning”, that is, a comparison which may not be explicit in the poem, but is suggested throughout, can itself be the basis for a suggested rasa, such as love or heroism. At a more local level, individual phonemes within a poem may also suggest an aesthetic mood, through being sonorous or harsh, etc. These distinctions within suggested meaning underscore the need for caution in drawing equivalence between suggestion and Western pragmatic categories, such as implicature (see the entry on implicature) which is roughly analogous to, but not co-extensive with, Ānandavardhana’s dhvani.

3.3 Objections to Suggested Meaning

Although Ānandavardhana’s theory of suggested meaning was influential for many Aesthetic theorists in the years following his Light on Suggestion, not everyone accepted the new model. There were two ways of rejecting suggestion: reducing it to a non-linguistic capacity or reducing it to an already-existing linguistic capacity—primary or secondary meaning. The first strategy is followed, in different ways, by Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka and Mahima Bhaṭṭa, whereas the second is followed by Mukula Bhaṭṭa and members of the Prābhākara school of Mīmāṃsā.

In his Mirror of the Heart, Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka (ca. 900 CE) argues that Ānandavardhana is mistaken to think of rasa as something like linguistic meaning, and instead focuses on the emotional response of the reader (Pollock 2016). His argument is that rasa cannot be the kind of thing which is the meaning of a sentence—it is an experiential event which is caused by sentences. Drawing on Mīmāṃsā hermeneutics, which emphasize the way in which Vedic language causes hearers to follow injunctions, Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka proposes a multi-part process in which the primary meaning function operates in a normal manner, but subsequently there is what Pollock calls an “aesthetic text-event” that unifies the disparate parts of a poem through a generalizing power (bhāvakatva, De 1960 and Pollock 2016). The audience has the ability to enjoy (Pollock: “experientialize”) the result through a particular aesthetic capability (bhojakatva), and the result is a transcendent, rapturous experience of rasa.

Mahima Bhaṭṭa (ca. 1025 CE) does not consider rasa anything more than an emotion which has been stabilized into the object of a particular kind of aesthetic enjoyment. His Analysis of “Manifestation” argues that, since the characters in a poem are unreal, the emotions they are experiencing are also unreal, and must be inferred, or imputed to them. All of the talk of “manifesting” rasa is itself a figure of speech, on Mahima Bhaṭṭa’s view. In addition, he argues that any putative “secondary meaning” such as indication (lakṣaṇā) is also inferred. Primary meaning is evidence for an inference based on rules of pervasion (vyāpti) between the primary meaning and secondary or suggested meaning. This position is criticized by later thinkers, since the relationship between primary meaning and these other meanings do not easily admit of universalizable regularities, and they are often defeasible (see the entry on logic in classical Indian philosophy for discussion of inference).

Like Bhaṭṭa Nāyaka and Mahima Bhaṭṭa, Mukula Bhaṭṭa agrees with Ānandavardhana that there are poetic phenomena that require explanation. He argues that, rather than posit the third linguistic capacity of suggested meaning, we should take the existing category of secondary meaning, indication (lakṣaṇā), as an explanation. His Fundamentals of the Communicative Function, through analysis of many of the stock examples of suggestion in the Light on Suggestion, identifies the necessary features which trigger indication: an obstacle in the primary meaning, a relationship between the primary and indicated meaning, and a motive or conventional basis for the indicated meaning. Mukula argues that it is possible to have cases of indicated meaning which do not completely replace the primary meaning. Despite his careful delineation of the varieties of indicated meaning, and a monograph which draws on grammar, philosophy, and aesthetic theory, Mukula’s work is influential only insofar as later Aesthetic theorist Mammaṭa excerpts parts of it in his Illumination of Poetry (Kāvya-prakāśa) (McCrea 2008).

Rather than explain suggested meaning as part of secondary meaning, the Prābhākara school of Mīmāṃsā prefers to incorporate it into primary meaning. Their position, which is discussed in more detail below, criticizes the Bhāṭṭa distinction between primary and secondary meaning. On their view, word meanings do not—as per the Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā view—have a fixed primary meaning regardless of sentence context. Instead, the meaning of a word will vary depending on its relationship with other words in a given sentence. Thus a word can carry a putatively “suggested” meaning simply through force of context. Ānandavardhana himself criticizes this position, arguing that suggested meaning function has a different object, since it does not result directly from the word, but from the primary meaning of the word. For instance, the well-known case of “A village is on the Ganges” suggests the purity of the village—but this cannot be the primary meaning of the word “Ganges” even contextually. It is an additional meaning, conveyed subsequent to the ordinary meaning of “Ganges” (DL).

4. Criticizing the Distinction

Not all thinkers accept that there is a genuine difference between primary and secondary meaning. The rejection of this distinction happens in several different ways. First, and most radically, one might flatten the distinction to the point at which all language is equally “non-literal”, and reject the idea that there is a foundational stratus of meaning. This is the view of some Buddhists, although just how to cash out their linguistic skepticism is a significant question. Second, one might argue that while there is a pragmatic reason to distinguish between primary and secondary meaning, this distinction does not map onto any genuine facts about language or its relationship with the world. Loosely, this is the view of Grammarian Bhartṛhari, whose sphoṭa or “burst” theory argues that words are simply useful heuristics, but not real in any interesting sense. Finally, one might argue that word-meanings are highly context-dependent to the extent that it is not useful to think of a single “primary” meaning for a word. This is the position of Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā who do, however, make room for secondary meaning in a sense.

