Liberalism in Latin America

First published Mon Feb 1, 2016

Liberalism was the dominant political discourse in Latin America during most of the nineteenth century. Initially, in the first half of the century, it was a discourse of liberation from colonial rule in Hispanic America. Later, in the second half, liberalism was firmly established as an ideology of nation building in most of the region. However, by the mid twentieth century, liberalism had mostly vanished from the political scene, except for the case of Colombia where the liberal party continued to be a live political option until the end of the century. Despite the fact that it became the dominant political discourse in the nineteenth century, there is no such thing as Latin American or Hispanic American “liberalism”, if by the latter we mean something like a unified and internally coherent political theory. Instead, what emerged in the nineteenth century was a political movement that can appropriately be called “liberal” to the extent that political actors either espoused liberal ideas or identified themselves as “liberals”, or both. Though such a political movement began to take shape in the aftermath of the wars of independence from Spain and Portugal, self-identification as a member of a liberal group became possible around the mid-century when the liberal position became more definite in relation to the conservative political opposition.

A difficulty for the reconstruction of liberalism in Latin America lies in the fact that political actors primarily employed liberal ideas in order to press for specific political ends but were not greatly concerned with systematic theorizing. Liberal intellectuals were public figures who engaged in the task of advocating liberal ideas in order to transform their new societies in light of them. They were mainly concerned with the practical tasks of constitutional design and institutional reform. Thus, the liberal movement emerged mainly in political and legal practice, not in theoretical works. Liberal intellectuals expressed and developed their views in the numerous constitutions that they produced, in legal commentary, and in the public debates that took place in pamphlets and newspapers. This may be the reason why the reconstruction of Latin American nineteenth century liberalism has been dominated by historians, while philosophers and political theorists have been mostly absent. Nevertheless, this reconstruction is also of philosophical interest for at least two reasons. First, the most prominent liberal intellectuals, such as Juan Bautista Alberdi in Argentina, José María Luis Mora in Mexico, and José Victorino Lastarria in Chile, did develop distinctive liberal positions that are worth examining. Alberdi and Lastarria, in particular, also produced theoretical works in which they systematized their own political convictions. Second, though it is not straightforward to identify what exactly was meant by “liberalism” in each region at each particular time since public intellectuals expressed a plurality of views, it is not difficult to see that distinctively liberal positions developed in response to local political problems. In the various regions of Latin America, liberalism developed in different directions according to the political problems that political actors considered most pressing. Since what was meant by “liberalism” turns out to be sometimes surprising from a contemporary perspective, the consideration of nineteenth century Latin American liberalism can contribute to enrich our current understanding of liberalism as a far more internally heterogeneous ideology than is usually assumed.

In light of the variety and complexity of Latin American liberal views, this entry provides only a brief and general introduction to the topic that is far from being the whole story. Since the heyday of Latin American liberalism took place in the nineteenth century, this entry privileges this historical period, though the last section focuses on the decline of liberalism in the twentieth century and its modest revival in recent decades. In order to adequately present the liberal political movement, it has been indispensable to provide the highlights of the social and political context that motivated the initial enthusiastic appropriation of liberal ideas as well as their further development. This entry also provides closer though brief approximations to the views developed by the most prominent liberal intellectuals mentioned earlier, namely, Alberdi, Mora, and Lastarria. Since they articulated their own views in quite different political contexts, their respective liberal views differ greatly from each other. Though the entry is organized thematically, it also roughly follows a chronological order. The first section offers a brief overview. The second section presents the influence of Spanish liberalism in the initial reception of liberal ideas around the time of the wars of independence in the early nineteenth century. The third section presents early Hispanic American liberalism as an emancipatory ideology that commanded wide acceptance among the elites. The fourth section considers the transition from the initial constitutional optimism to the search for alternative ways for bringing about the much desired social and political change. The fifth section focuses on the ideological conflict between liberals and conservatives around the mid-nineteenth century. It was in the midst of this conflict that the liberal faction acquired a specific political identity. The sixth section presents the liberal anticlerical response to the religious problem. The seventh section considers the influence of positivism and the triumph of liberalism as an ideology of nation building. The final section briefly considers the decline of liberalism in the early decades of the twentieth century.

1. An Overview

Liberal ideas first became widespread in Latin American due to the influence of the 1812 liberal Cadiz constitution which was in force in the Spanish empire for two years until the reestablishment of absolute rule. At the beginning of the century, “liberalism” in this context primarily meant what Spanish liberals meant by it in the debates that took place in the Cadiz Courts, which met as a sovereign national assembly in response to the Napoleonic invasion of the Iberian peninsula in 1808. It was in this setting that the term “liberal” was for the first time employed in a political sense to refer to a political group (Breña 2012). Since the Cadiz constitution was, in turn, heavily influenced by the political ideas of the French Revolution, the first liberal ideas in Latin America had likewise primarily this origin. Ideas such as popular sovereignty, civil equality, individual representation, the conventional nature of political authority, freedom of thought and of the press, and a division of powers that privileges the legislative became central to early Latin American liberalism. The latter was by no means identical to Spanish liberalism or to the political ideas of the French revolution, but these two are its main initial sources.

The crisis of the Spanish and Portuguese monarchies upon the Napoleonic invasion set off the process of independence in of most of Latin America and opened the way for the free circulation, for the first time, of modern political ideas in the region (the Spanish and Portuguese inquisitions had prohibited freedom of thought and of the press). Though the Cadiz constitution was influential in both Hispanic and Portuguese Americas, liberalism developed in quite different directions in these two regions. The reason for this lies in the two quite different ways in which the Spanish and Portuguese monarchies responded to the French invasion. While the flight of the Spanish king tossed the empire into a political crisis, the Portuguese were able to maintain political stability by transferring the capital of the empire to Brazil. Thus, questions about the source of legitimate political authority became pressing in Hispanic America, but were not as critical Brazil. Although the initial answers that Hispanic Americans offered were framed in terms of traditional scholastic political thinking, they soon began to appeal to the political ideas of the French revolution, specifically to the idea of popular sovereignty. According to the scholastic traditional view, sovereign authority rested on a pact between the king and its people, and in the absence of the king, sovereignty returned to the people. On this traditional view, the sovereign authority of the king was limited by natural, divine, and teleological (i.e., common good) considerations. The transition to the modern conception of unlimited and indivisible popular sovereignty marked a radical break in the political thinking in the Spanish colonies. Similarly new and revolutionary was the related conception of individual representation in a constituent assembly, as opposed to the traditional corporate representation before the king, to which the American subjects were never entitled.