4.1 Buddhism

Buddhism and Jainism, two so-called “heteroprax” (Veda-rejecting) traditions in India, put forward analyses of language which challenge the notion of a distinction between primary and secondary meaning, at least as drawn in the orthoprax schools. Significant textual work—as well as secondary scholarship—remains to be done in the area of how both of these traditions (especially Jainism) understand language, but there are some clear themes.

Buddhist thinkers are broadly committed to error theories about ordinary language use. As noted already, early Buddhists, in texts such as The Questions of King Milinda (Milinda-pañhā), argue for a kind of conventionalism: language which seems to refer to persistent whole objects, such as chariots and persons, does not, as such objects are taken to lack true existence. Later philosophical reflection, such as in the Commentary on the Treasury of Dharma (Abhidharma-kośa-bhāṣya) of Vasubandhu (ca fourth to fifth century CE, see the entry on Vasubandhu), presents a kind of local fictionalism or reductionism, as the only truly existing things are atomic simples which exist momentarily. Thus, all language is, save for claims about ultimately real constituent parts, loose speech. Buddhist philosophy of language is famous for its “two truths” doctrine (see the entry on the theory of two truths in India), the notion that there is conventional truth and ultimate truth—but this gets cashed out variously among the later schools such as Yogacāra and Madhyamaka (see Siderits 2003 and Garfield 2006).

A commitment to the ubiquitous nature of non-literal speech is seen explicitly in Buddhist texts which pick up on the existing categories in Grammarian and Aesthetic thought, such as comparative superimposition or metaphor (upacāra), and employ them to undermine the orthoprax theories of language which were realist and referential in nature (Gold 2007 and Tzohar 2011). For instance, the Yogacāra Buddhist Sthiramati, in his Commentary on the Thirty Verses (Triṃśikā-bhāṣya) (ca sixth century CE), cites a common Grammarian definition of upacāra, noting that use of the term “self” and “things” is an instance of such figurative talk (Tzohar 2016). Not only is the self, when talked about in apparently ordinary ways, really being talked about indirectly, but this is so for all words which, on Sthiramati’s Yogācāra view, refer to an individual’s conscious experience of qualities, and not things in themselves. For Sthiramati, at least, there is a sense in which all language is “metaphorical”, though grounded in the conscious arising and perishing of experiential events, rather than a (putatively) objective external reality.

Another way in which this conventionalism plays out is in the development of the apoha theory of concepts, which has important implications for how language functions. The term ‘apoha’ means “exclusion” and is first presented in the work of fifth to sixth century CE philosopher Diṅnāga (see the entry on Dharmakīrti, and the discussion of the theory of apoha). The theory of exclusion is meant to explain how we can have conceptual connections (linguistic or otherwise) with the world even though, on the Buddhist view, reality is ultimately a series of unique, momentarily-existing, ineffable particulars. Without universals or qualities, the Buddhists have a difficulty explaining, how talk of a “blue lotus”, for instance, is possible. Their ingenious solution, much debated after Diṅnāga, is to propose that we carve up the world conceptually by negation. Blueness is not a universal, but the exclusion of all non-blue particular things—it is to be “not non-blue”. How this theory works in detail is the subject of Dharmakīrti’s work (ca sixth to seventh century CE) and a whole host of later thinkers, such as Ratnakīrti (ca eleventh century CE). The Aesthetic theorist Bhāmaha (ca sixth to seventh century CE) criticizes apoha in his Ornaments of Poetry (Kāvyâlaṅkāra), but not with regard to any distinction between primary and secondary meaning. Rather, he argues that the sense of a word is positive, and that on apoha, Buddhists are assigning two capacities to words—exclusion and positive designation—when there is only one (KB). Mīmāṃsā and Nyāya philosophers likewise criticize apoha extensively on these and similar grounds.

Another way in which Buddhist thought makes use of figurative language analysis is in its approach to hermeneutics, with regard to the interpretation of sūtra passages, not unlike the way in which Vedic hermeneutics both informs and is informed by Mīmāṃsā philosophical reflection on language. Buddhist hermeneutics, despite its being positioned “outside” of the orthopraxy, employs lists of figures which pre-date the rise of the textual tradition of Sanskrit poetics, in a way which demonstrates that there were links between the Grammarian, Nyāya, Mīmāṃsā, and Buddhist theories of meaning (Tzohar 2011). A crucial concept in Buddhist hermeneutics, which does utilize a distinction between literal and non-literal, is that of upāya or “skillful means”. With the assumption that the Buddha speaks both truthfully and with an eye towards the abilities of his particular audience, the notion of “skillful means” allowed Buddhist hermeneuticists to explain apparently contradictory elements within Buddhist texts. As with Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā, recourse to secondary meaning in the face of apparent contradiction, skillful means allowed for truth-preservation while constraining the interpretive process.

4.2 Jainism

Originating with Mahāvīra, who lives around the same time as Siddhārtha Gautama, the founder of Buddhism (sixth century BCE), Jainism is known for its emphasis on language’s representational limitations. This is because of their view that reality is multi-faceted (anekânta-vāda) and any single description will necessarily involve some apparent contradiction, due to the fact that it is incomplete (Balcerowicz 2001). Without relativization to a standpoint (naya), the sentences “o is P” and “o is not-P” are contradictory. To address this, Jainas propose that there are seven ways to characterize any purported fact, each one preceded by a marker of uncertainty, syāt. Any object o and its property P can be described as:

  1. o is P.
  2. o is not-P.
  3. o is both P and not-P.
  4. o is beyond words.
  5. o is beyond words and P.
  6. o is beyond words and not-P.
  7. o is beyond words and both P and not-P.

This seven-fold schema is found in many Jaina texts, from the early works of Kundakunda (3rd to 6th centuries) up to the to the important Flower Garland of Conditional Predication (Syād-vāda-mañjarī) of Malliṣeṇa (13th century CE). While some, like Priest (2008), have argued that this seven-fold classification scheme lends itself to a paraconsistent (and perhaps also dialethic) formalization, it need not be, as within the scheme, each of the seven standpoints follows the law of non-contradiction, though within a many-valued truth-system (Ganeri 2002; Schang 2013). The emphasis is, instead, upon relativizing the truth of an utterance to a particular context, in the sense that each standpoint restricts the context, as Balcerowicz notes, through indices such as space, time, convention, and so on (Balcerowicz 2001). (Balcerowicz also questions whether modern formalization is an eisegetical enterprise, reading into the text conceptions of axiomatization which were not present; see Balcerowicz 2015.) Minimally, according to Siddharṣigaṇi (ca tenth century CE), one must include in one’s analysis of any given utterance the speaker’s intention and the relevant linguistic connections (Clerbout, Gorisse, & Rahman 2011). The schema, further, is hierarchically ordered, so that each standpoint includes more indices than the prior, according to Malliṣeṇa (Balcerowicz 2001).

Emphasis on speaker’s intention is crucial for Jainas, especially insofar as they hold to a division between two standpoints: the ordinary standpoint (vyavahāra-naya) and the transcendent or ultimate standpoint (niścaya-naya, pāramârthika-naya). Ultimately speaking, language cannot be said to have any inherent communicative power, but rather has it due to the speaker’s authority and position as having unmediated access to the truth. In fact, the Jainas hold that scriptures containing the words of Mahāvīra are not efficacious due to the words themselves—a stark contrast to the Mīmāṃsā view of an unauthored Veda—but due to a unique suggestive power as well as the religious purity of the listener. As a result of these principles, any single utterance is susceptible to a number of different analyses. Flügel (2010) distinguishes between four kinds of analysis in Jaina thinking about language:

  1. Principles and criteria for religious speech
  2. General rules and clauses for language usage
  3. Context-sensitive rules for proper ways of speaking
  4. Examples considering social implications

The existence of normative criteria governing language use, aiming at the avoidance of harm (ahiṁsā) and the preservation of truth (satya) can be compared to Gricean conversational maxims, although the intentional flouting of these principles does not lead to conversational implicatures. In fact, Jaina doctrines discourage ambiguity and emphasize precise speech (Flügel 2010).

4.3 Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā

In their explanation of word-meaning, Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā emphasizes the relationship of words with one another in a token utterance. Śālikanātha (ca. 7th century CE), in his Monograph in Five Chapters (Prakaraṇa-pañcikā), argues that, to avoid multiplying denotative capacities for words in different contexts, one should posit the ability for words to denote meanings-in-relation. This position is called “denotation of what is related” (anvitâbhidhāna) and it is opposed to the Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā analysis given earlier. Central to Prābhākara arguments is the principle of parsimony. On the Bhāṭṭa view, there are multiple levels of meaning and a complex process of moving from a word to a word meaning to a unified sentence which connects those meanings. Prābhākara argues that it would be better to explain the connected word meaning as being understood directly from the word. The idea that the same operation is responsible for unifying the word meanings into a sentence anticipates, to a degree, Frege’s idea of word meanings as unsaturated entities, although Prābhākara is not thinking in the same ontological terms (see the discussion of semantic power and the reduction of semantic properties in the entry on analytic philosophy in the entry on early modern India, and Siderits 1991).

Prābhākara denies that the meaning of a “cow” is a universal and indication is necessary to shift to a particular cow. Śālikanātha argues that while it may be true that something the same is remembered in each case when someone says “cow”, this remnant of memory is not the same thing as a word meaning (PS: 381ff). Meaning has to do with the role that a word’s cognition plays within a sentence. Further, he argues that a word conveys the universal and the particular together, since the first cannot be understood without the second. So, while he agrees with the Bhāṭṭa that a series of universals cannot be connected together in a qualificative relationship, he concludes that this is a reason to reject the view that words primarily communicate generalities (sāmānya), arguing that they must communicate a qualified thing (viśeṣana).

However, Śālikanātha does leave room for the distinction between primary and secondary meaning in cases like “The village is on the Ganges” and “The boy is a lion”. He argues that where the ordinary meaning of words cannot form a connective relationship (anvaya) then there is recourse to secondary meaning. So in the case of words like “Ganges” and “lion”, the meaning—in—relation which is in connection with other word meanings is the secondary meaning, not the primary meaning. Still, Abhinavagupta, citing Prābhākara as an opponent of suggestion, characterizes their position as one on which there is no distinction between primary meaning, secondary meaning, or suggestion. He says that their view is that the meaning of the word is simply its final result (1.4b The Eye, DL). He points, however, out that the Prābhākara Mīmāṃsā must accept different kinds of statements in the Vedas for exegetical purposes—some more direct than others—and thus they should have no problem in principle allowing for suggested meaning.