The end result of this political process was the independence of all Hispanic America (with the exception of Cuba and Puerto Rico) within two decades of the Napoleonic invasion through armed revolt. Brazil, by contrast, obtained independence in the same period but without bloodshed when the Portuguese prince-regent proclaimed it. This difference in the sequence of political events accounts for the fact that the liberal ideology in Hispanic America was deeply committed to carrying out a radical break with the colonial past while a salient feature of Brazilian liberalism is the continuity of monarchical rule. While liberals in Hispanic American uniformly rejected monarchism and embraced a republican form of government, Brazilian liberalism remained monarchical until the closing decades of the century. The egalitarianism implicit in republicanism favored the abolition of slavery in the new republics. By mid-century slavery had been abolished in all of them. Brazilian liberals, by contrast, supported slavery, which was only abolished in 1888.

After having embraced the doctrine of popular sovereignty and the natural rights language of the French revolution, most liberals followed Benjamin Constant in his critique of the doctrine of popular sovereignty and his defense of a limited government. His writings in constitutionalism were closely followed in the design of Latin American constitutions, both liberal and conservative. Though French liberalism exerted the greatest influence overall, some Latin American liberals were also much influenced by British parliamentarism. Most of them also admired the North American republican experience. Montesquieu and Jeremy Bentham were, along with Constant, among the most cited European authors in the first half of the century (Safford 1987: 68). From Montesquieu, liberals took the idea of separation of powers and his critique of despotism. Though they did not adopt an explicitly utilitarian language, they admired and followed Bentham’s rationalistic approach to legislation (Jaramillo 2001: 120). In the mid-century, the political problem that came into focus and that gave liberals an identity against the conservative opposition was the religious one. The question was how to deal with a powerful Church that, in some regions, posed the most powerful internal challenge to the authority of the newly established republics. Liberals demanded freedom of religious worship and, in some cases, the separation of church and state. At this point in time, they had for the most part distanced themselves from the natural rights discourse and from contractualism in light of the criticisms by the British utilitarians (especially Bentham) and the French doctrinaires (Constant, Pierre Royer-Collard, and François Guizot). They turned their attention to the German historical school of law (Friedrich Karl von Savigny and his French follower Eugène Lerminier) and, above all, to Auguste Comte’s positivism, which became the most influential philosophical doctrine (Hale 1984) along with Herbert Spencer’s evolutionism. After decades of civil unrest, a doctrine that emphasized the maintenance of order in combination with progress appeared highly attractive. Liberalism had ceased to be an ideology in combat against an enemy, either foreign (Spain) or internal (the conservative political faction), and had become the triumphant ideology of national building (Hale 1984). In the closing decades of the century, positivism displaced liberalism in Brazil, while some Hispanic American liberals carried out a synthesis of liberal ideas and positivism that has often been considered the decline of liberalism.

In the early twentieth century, Hispanic American liberalism became the subject of strong criticisms. Critics argued that Hispanic American societies had not been successfully transformed according to liberal ideas because the former provided a hostile ground for the latter. On this view, liberalism was a foreign ideology that was not adequate for Hispanic American realities. This is a criticism against nineteenth century liberalism that has remained forceful to this date. By mid-twentieth century liberalism had been displaced by the emergence of alternative political movements and ideologies: socialist, Marxist, indigenous, agrarian, and populist. In the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries, liberalism has experienced a modest revival in political discourse in Latin America. This is manifest in the discourse that affirms the pluralism of forms of life and the demands for protection of the rights of minorities. In the sphere of academia, the works by English speaking liberal scholars, such as John Rawls, Ronald Dworkin, and Joseph Raz, have received much attention and have been amply discussed in academic publications. However, Latin American scholars have so far not related their current endorsement of recent Anglo-American liberalism to the nineteenth century Latin American liberal discourse (a notable exception is Gargarella 2010 & 2013). For the most part there is a sharp divide between current work by historians on nineteenth century Latin American liberalism, on the one hand, and systematic reflection by philosophers and political theorists on recent Anglo-American liberalism, on the other.

2. The Influence of Spanish Liberalism

In response to the French invasion in 1808, Spanish liberalism developed as an ideology of liberation against a foreign invader. This was the first powerful liberal movement in the Spanish empire and the very first serious questioning of absolute rule. In a society that had almost no experience in political representation, liberals sought to end despotic rule by replacing it with a parliamentary monarchy. They denied sovereign authority to the King and declared it to lie in the nation, which, in turn, was conceived of as having the faculty to make and remake its own fundamental laws. Traditionally, representation in the Courts was corporate (nobility, clergy and the municipalities), while liberals stood for individualistic representation. Against despotism, liberals also favored a division of powers and an independent judiciary. Spanish liberalism was a revolutionary ideology that marked a radical break with the monarchical status quo. Liberals sought to end a corporate society and to create an individualistic one by abolishing corporate privileges and immunities and by replacing them with legal equality and economic freedom. The liberal position was expressed in the 1812 Constitution.