Prābhākara emphasizes three concepts in their account of word and sentence meaning: expectancy (ākāṅkṣā), cognitive proximity (sannidhi), and semantic fittingness (yogyatā). Depending on the word’s role in a sentence, it will have different expectancies. This expectancy also varies depending on which word meanings are presented to the subject’s mind as candidates for connection—or which meanings have cognitive proximity (these may not be words which uttered in sequence, as a connected subject and verb may be separated by a dependent clause). Finally, the goal of a sentence is to convey something meaningful, so the word meanings in relation must work together semantically: a sentence such as “Sprinkle the garden with fire” would fail to have semantic fittingness. These three criteria determine what the meaning-in-relations are which result in a sentence. Secondary meaning is resorted to when there is no relation possible (anvayânupapatti), such as when the word “village” cannot be related to “on the Ganges”, since this expression would lack semantic fittingness. These three concepts are not restricted to Prābhākara, however, and are discussed and refined in various ways by nearly all of the intellectual traditions treating language.

4.4 Sphoṭa Theory

In his Treatise on Sentences and Words, the grammarian Bhartṛhari (ca. 450 CE) takes up the distinction between primary and secondary meaning in more detail than previous grammarians such as Pāṇini and Patañjali. His work is difficult—he is aware of, and engages with, Buddhist, Jaina, and Mīmāṃsā views of language, but not in a straightforward dialectical manner, as is the style of many other Indian thinkers. This causes controversy over his established views (for discussion of which see Cardona 1999). In terms of his position on the division between primary and secondary meaning, the debate centers on the implications of the sphoṭa-theory for the possibility of such a distinction.

In Bhartṛhari’s work, the term sphoṭa, meaning “burst”, refers to the indivisible nature of the utterance—it is a sound which carries meaning, and which cannot be subdivided into words or particular phonemes. (One might think here of Wittgenstein’s Philosophical Investigations, e.g., 1953 [2001]: 191, and the idea of grasping meaning in a “flash”—and indeed, this connection has been explored in Bhattacharyya 2002 and elsewhere.) On one prevailing understanding of sphoṭa, Bhartṛhari is committed to a kind of linguistic monism, which not only denies the divisibility of utterances into grammatical categories, but asserts the identity of speech and reality. Thus any apparent distinctions between categories—letters, words, semantic powers—are illusory. He uses common examples of illusion in Indian philosophy to underscore this point: from far away, a large tree may look like an elephant; at a glance, a rope may appear to be a snake. However, these are misperceptions, as are the putative semantic distinctions we make (Raja 1969).

Tzohar, drawing on Jan E.F. Houben’s translation of the “Exposition on (Semantic) Relationship” (Sambandha-samuddeśa) chapter of the Treatise, which treats figurative language extensively, argues that Bhartṛhari does distinguish between primary and secondary meaning, but on pragmatic grounds. Houben argues that Bhartṛhari is a linguistic perspectivist, in the sense that his concern is not to argue against any particular philosophical position, but to show the limits of formal analysis itself. On this view, when Bhartṛhari appeals to the analogy with perceptual illusion, it is merely to dismantle the commitment to a certain theory of reference: that which presupposes words refer to external reality. Secondary meaning is like misperceiving a rope as a snake only in the sense that there is superimposition in both cases. Looking at a rope, one superimposes similar snake-properties (long, coiled body) upon a rope (long, coiled shape). This is what happens when one says “The person is an ox”—the relevantly similar properties of an ox are superimposed on the person. Bhartṛhari emphasizes that it is because a snake and a rope have different effects (a rope does not move or hiss) that we come to realize there was misidentification. Likewise, in determining the primary meaning of a word, we look at whether the the state of affairs meets pragmatic expectations (does the man have horns and four legs?). Failure to meet these expectations indicates the use is secondary (Tzohar 2011).

On the first interpretation, Bhartṛhari is anticipating later Advaita Vedānta monism, on which empirical reality is illusory and Brahman, without having any genuine properties, is the basis for this illusion. His linguistic analysis, however, need not rely on these metaphysical assumptions in order to underscore the centrality of the sentence for meaning. Saying that grammatical categories and stable word-meanings are constructed (kalpita), based on theoretical needs, is to observe the priority of ordinary use and the role of context for actual communication. The second interpretation emphasizes the epistemic elements in theory-construction, preferring to understand the analogical argument from illusion as less concerned with error than the pragmatic grounds to our judgments. This approach leaves questions about how Bhartṛhari distinguishes between error and metaphor, however. Saying (metaphorically) “The person is an ox” and (mistakenly) “That rope is a snake” should not be equally figurative, even if on both utterances, our pragmatic expectations are flouted.

5. Implications of the Distinction

Different positions on the distinction between primary and secondary meaning have implications for related philosophical topics. In the realm of philosophy of language, theories of sentence meaning depend on how word meaning is understood. Within philosophy of religion, scriptural hermeneutics is also contingent upon approaches to meaning. Finally, there are normative implications for speaking and producing works of poetry, given the distinction.