The most important philosophical influence that shaped the liberal position was the political ideas of the French Revolution and, more specifically, the 1791 Constitution (Varela 1995). The 1812 Constitution exhibited the influence of Enlightenment rationalism, the rationalist natural rights discourse, and the political ideas of Montesquieu and Rousseau, to name the most salient referred to authors (Varela 1987). The liberal deputies embraced the idea of individual rights that were natural and inalienable. They also affirmed the natural equality of all men and the doctrine of national sovereignty. Following the French model, the Spanish constitution established a division of powers that privileged the legislative as the power that represented the nation. The constitution established a unicameral legislature in which there were no special provisions for the traditional preeminence of the clergy and the nobility. While the monarch, as the executive, was subordinate to the legislative, the judiciary was held to be independent, echoing Locke and Montesquieu (Varela 1983).

However, there are two crucial features that notably distinguish the Cadiz constitution from the French model. The former, by contrast with the latter, was grounded in an appeal to history and it exhibited the weight of Catholicism. As regards the first feature, the 1812 Constitution presented itself in its preamble as in continuity with fundamental old Spanish legislation that had allegedly been subverted by despotism. According to the traditional view, the authority of the monarch rested on a pact with its people from which pact followed the fundamental laws of the monarchy that the king had to observe. The liberal appeal to historical legitimacy was clearly at odds with the doctrine of national sovereignty according to which sovereign authority is unlimited—the ultimate source of authority. In fact, liberals introduced a conventional conception of political power that subverted the traditional scholastic one according to which political power was natural and historical. Nevertheless, the presentation of the Constitution as in continuity with fundamental legislation tempered the break with the past (Varela 1987).

As regards the second feature, the 1812 Constitution continued the imperial protection of the Catholic religion to the exclusion of all others despite the fact that it also ended some privileges and immunities that the Catholic Church had traditionally enjoyed. It has been argued, however, that religious intolerance was not a feature of Spanish liberalism, but a concession that liberals had to make to traditionalist political forces in the Courts (Varela 1987). Nevertheless, the religious language that pervades the constitutional text reveals the influence of Spanish scholasticism according to which there are exterior limits to sovereignty (natural, divine, historical, and teleological). This influence was even stronger in Spanish America since the intellectual elite around the time of independence had been educated in Spanish scholasticism. Religious toleration was a matter of bitter disputes even among Latin American liberals themselves and the religious language continued to be present in legal documents throughout the nineteenth century.

Early Latin American liberalism must be seen through the influence of the Spanish liberalism that developed in this political context, although the former’s two strands developed in different directions. While the Hispanic American strand was firmly committed to a radical break with the colonial past, the Brazilian one was marked by crucial points of continuity. Let us consider the Hispanic strand first. The mark of the Cadiz constitution was evident in most Hispanic American constitutions in the first half of the century (Safford 1987: 62). All of them claimed sovereign authority to lie in the people or the nation and protected some basic individual rights (such as freedom of thought and of the press) that were considered natural. They all maintained protection of the Catholic religion as the official one as well as most of the corporate privileges of the Catholic Church. They also established a separation of powers and departed from the Spanish model by creating bicameral systems. However, there are at least two important points of contrast between Spanish and Hispanic American liberals. The first one is that Hispanic American liberals could not buttress their constitutionalism with appeals to historical legitimacy. They could not present the constitutions that they produced in continuity with the fundamental medieval laws of the Spanish monarchy. Independence from Spain pushed, after three centuries of colonialism, to conceive of the liberal institutions as something completely new that lacked any historical precedent. By contrast with Spanish liberals who looked both to the future and to the past, the Hispanic American ones made a break with the past and looked only to the future where emancipation and progress lied. Liberal constitutions held the promise of a society fully transformed away from the colonial structures and in accordance with the protection of individual freedoms and legal equality. When Hispanic American liberalism emerged as the ideology of a political group in the mid-century, its identity was importantly centered in this forward looking attitude.

The second point of contrast is that Hispanic American liberalism was more radically egalitarian. Hispanic American liberals rejected a monarchical option and very early abolished slavery and noble titles. By mid-century slavery had been abolished in all independent countries. Hispanic American liberalism became synonymous with republican government, which meant a commitment to legal equality, representation, and the rejection of monarchism. After three centuries of despotic monarchical rule, Hispanic Americans associated monarchism with despotism. They feared that one-person rule, even when limited by a parliament, would inevitably become despotic—as it in fact happened in the short lived monarchy in Mexico right after independence. This egalitarianism, however, did not translate into the establishment of a rule of law that guaranteed equal legal treatment to all citizens. Nor did the egalitarian discourse translate into the democratic inclusion of all citizens in the exercise of political rights. Most Hispanic American liberals firmly believed in the need of property qualifications for voting and for running for public office. They were consistently skeptical about extending political rights to a population that they regarded as incapable for republican citizenship.

While early Hispanic American liberalism defined itself by its rejection of the colonial heritage, Brazilian liberalism, by contrast, acquired its identity in the internal confrontation with the advocates of monarchical absolutism. Brazilian liberals did not challenge monarchism. Instead, they sought to establish parliamentary limits to monarchical authority (Cyril 2012), thus favoring a representative monarchy. Though absolutists and liberals agreed on the need for a written constitution, the protection of some fundamental liberties (such as freedom of the press), and a legislative body that represented the nation, the differences between them turned on the extent and limits of the executive authority. Liberals sought to subordinate the king to the legislative authority, while absolutists pushed for the opposite balance of forces. Brazilian liberalism became strongly identified with economic freedom, whereas absolutists favored governmental intervention in the economy along the lines of the late eighteenth century reformist absolutism. While liberals wished to emulate North American federalism, absolutists were firmly committed to political centralism and, hence, to the political control of the entire nation by the monarch. Ironically, it was absolutists who sought to end slavery, whereas liberals were committed to its maintenance during most of the century.