5.1 Sentence Meaning

While much of the discussion about primary and secondary meaning is centered on words, there are significant implications for sentence meaning. Among those who accept the genuine compositionality of sentences, contra the sphoṭa theorists above, there are two theories of how words combine in context to convey a unified meaning which differ over the role of secondary meaning.

On the “connection of denoted meanings” view (abhihitânvāya) accepted by Bhāṭṭa Mīmāṃsā, words convey their meanings, and then, in conjunction with three conditions, these meanings are related together through secondary meaning (lakṣaṇā). The three conditions mentioned in section 4.3 are expectancy of connections (ākāṅkṣā), semantic fit (yogyatā), and cognitive contiguity (āsatti or sannidhi). Expectancy of connections is defined either syntactically or in terms of a hearer’s psychological state of desiring words to fit together. Semantic fit is the requirement that the sentence makes sense, prima facie, and contiguity is the requirement that words are uttered in a temporally adjacent sequence or that they are closely related in the hearer’s mind. The view that the meaning of a sentence is due to the secondary signification of words is not necessarily connected to Bhāṭṭa view that words denote universals, as Vācaspati, in his Drop of Truth (Tattva-bindu), defends this position despite elsewhere subscribing to Nyāya theories of meaning. Vācaspati argues explicitly that indication is responsible for the relationship (anvaya) between word-meanings and argues that it is commensurate with a Naiyāyika position (Sastri 2014; Phillips 2015).

In favor of this view, its defenders observe that there must be some common word-meaning among sentences such as “Bring the cow”, “See the cow”, “Bring the sheep”, and “See the sheep” in order for hearers to understand what is being communicated. What we learn as language-users, through trial and error and association of these various sentences with the world, is the invariable meaning of the words. Against this “connection of denoted meanings” view, Śālikanātha and other Prābhākara thinkers, as discussed earlier, argue that what is remembered on hearing an individual word does not constitute a genuine meaning without its being connected to the other words—emphasizing the inferential element of meaning. Their view, the “designation of meanings-as-connected” (anvitâbhidhāna), rejects the role of secondary meaning as a sentence-unifier.

Jayanta Bhaṭṭa, a Nyāya philosopher, takes up a third position, on which word-purport (tātparya) plays the unifying functional role. (This sense of tātparya is different from later uses of the term to mean speaker intention.) His theory of word-purport is accepted by Abhinavagupta who includes it in The Eye 1.4 among his list of functions (vṛtti-s) of language: the primary, secondary, word-purport, and suggestion. For both Jayanta and Abhinavagupta, the idea that the secondary meaning function is also responsible for sentential unity was unacceptable. Abhinavagupta summarizes the four capacities and their characteristics as

  1. Primary meaning (abhidhā) – conveys the individual word-meanings in their ordinary sense, according to convention
  2. Purport (tātparya) – conveys the entire sentence meaning which would not otherwise be intelligible
  3. Secondary meaning (lakṣaṇā) – along with factors like blocking the ordinary sense, conveys another meaning
  4. Suggestion (dhvani) – along with the hearer’s imaginative abilities, based on the first three powers, it suggests another meaning.

The crucial distinction between the “connection of denoted meanings” view and the two others is whether the secondary meaning function has a role to play before the sentence meaning is understood. Abhinavagupta explicitly says that it is not possible to have an obstacle for primary meaning without first understanding the syntactical connections among words. Thus secondary meaning can only occur after the capacity of purport. He distinguishes between nonsensical but syntactically acceptable sentences such as “There are a hundred elephants on the tip of my finger” and phrases which are syntactically faulty, “Ten pomegranates, six pancakes” (DL: 1.4b L, page 86).

Finally, Mukula Bhaṭṭa identifies a theory, most likely his own, which he calls “the combined view”. It takes secondary meaning to apply both before and after sentence meaning. His understanding of secondary meaning is broader than both Śālikanātha and Abhinavagupta, as it does not always replace the primary meaning. So it can play the role of purport and can also encompass the function of suggestion. Thus, where the division between primary and secondary meaning is made, and how secondary meaning is characterized has important consequences for all these views of sentence meaning.

5.2 Scriptural Hermeneutics

Primary and secondary meaning, and the boundaries between them, figured significantly in discussion over scriptural interpretation. The topic is implicated in general discussions about how to approach hermeneutics, in particular by Mīmāṃsā and Vedānta philosophers. Particular doctrinal or philosophical positions presented in, for example, the Upaniṣads or the Vedas, are subject to scrutiny based on whether they should be taken literally or not. The Mīmāṃsā system of hermeneutics, as Rajendran (2001) and McCrea (2008) have shown, subsequently comes to influence the analysis of poetic meaning.

While he is no Mīmāṃsaka (he is called a sarva-tantra-sva-tantra, someone for whom all systems are his own), even Vācaspati, in his Drop of Truth mentioned above, takes up the question of the impact of theories of secondary meaning on the interpretation of the Vedas. He is a proponent of the view that indication acts as “glue”, metaphorically speaking, and secures the relationship between word-meanings—but this might threaten the possibility that the Vedas convey meaning secondarily, since indication requires appeal to speaker intention to make sense. This, says his opponent, threatens Vedic authority. While Vācaspati’s initial dry remark is to say, well, so much for Vedic authority, he steps back by postulating that the ordinary use of elders (vrddha-vyavahāra) lets us understand, lacking a genuine person who authors the words. He thus preserves the principle that Vedic and ordinary language are cut from the same cloth, as both require indication for sentence meaning.

In the Thorough Investigation of Truth (Tattva-samīkṣā), a commentary on Maṇḍana Miśra’s The Demonstration of Brahman (Brahma-siddhi), Vācaspati argues for the truth of the Upaniṣadic claim of non-duality between self and reality, against an interlocutor who would interpret the Upaniṣads in a figurative manner. At stake is the role of language in relationship to other sources of knowledge. The opponent objects to the conflict between sense perception and the putatively ordinary meaning of the Upaniṣads, since this would entail that sense perception—which delivers knowledge of a world apart from the self—is flawed. They argue that, when such conflicts arise, perception should prevail, and a figurative meaning should be preferred. Vācaspati objects on a number of grounds, first noting that there must be a relationship between a primary and secondary meaning (one cannot simply leap to a secondary meaning when it is convenient). Then he appeals to the principle already described in detail—when it is not possible to interpret the ordinary meaning in a sensible manner, this is the impetus for secondary meaning. Conflict with other knowledge sources is not the catalyst for figurative interpretation (Vācaspatimiśra, VT: 29–32).

5.3 Normative Implications

In addition to contentful philosophical implications, the distinction between primary and secondary meaning has an impact on how philosophy is done. For instance, Gautama’s Aphorisms 1.2.10ff, in outlining the appropriate terms of philosophical debate, defines the flaw of casuistry (vimāṃsa) as misusing words to mislead one’s opponent. There are a number of types of casuistry, one of which is figurative. Vātsyāyana, in his commentary (NySBh 1.2.14), cites one of the stock examples of secondary meaning of the indicative type: “The stands are shouting”. Here, where the meaning is that people seated on wooden structures are shouting, it would be casuistry to reply, “No, the stands are not shouting, but the people are shouting”. This overly literal interlocutor pretends to misunderstand the speaker’s intention, and makes there to be conflict when there is none. Whether or not this kind of debate flaw is an importantly unique kind of casuistry (there is some discussion about this in the commentaries), Nyāya here emphasizes that verbal hair-splitting without charity towards one’s debate opponent constitutes a condemnable manner of intellectual speech (NS 1.2.2).

We have already seen in section 4.2 that Jainas emphasize careful speech using the ordinary, not figurative, meanings of words. Mīmāṃsā has a similar emphasis on correct speech, especially in the context of Vedic rituals. The utterances of mantras—parts of the Veda which accompany ritual practice—had to be performed precisely in order to guarantee the efficacy of the procedure (and mispronunciation in a ritual context was equal to sinful lying). Thus the study of grammatical rules was important, as these included pronunciation and modification of words to fit a new context (declining nouns into the plural, adjusting utterances to incorporate different deity names, and so forth). Further, grammar was a corrective to ordinary use, which is only an imperfect a guide to correct interpretation of Vedic words. Distinguishing between commands in the primary sense of words and figurative language exhortations was also crucial for Mīmāṃsā, since the proper interpretation of the latter was relevant for the performance of the ritual. For example, the exhortation, “The ritual patron is the grass-bedding” (TV 1.4.13) is a case of secondary meaning of the qualitative type (gauṇa-vṛtti), which praises the central role of the ritual patron. Kumārila observes that misunderstanding this meaning would lead to absurdity, since the grass-bedding (a woven mat of grass on which ritual implements are placed) is burned up—and taking the phrase literally would mean putting an early stop to the ritual process if the patron himself were burned!

Finally, Aesthetic theory interweaves normative implications throughout. Poetry is not merely for pleasure, but incorporates moral figures (one is instructed to be like Rāma, the hero of the Rāmāyaṇa, and not like Rāvana, the evil demon) and presupposes an entire moral structure. Abhinavagupta, in his independent works, takes up the theory of suggestion into the philosophy of Kashmir Śaivism, a tantric tradition which devotes itself to the deity Śiva. For Abhinavagupta, rasa is not merely an aesthetic phenomenon, but it is a profound sense of unity with transcendent reality, found in the rasa of peacefulness, śānti, which encompasses all others. Still, one need not go so far as Abhinavagupta’s work to see the normative dimension in Aesthetic theory, since even in Ānandavardhana’s more ordinary understanding of rasa, there are certain emotions which are appropriate to bring into existence, and others which ought to be avoided. What is appropriate is dependent on the character’s social position, gender, and so on. These norms also constrain the interpretive possibilities of suggested meaning, providing a conventional basis for the creative use of language.


See also the supplementary document on Names and Dates of Cited Indian Philosophers.