3. Early Hispanic American Liberalism

The liberal discourse inherited from the French Revolution via the Cadiz constitution provided the language in which political actors demanded emancipation from colonial rule in the early nineteenth century. This is why liberalism, though a diffuse ideology with no clear contours, commanded the assent of many of those in favor of independence. The discourse of liberation appealed to the notion of popular sovereignty in order to justify emancipation from colonial rule (Palti 2007: ch. 2). Representation and legal equality were heartfelt demands in a region that had had no experience in political representation while a colony, except for the brief interval during which the Cadiz constitution was in force from 1812 through 1814 (Palti 2007: ch. 4). The natural rights to freedom of thought and of the press were considered fundamental after centuries of tight control by the Catholic inquisition, which had curtailed the free circulation of ideas. A republican form of government with a division of powers was considered an antidote against one-person despotic rule and a clear sign of emancipation from monarchical absolutism. Some of those who were later considered “conservatives”, such as Lucas Alamán in México, or “republicans”, such as Simón Bolívar in Venezuela, shared in this early liberal consensus. Both of them affirmed, at least initially, the core ideas of popular sovereignty, some natural rights, and a republican form of government with a division of powers. Conservative constitutions, such as the Chilean one from 1833, affirmed these core ideas as well. Liberal ideas thus provided a shared perspective in relation to which the various political positions that were to develop later defined themselves.

The philosophical sources of this early liberalism are quite diverse since public intellectuals referred to all sorts of authorities that could support their own positions. Though the list is long, the most widely referred to authors were Rousseau, Montesquieu, Constant, and Bentham (Safford 1987: 68). From Montesquieu they took the defense of a division of powers and the critique of despotism; from Rousseau the idea of popular sovereignty, the social contract, and the natural equality of men; from Constant the critique of popular sovereignty and the defense of a limited government; from Bentham the rationalistic approach to legislation. It should be noted, however, that the influence of these authorities was not limited to those who consistently subscribed to liberal views. Such an influence also extended across a political spectrum that acquired more definite contours in later decades. The echoes of Rousseau are apparent among those who advocated an egalitarian strand of liberalism that demanded equal political rights for all males, as in the 1814 Apatzingán Constitution in México, which was never in force. This constitution mentions the need for a virtuous citizenry, who, when in disagreement with specific laws, must submit to them as a “sacrifice of particular intelligence to the general will”. But Rousseau was also highly influential among those who defended clearly authoritarian forms of governance, such as Bolívar, who established a lifetime executive in the 1826 Bolivian Constitution. The same holds for Constant, who was an authority for liberal intellectuals, such as José María Luis Mora in Mexico, but also for some of those who designed “conservative” constitutions, such as the Mexican constitution of 1836. This indicates that intellectuals often drew from the same philosophical sources in order to develop political positions that were, in fact, quite different from each other.

At this early stage, Hispanic American partisans of liberal ideas usually did not call themselves “liberals”. Part of the reason for this is that in the early nineteenth century the political usage of the term was not yet well established in the region. The term “liberal” still carried with it its original moral meaning associated with noble qualities of generosity and magnanimity, which, in the Hispanic-Portuguese Catholic tradition, were virtues that the monarch had to have (Fernández Sebastián 2009: 703–4). In this moral sense, “liberal” was opposed to tyranny and despotism. From the perspective afforded by this widespread moral usage of the term, it became extremely difficult for Hispanic Americans political actors to identify themselves as “liberals” along the lines of Spanish liberalism. Although this may seem paradoxical, the reason is that the liberal Spanish Courts came to be seen as “illiberal” since they had grudgingly granted representation rights to as few American deputies as possible. This led some Hispanic American liberals to claim distance from Spanish liberalism despite the fact that the greatest impulse for the spread of liberal ideas in Latin America was the Cadiz constitution. According to their own self-perception, for instance, Colombian liberals owed nothing to the latter. It was only in the twentieth century that historians have demonstrated the inaccuracy of this self-conception (Martínez 2006).

The moral meaning of the term “liberal” provided a perspective from which Hispanic American liberals construed their vision of the Spanish monarchy as a paradigm of tyranny and despotism. From the point of view of liberal ideas, more broadly, they came to see the colonial past as an age of obscurantism, ignorance, and backwardness (Lastarria 1844; Samper 1861; for discussion see Collier 1967: ch. 5). This negative conception of the Spanish heritage became a constant feature of the Hispanic American liberal frame of mind. In light of their abhorrence of the colonial past, liberals insisted on the need to construe completely new political institutions and to instill a new political mentality in the population. They were also prone to blame the colonial heritage for the great difficulties that they faced in carrying out these purposes. To be sure, this dismissive attitude towards the colonial past was not exclusive of liberals since it was Bolívar who famously blamed the ills of Hispanic America on the colonial past. In his Jamaica Letter he claimed that, as a consequence of the colonial heritage, “institutions which are wholly representative are not suited to our character, customs, and present knowledge” (Bolívar 1815). As some conservatives often complained, the repudiation of the Spanish heritage prevented liberals from positively valuing aspects of their society that could help build stable political institutions, such as the unifying force of Catholicism.

In light of this view of the character and customs inherited from the colonial times, the liberal faith in the capacity of written constitutions to fully transform their societies away from the colonial structures and in the direction of progress went hand in hand with strong pessimism about the capacity of the majority of the people to live up to the demands of such institutions. Since the majority of the population shared the moral values of the colonial society and lacked even the basic skills of reading and writing, the elite judged them to be backward and ignorant. Most liberals indeed deemed the majority of the people to be unfit for republican citizenship. To be sure, the latter was a widely shared view among European liberals who also advocated a limited franchise. Most Hispanic American liberals endorsed the French doctrinaire’s argument that most of the population lacked the needed independence of judgment to exercise political rights either because of lack of instruction or because of their subservience to masters, or both, which was usually the case. A notable exception to this dominant view was the short lived liberal Colombian constitution of 1853 which granted universal male suffrage following the French example after the 1848 revolution (Bushnell 1993: 108). By contrast with their European counterparts, however, the Hispanic American liberals’ conviction about the political incapacity of the masses was compounded by their belief that the cultural practices inherited from colonial times were a formidable obstacle for the realization of liberal political ideas. This perception motivated the disenchanted conclusion that liberal institutions were not suitable for Hispanic American societies, as Bolívar put it, and as many other conservatives repeatedly complained against partisans of liberalism.

4. From Constitutional Optimism to Alternatives for Social Change

In the aftermath of independence, most Hispanic American nations produced written constitutions as early as 1811 in Venezuela, New Granada (former Colombia), and Chile. At the time, political actors shared the belief that a written code of law had the power to transform their societies in the direction of liberal ideas. They believed that good legislation was the way to promote individual liberties and economic progress. According to this, former subjects of a colonial regime would come to see themselves as the bearers of individual rights and liberties as soon as the latter were constitutionally protected. Likewise, on this optimistic view, economic progress would naturally develop as soon as individuals were granted the economic freedoms to work, to contract, and to accumulate wealth. This initial constitutionalism did indeed bring great changes with it: the constitutional protection of freedom of thought and of the press ended the traditional limits on the free circulation of printed materials and allowed for an explosion in the number of periodical publications in which people for the first time openly discussed political issues. Nevertheless, the liberal legislation also faced strong opposition by established social forces (such as the Catholic Church), the new republics were marked by great political instability (regimes were often overthrown), and economic progress did not materialize. By mid-century this initial constitutional optimism had waned and political actors looked for alternative solutions. The two most salient liberal proposed alternatives were quite different from each other. According to the first one, it was necessary to transform social practices first in order to prepare society for republican institutions. According to the second proposal, by contrast, it was necessary to go beyond constitutionalism and to engage the State in the task of social and economic reform. While the former alternative seeks to produce social transformation from below (in civil society), the latter deepens the strategy of producing social change from above (by the State). Juan Bautista Alberdi advocated the first kind of strategy as suitable for the specific situation of Argentina. In México, José María Luis Mora affirmed the second alternative (section 6).

Juan Bautista Alberdi (1810–1884) was a public intellectual, a legal theorist, and a diplomat. He laid the theoretical foundations for the Argentinian constitution of 1853, which is the most long lasting liberal constitution of the period. His proposal for constitutional reform in Bases and starting points for the political organization of the Argentine republic (Bases y puntos de partida para la organización política de la República Argentina, 1852) turns on two central ideas. The first one is that the South American republics should lower their aspirations: instead of a “true” democratic republic, they should aim for a “possible” one that would pave the way towards the former. The second idea is that for a true democratic republic to have any chance of success, society must be ready for it. On his view, the transformation of civil society must take place before granting political rights to the totality of the male adult population. Alberdi claimed that the much needed social transformation could take place through the interaction of the local population with northern European immigrants who would bring with them the habits of order, discipline, and industry that were necessary for economic progress and republican citizenship. Strongly influenced by the effects of massive immigration in California, Alberdi maintained that South America could become civilized through the transplantation of Northern European culture in American soil. Thus, his proposed solution was to promote massive immigration from northern Europe in a nation that was for the most part sparsely inhabited. Hence his famous claim that “to govern is to populate”.

Alberdi’s thinking was importantly influenced by the German historical school of law (Friedrich Karl von Savigny and his French follower Eugène Lerminier) that repudiated both natural law and the widely held idea that a society could be transformed on the basis of legislation that did not reflect its own state of civilization (Alberdi 1837). His distinction between a “possible” and a “true” republic is based on the idea that political organization must not be oriented by high and utopian ideals, but must be grounded in historical reality. In his view, law has to be adequate to the society that receives it. Since he also held that an examination of the situation of the South American republicans shows that they are not civilized enough to govern themselves through democratic institutions, he maintained that a possible republic should not grant equal political rights to all citizens. He favored a sort of government that was republican in form, but highly authoritarian in practice. This, he thought, was apt in light of what he considered the historical reality of Hispanic America. He famously referred approvingly to Bolívar’s dictum that “The new states of formerly Spanish America need kings with the name of president” (Alberdi 1852: 415). In the end, he favored a combination of federalism with political centralism: a certain degree of autonomy to the provinces combined with a strong executive, since, on his view, both federalism and centralism had important historical roots in South America.

According to Alberdi, the goals that should guide the political organization of a possible South American Republic must be responsive to the latter’s history and state of civilization, which establish the limits of political possibility. In his view, the most important goal of a possible republic is to educate the population for representative democracy. By “education” he meant the improvement of the local population’s level of civilization up to the level required for a true republic. He advocated two main means of civilization: the promotion of commerce and industry, on the one hand, and massive European immigration, on the other. Alberdi opposed the idea that the population could be made fit for democracy through formal schooling, as many other liberals indeed maintained. Domingo Sarmiento, the other dominant intellectual and political figure in Argentina at the time, favored formal schooling as the main means of civilization (Sarmiento 1849; Botana 1997). By contrast with Sarmiento, however, Alberdi held that the best means of moralization were industrious work and the constant interaction with people who already had the habits of order, discipline, and industry. In passages that evince the influence of Adam Smith, he maintained that social prosperity was not the work of governments, but a spontaneous result. He was completely skeptical about the possibility of civilizing the local population without the interaction with people who were already civilized. He summarily remarked that “whatever is not European in America is barbaric.”

Alberdi’s diagnosis about the best means for preparing the population for a true republic guides his recommendations for legislation. At the heart of his liberalism is his strong defense of free trade and industry. Such a defense was grounded on both economic and moral considerations: he regarded freedom of trade and industry as instrumental for material progress and for the improvement of the morals of the local population. Crucially, freedom of trade and industry was also indispensable in order to attract the desired sort of European immigrants. The protection of civil rights and liberties to everyone was part of his conception of a possible republic but also instrumental for promoting immigration. In particular, he favored religious toleration in order to attract non-Catholic Europeans. At the same time, however, he maintained that Catholicism should remain the official religion. On this point, he differed from most Hispanic American liberals who not only advocated the end of the official recognition of Catholicism but also, in some cases, a strict separation between Church and state. Again, Alberdi’s views were grounded on the realities of the Argentinian nation where the Catholic Church was relatively weak and did not pose a political threat to the republic in the making as it was the case in Mexico or New Granada.