Primary Sanskrit Texts Cited

  • Ānandavardhana, [DL], The Dhvanyāloka of Ānandavardhana with the Locana of Abhinavagupta, Daniel H.H. Ingalls (trans.), Number 49 in Harvard Oriental Series, Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1990.
  • Bhāmaha, [KB], Kāvyālaṅkāra of Bhamaha, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, 1970
  • Bhartṛhari, Vākyapadīya (Series: Abhandlungen für die Kunde des Morgenlandes, XLII, 4), R. Wilhelm, Wiesbaden: Franz Steiner Verlag, 1977.
  • Gautama, [NS], Nyāya-sūtra, (with commentaries by Vātsyāyana, Uddyotakara, and Vācaspati Miśra). Nyāyadarśanam, A.M. Tarkatirtha, Taranatha Nyayatarkatirtha, and H.K. Tarkatirtha (eds), Calcutta Sanskrit Series 18. 1936–1944. Translated (with commentaries by Vātsyāyana and Uddyotakara) Ganganatha Jha, 1912–1919, 4 vols. Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Jayanta Bhaṭṭa, Nyāya-mañjarī, in Jayanta Bhaṭṭa’s Nyāya-Mañjarī: The Compendium of Indian Speculative Logic, Motilal Banarsidass, 1978.
  • Kumārila Bhaṭṭa, [ŚV], Ślokavārttikam of Kumārila Bhaṭṭa with the Commentary Nyāyaratnākara of Śrī Pārthasārathi Miśra, Ganganatha Jha (transl.), volume 1, 2, 3 of Chaukhamba Indological Studies. Delhi: Chaukhamba Sanskrit Pratishthan, 2009.
  • Mukula Bhaṭṭa, Abhidhāvṛttimātṛkā, K. Venugopalan (trans.), Journal of Indian Philosophy, 4(3–4): 203–264, 1977. doi:10.1007/BF00243194
  • Patañjali, [VM], Patañjali’s Vyākaraṇa-mahābhāṣya, University of Pune, Pune, 1968.
  • Śālikanātha, [PS], Prakaraṇapañcikā of Śālikanātha with an Exposition in English, New Delhi: Indian Council of Philosophical Research, 1934.
  • Vācaspatimiśra, [VT], Vācaspatimiśra’s Tattvasamīkṣā The Earliest Commentary on Maṇḍana Miśra’s Brahmasiddhi, Number 25 in Nepal Research Centre Publications. Stuttgart: Franz Steiner Verlag, 2006.

Secondary Literature Cited

  • Balcerowicz, Piotr, 2001, “The Logical structure of the Naya Method of the Jainas”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 29(3): 379–403. doi:10.1023/A:1017958207684
  • –––, 2015, “Do Attempts to Formalize the Syād-vāda make Sense?” in Peter Flügel and Ollle Qvarnstrüm (eds), Jaina Scriptures and Philosophy (Routledge Advances in Jaina Studies), Routledge.
  • Bhattacharyya, Sibajiban, 2002, Word and Sentence, Two Perspectives: Bhartrhari and Wittgenstein, New Haven: Sahitya Akademi.
  • Bronkhorst, Johannes, 2001, “Etymology and Magic: Yāska’s Nirukta, Plato’s Cratylus, and the Riddle of Semantic Etymologies”, Numen, 48(2): 147–203. doi:10.1163/156852701750152645
  • Bronner, Yigal, 2010, Extreme Poetry: The South Asian Movement of Simultaneous Narration, South Asia Across the Disciplines, New York: Columbia University Press,.
  • Camp, Elisabeth and Marga Reimer, 2008, “Showing, Telling and Seeing. Metaphor and ‘Poetic’ Language”, The Baltic International Yearbook of Cognition, Logic and Communication, 3: 1–24. doi:10.4148/biyclc.v3i0.20
  • Cardona, George, 1999, “Approaching the Vākyapadīya”, Journal of the American Oriental Society, 119 (1): 88–125. doi: 10.2307/605543
  • Clerbout, Nicolas, Marie-Hélène Gorisse, and Shaid Rahman, 2011, “Context-Sensitivity in Jain Philosophy: A Dialogical Study of Siddharṣigaṇi’s Commentary on the Handbook of Logic”, Journal of Philosophical Logic, 40(5): 633–662. doi:10.1007/s10992-010-9164-0
  • De, Sushil Kumar, 1960, History of Sanskrit Poetics, Firma K. L. Mukhopadhyay, Calcutta, 2nd edition.
  • Deshpande, Madhav, 2003, The Meaning of Nouns: Semantic Theory in Classical and Medieval India, Delhi: D.K. Printworld.
  • Flügel, Peter, 2010, “Power and Insight in Jain Discourse”, in Piotr Balcerowicz (ed.), Logic and Belief in Indian Philosophy, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass, pp. 79–209.
  • Ganeri, Jonardon, 2002, “Jaina Logic and the Philosophy Basis of Pluralism”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 23: 267–281. doi:10.1080/0144534021000051505
  • –––, 2006, Artha: Meaning, Number 2 in Foundations of Philosophy in India, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Garfield, Jay L., 2006, “Reductionism and Fictionalism: Comments on Siderits’s Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy”, APA Newsletter on Asian and Asian-American Philosophers and Philosophy, 6(1): 1–7.
  • Gerow, Edwin, 1971, A Glossary of Indian Figures of Speech, The Hague: Mouton & Co.
  • –––, 1977, Indian Poetics, Volume 5 of A History of Indian Literature, Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz.
  • Gold, Jonathan C., 2007, “Yogācāra Strategies against Realism: Appearances (ākṛti) and Metaphors (upacāra)”, Religion Compass, 1(1): 131–147. doi:10.1111/j.1749-8171.2006.00014.x
  • Keating, Malcolm, 2013, “Mukulabhaṭṭa’s Defense of Lakṣaṇā: How We Use Words to Mean Something Else, But Not Everything Else”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, 41(4): 439–461. doi:10.1007/s10781-013-9184-5
  • Kelly John D., 1996, “What was Sanskrit For? Metadiscursive Strategies in Ancient India”, in Jan E.M. Houben (ed.), Ideology and Status of Sanskrit: Contributions to the history of the Sanskrit language, Leiden: Brill, pp. 87–108.
  • Matilal, Bimal Krishna, 1971, Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis, Oxford: Oxford University Press. New edition in 2005, Jonardon Ganeri (ed.).
  • –––, 1990, The Word and the World, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • McCrea, Lawrence, 2008, The Teleology of Poetics in Medieval Kashmir, Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
  • Phillips, Stephen, 2015, “Seeing From the Other’s Point of View: Counter the Schismatic Interpretation of Vācaspati Miśra”, APA Newsletter on Asian and Asian-American Philosophers and Philosophy, 14(2): 4–8.
  • Dasti, Matthew, and S. Phillips, forthcoming, The Nyāya-Sūtra, Knowledge Sources, Hackett.
  • Pollock, Sheldon, 2006, The Language of the Gods in the World of Men: Sanskrit, Culture, and Power in Premodern India, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 2016, A Rasa Reader: Classical Indian Aesthetics, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Pound, Ezra, 1913, “In a Station of the Metro”, Poetry, April: 12.
  • Priest, Graham, 2008, “Jaina Logic: A Contemporary Perspective”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 29(3): 263–278. doi:10.1080/01445340701690233
  • Raja, K. Kunjunni, 1963, Indian Theories of Meaning (Series: The Adyar Library Series 91), Madras: Adyar Library and Research Centre.
  • Rajendran, C., 2001, “Influence of Pūrvamīmāṃsā on Alaṃkāraśāstra”, Adyar Library Bulletin, 65: 73–82.
  • Sastri, V.A. Ramaswami, 2014, “Tattva-bindu”, in Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies: Philosophy of Pūrva-Mīmāṃsā, Motilal Banarsidass, pp. 325–354.
  • Schang, Fabien, 2013, “A One-Valued Logic for Non-One-Sidedness”, International Journal of Jaina Studies, 9(4): 1–25.
  • Siderits, Mark, 1991, Indian Philosophy of Language, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.
  • –––, 2003 Personal Identity and Buddhist Philosophy: Empty Persons, Farnham, Surrey: Ashgate.
  • Tzohar, Roy, 2011, Metaphor (Upacāra) in Early Yogācāra Thought and Its Intellectual Context, Ph.d. dissertation, Columbia University.
  • –––, 2016, “Does Early Yogācāra Have a Theory of Meaning? Sthiramati’s Arguments on Metaphor in the Triṃśikā-bhāṣya”, Journal of Indian Philosophy, Online 4 May: 1– 22. doi:10.1007/s10781-016-9300-4
  • Wittgenstein, Ludwig, 1953 [2001], Philosophical Investigations, 3rd edition, Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.

Other Important Primary Works

  • Dharmakīrti, Pramāṇa-vārttika (with the commentary of Manorathanandin), D. Sastri (ed.), Varanasi: Bauddha Bharati, 1968.
  • Nāgārjuna, Vigraha-vyāvartaṇī in Jan Westerhoff, 2010, The Dispeller of Disputes: Nagarjuna’s Vigrahavyavartani, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rudraṭa, Kāvyâlaṅkāra, with the Ṭippaṇī of Namisādhu., Durgaprasad and Wasudev Laxman Sastri Pansikar (eds.), Bombay: Nirnaya Sagar Press, 1928.

Other Important Secondary Works

  • Chakrabarti, A. and Bimal Krishna Matilal (eds.), 1994, Knowing from Words: Western and Indian Philosophical Analysis of Understanding and Testimony, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Coward, Harold G. and K. Kunjunni Raja (eds.), 1990, The Philosophy of the Grammarians, Delhi: Motilal Banarsidass.
  • Scharf, Peter M., 1996, The Denotation of Generic Terms in Ancient Indian Philosophy: Grammar, Nyāya, and Mīmāṃsā, Transactions of the American Philosophical Society, American Philosophical Society, NS 86(3). doi:10.2307/1006608
  • Staal, Frits, 1969, “Sanskrit Philosophy of Language”, in Murray B. Emeneau and Charles A. Fergusson (eds), Linguistics in South Asia (Current Trends in Linguistics, Volume 5, Thomas A. Sebeok (series ed.)), The Hague: Mouton.
  • Taber, John A., forthcoming, “Mīmāṃsā and the Eternality of Language”, in Matthew Kapstein (ed.), The Columbia Guide to Classical Indian Philosophy, New York: Columbia University Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • Bibliography, from the Encyclopedia of Indian Philosophies, by Karl Potter (University of Washington).


The author wishes to thank Ben Blumson, Josh Dever, Jeremy Henkel, and Ethan Mills for their helpful comments on drafts of this article.

Copyright © 2016 by
Malcolm Keating <>

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