5. Liberals, Conservatives, and the Religious Problem

What gave Latin American liberals and liberalism a clear identity around the mid-nineteenth century was their opposition to an adversary. In most of the region there emerged a “conservative” reaction against the dominant liberal tide. Though liberals and conservatives shared some political ground, they held opposing views regarding the pace of social change and the place of Catholicism and of the Catholic Church in society. Liberals and conservatives agreed on the need for a written constitution, the conventional nature of political authority, individual representation, and the separation of powers, among other ideas. By contrast with liberals, however, conservatives favored a strong and centralized rule that could maintain peace and political stability, opposed the full protection of freedom of the press, and also favored the maintenance of some of the privileges traditionally enjoyed by the Catholic Church. Liberals, on the other hand, advocated a more rapid pace of social change, the full protection of individual freedoms, which especially included freedom of worship and of the press, the dismantling of the privileges traditionally enjoyed by the Catholic Church, and most of the time, but not always, federalism. Though the difference between liberals and conservatives was often not clear cut, the only issue that consistently placed them at opposite sides was the religious one (Bushnell 1996: 288–289). This opposition was more or less salient depending on the power that the local Catholic Church enjoyed in each national context. The liberal identity was correspondingly less clearly defined in those places where the religious problem was less divisive, such as Chile or Argentina, where liberals rallied around the defense of individual liberties and some degree of federalism against authoritarian and centralist rule (Jaksic & Serrano 2011, Halperín 1988). In New Granada, where the church had deeper roots, the liberal identity centered on a combination of marked anti-clericalism with a defense of federalism against a conservative regime that was pro-clerical, authoritarian, and centralist. While the liberal forces of secularization had won out in most of the region by the end of the century, the confrontation between liberals and conservatives over the religious problem played out in Colombia until the end of the twentieth (Bushnell 1993).

The religious problem in Hispanic America was, in some regions, primarily about religious toleration, where the liberal position regarding religion centered on the demand to allow for religious worship. This was the case in Argentina where the local Catholic Church was relatively weak. In some other regions, such as Mexico or New Granada, where the church was much stronger, the religious problem was more complex insofar as the church was powerful enough to destabilize the new republican governments and to challenge their legitimacy. In the second half of the nineteenth century, the Catholic Church had condemned liberalism, secularism, freedom of thought and toleration, among other “evils” in Pope Pius IX’s Syllabus of Errors published in 1864. Where it had the power to do so, the church sought to mobilize the moral religious sensibilities of the majority of the population against the attempted liberal reforms. The church opposed civil equality in order to protect its own legal privileges and immunities, rejected the freedoms of thought and of the press as threats to religious morality and clerical authority, fought against economic reforms that endangered its position as the largest landowner and wealthiest corporation, favored a form of government that mirrored its own hierarchical structure (i.e., absolute monarchism), and sought to maintain official recognition and support by the state. The challenge posed by the church to the new liberal republics combined claims to political and economic power with the defense of morality and religion. In sum, the church opposed all aspects of liberal ideology in the name of the religion of the vast majority.

Though liberals and conservatives could agree on the need to protect freedom of religious worship, as sometimes they did, they held opposing views regarding the sorts of institutional supports, if any, that the State should provide the dominant Catholic Church. While liberals usually pushed for disestablishment, conservatives favored the opposite. Liberals favored the abolition of the church’s privileges and immunities in the name of legal equality, various degrees of exclusion of the church from official schooling, the establishment of a civil registry and civil matrimony, the possibility of divorce, and the secularization of hospitals and cemeteries. In the name of economic progress and freedom, liberals sometimes advocated the confiscation of all of the church’s property not directly related to religious worship in order to make it available for in the market. In places where the conflict with the church was most profound liberals pushed for the complete separation between church and state as well as the “neutrality” of the state in religious matters. The latter meant that the state should not explicitly favor or disfavor religion as such. This liberal position, though clearly anti-clerical, did not necessarily entail hostility to religion. Though some liberals undoubtedly held anti-Catholic sentiments, the attack against the church was political insofar as it aimed to place the latter under the authority of the state. Conservatives, in turn, defended the privileges traditionally enjoyed by the church, which included establishment and the church’s alleged duty to spread religious morality through official schooling. They also opposed the confiscation of the church’s property. Though some conservatives favored the church from authentic conviction (such as Miguel Antonio Caro in New Granada, the most prominent conservative intellectual there), many of them did so from instrumental considerations. Conservatives did not wish to antagonize what could be a useful ally in the maintenance of order. This pragmatic view was Diego Portales’, the architect of Chilean political stability (Collier 2003), and also Lucas Alamán’s, who famously referred to Catholicism as “the only link that binds all Mexicans when all others have been broken” (Safford 1987: 100). In the long run, those regimes that contemporized with the church indeed proved to be more stable than the liberal ones that antagonized it.

6. Liberal Anti-Clericalism

The place where the confrontation between liberals and conservatives over the religious problem was most violent was Mexico, where the colonial church had been the most powerful. The first confrontation with the church took place in 1833, but the decisive blow to the church came with the “Reform Laws” in 1855–1863, which, among other measures, nationalized most of its property and established a separation between church and State. The political challenge that the church posed to the liberal regimes pushed some Mexican liberals to move beyond their constitutionalism and to advocate the need for social and economic reform. This was the case of José María Luis Mora (1794–1850), the most prominent Mexican liberal and whose liberal identity came to be centered on his anti-clericalism. He was a historian, politician, legislator, and a priest. His liberalism was strongly influenced by his admiration of the 1812 Cadiz constitution, the writings of Montesquieu and Constant, and by the course of political events that led him to assume anticlerical views. Mora began his career as a liberal intellectual as a partisan of constitutionalism. A constant theme in his writings is the defense of the “absolute” liberty of opinion and the criticism of any limits to freedom of the press. He argued that it is impossible to limit the freedom to think and to have opinions since men cannot divest themselves from their opinions through external force. Thus, he claimed, it is neither just nor convenient to prevent them from expressing their thoughts. The crucial point for public order, in his view, is that men observe the law regardless of the opinions that they may hold. He maintained that no principle of justice can ground the prohibition of doctrines considered false since men are fallible and the best or only means for arriving at knowledge of the truth is to subject doctrines to examination in a free discussion. The amendment of wrong opinions cannot be attained through prohibition but through the free circulation of ideas (Mora 1837: 491–5). Following Montesquieu, Mora placed great emphasis on the security of the person and affirmed the conception of civil freedom as the faculty of doing everything that the law does not expressly prohibit (Mora 1837: 504–6).

As an admirer of the Cadiz constitution, Mora espoused the idea of popular sovereignty but, following Constant, claimed that the latter was not unlimited. In his engagement with Rousseau, Constant had affirmed the notion of the general will as the source of legitimate political authority, but had denied the unlimited authority of society over the individual. According to Constant, individual rights are the limits that the political authority must not trespass. Mora warned that any unlimited authority was essentially tyrannical and, following Montesquieu, characterized despotism as the lawless, absolute, and unlimited use of political power regardless of the hands in which it falls and the particular form of government that it takes (Mora 1837: 475). According to Mora, individual rights and liberties limit the exercise of political power lest it become despotic. As was conventional wisdom in nineteenth century French liberalism, Mora argued for a franchise limited to proprietors who, in his view, were the only members of society capable of exerting an independent judgment, of displaying true civic virtues, and of caring for the public good (Mora 1837: 633–4). At the same time, however, he strove for the improvement of “the moral condition of popular classes” through various forms of education. However, Mora departed from the conventional wisdom of nineteenth century French liberalism in various ways. First, he rejected monarchism, continued to regard individual rights as natural, and subscribed to the doctrine of the social contract. He held that men’s purpose in establishing society is the preservation of their “liberty, security, equality and properties” (Mora 1837: 475). Second, Mora explicitly rejected Constant’s defense of a “conservative power”, which was one of the latter’s most popular conceptions in Hispanic America, though not among liberals (Mora 1837: 681). Constant had conceived of the constitutional monarch as neutral power that could moderate conflicts among the executive, the legislative, and the judicial branches.

The third way in which Mora departed from French liberalism was his anticlericalism, which was motivated by local political events. Despite his admiration for the 1812 Cadiz constitution, Mora criticized the fact that it did not abolish the special privileges enjoyed by the military and the church. With respect to the latter in particular, Mora reacted against the church’s opposition to the establishment of republican values and came to regard it as a power capable of destabilizing the republic, to subvert its laws, and to turn the mass of the population against it (Mora 1837: 66). He regarded the church as having a esprit des corps that was opposed to both the national spirit and the representative system insofar as the church sought to maintain special privileges and immunities that were contrary to civil equality. He emphasized the church’s refusal to submit to civil and criminal law, its opposition to freedom of worship as well as to freedom of thought and of the press. In his view, the church opposed these freedoms because their exercise threatened the former’s rule over consciences. In the same vein, Mora regarded the church as an obstacle to public education insofar as education was instrumental to the masses’ emancipation from priestly power (Mora 1837: 63). He also considered the church as an obstacle to colonization of scarcely populated territories in virtue of its opposition to freedom of worship. He even criticized the clergy’s celibacy, which, on his view, isolates its members from society insofar as family ties are the “primary link that binds men to society” (Mora 1837: 61). Mora advocated the confiscation of the church’s property on the grounds that the clergy was not a productive class and lacked an inclination to industrious work. In Mexico, the church was indeed the wealthiest financial agent and the largest single proprietor in the nineteenth century until most of its property was nationalized in 1859.

Despite his multifaceted condemnation of the church, Mora’s anticlericalism did not entail hostility to religion. He held that the church should be free to devote itself to its spiritual mission since “religious beliefs and principles of conscience are man’s most sacred property considered as an individual” (Mora 1837: 74). His concern was to argue for the separation between the religious and the political “principles.” He maintained that the church should have no share in the exercise of political power, nor should it have any power to coerce citizens either in the form of forced economic contributions or punishments that are not solely spiritual. He warned that the religious principle degenerates when it is not kept separate from the political one. By contrast with the Argentinian Alberdi, who did not have to deal with a comparatively powerful Catholic Church, Mora advocated a strong reformist state capable of curbing the opposition to liberal values by established social powers. According to Mora, a reformist state had to create the conditions for citizen’s freedom and equality. This was a position that was contrary to Alberdi’s commitment to classical liberalism.

7. The Influence of Positivism

In the closing decades of the nineteenth century, there took place a fusion of liberalism with positivism in some parts of Latin America. “Positivism” was the name for a scientific approach to the solution of social and political problems that was based on experience and observation. As developed by Auguste Comte in his Course of Positive Philosophy, positivism claimed that it was possible to uncover the laws of social phenomena and to organize society according to them. Comte’s thesis that it was possible to combine liberty with order and progress exerted great influence in Latin America along with Herbert Spencer’s evolutionism. While some liberals, such as Victorino Lastarria in Chile, sought to reconcile individual freedom with positivist philosophy, some others, such as Justo Sierra in México, frankly subordinated individual liberty to the maintenance of social order. Comtean philosophy was most influential in the field of higher education, where social reformers introduced new curricula that privileged the study of the empirical sciences. Such innovations were intended for the education of the elites. Educators believed, following Comte, that the key to bringing about the end of social disorder was mental order: education was instrumental to ending mental anarchy by emancipating individuals from prejudice and introducing them to “a common reservoir of truths” (Zea 1968: 125). At the same time, Hispanic American educators inspired by Comte shunned his religion of humanity. The latter had the greatest impact in Brazil, where positivism displaced liberalism.

José Victorino Lastarria (1817–1888) was the most prominent Chilean liberal in the nineteenth century. He was a public intellectual, a central literary figure, and a politician. In addition to Comte’s writings, his thinking was importantly influenced by John Stuart Mill’s rendering of positivist philosophy in his Auguste Comte and Positivism, and by Émile Littré, who popularized Comte’s positivism. Lastarria’s most important theoretical work is Lessons in Positivist Politics (Lecciones de política positiva) published in 1875. The influence of positivism is manifest in this work. By contrast with Comte, however, Lastarria was a thorough individualist who extolled the perfection of the individual and the value of individual liberty. He refused to subordinate individual liberty to social order and maintained throughout his political writings that society should protect the full exercise of individual liberty. The central idea that Lastarria took from Comte is the thesis that modern societies need to be guided by experience and scientific observation. According to this, politics must be an experimental science based on experience and observation, which are the only solid basis for social organization. Following Comte, Lastarria maintained that it is possible to comprehend society’s progressive movement by uncovering the laws that govern social phenomena. On his view, in order to examine a particular form of social organization, it is necessary first to determine the laws that govern humanity’s progress. The most fundamental law that Lastarria identifies and that, according to him, impulses humanity forward, is “moral liberty”: the tendency to augment and develop all of our faculties (Lecciones, 3rd Lesson). Social progress, on his view, is a product of this development. This is a perfectionist conception of the human person according to which perfection is not only an individual end but also the most important social end.

Lastarria conceived of his own epoch as one of painful transition towards the triumph of liberty. Following Comte, he subscribed to the view that society progresses through three stages: theological, metaphysical, and positive. At the theological stage, society is subject to the authority of spiritual dogmas and is governed by force. According to him, this is the most vicious state because it is contrary to man’s moral nature and stops social development. He associates the metaphysical stage with the French spirit and criticizes it for its anarchy and confusion. In particular, Lastarria criticizes the revolutionary conception of liberty as popular sovereignty which he regards as an absolute power incompatible with the rights of man, properly understood. The attack against the old theological order and the anarchy in the ideas characterize the epoch of transition towards a third, positive, stage. He identifies the latter as “liberal” insofar as it is founded on human liberty, which, on his view, is ideally exercised in what he calls “semecracia” (self-government). By the latter he not only means individual self-government but also government of the people by the people, which he saw realized in the North American republic that he greatly admired.

Lastarria maintained that liberty consists in the exercise of various rights: the right to make decisions about one’s own person (personal liberty), the right to exercise one’s own intelligence and to examine received beliefs, the right to work and to acquire property, the right to associate with others, and the right to demand equality before the law (Lecciones, 5th Lesson). He was particularly concerned with freedom of religious worship. He held religion to be a fundamental idea in society but also an intimate and private one. Following the example of North America, he advocated the separation of church and State both in order to maintain the independence of the church in the carrying out of its spiritual mission and the neutrality of the State with respect to religious dogma. As many other Hispanic American liberals, Lastarria established a connection between freedom of thought and freedom of teaching: on his view, just as the State should abstain from favoring any religious doctrine in particular, the State should also refrain from imposing any political doctrine through official schooling. Though this view pushes towards the disappearance of official schooling, he granted that the State had a duty to finance basic schooling but should leave all other instruction in private hands.

Lastarria’s individualism was an exception among those Hispanic American liberals who subscribed to positivist philosophy. The latter came to see society as an organism, of which the individual is a part, subject to fixed laws that determine its development. In their defense of a scientific approach to social problems that was based on observation and experience, they claimed that law had to be adjusted to social reality, not the other way around. They thus rejected the “utopias” of earlier liberals and came to regard the “old” defense of natural rights and popular sovereignty as metaphysical abstractions that were out of touch with reality. In the extreme, positivist liberals sided with the defense of authoritarian governments in the name of order and progress. In México, positivist philosophy became the official creed of the governing elite, the so called “scientists”, who did not repudiate their liberal credentials. Their positivist version of liberalism, which they called “conservative” liberalism, served as the ideological framework for the justification of dictatorial rule (Aguilar 2011).

8. The Decline of Liberalism

After having been the triumphant ideology of nation building in most of Latin America in the late nineteenth century, liberalism entered a phase of decline in the early twentieth. In fact, liberalism’s demise began with the positivist subordination of constitutional rights and liberties to the maintenance of social order. The positivist critique of what came to be called “doctrinaire” (constitutional) liberalism constituted a frontal attack against the latter’s classical version, which emphasized the protection of individual liberties. At the turn of the century, this critique was sometimes combined with a growing skepticism regarding the aptness of liberal ideas and values for Hispanic American societies. In Mexico, this skepticism emerged from within the liberal establishment insofar as the late nineteenth century liberal regime had been dictatorial and failed to protect constitutional rights and liberties (Rabasa 1912). On this view, liberalism had subverted itself because it lacked the adequate social conditions to flourish. In Venezuela, by contrast, the idea that liberalism is not adequate for Hispanic American societies refers back to Bolívar’s early skepticism mentioned earlier (section 3). Laureano Vallenilla, a Venezuelan positivist sociologist, famously argued that authoritarian forms of governance are more suitable for Hispanic American societies (Vallenilla 1919). The idea that liberal reformers failed because liberal ideas were “imported” and not adequate for Latin American societies has not ceased to occupy interpreters ever since (Jaksic and Posada 2011a). A notable exception to this dominant view is the reconstruction, by an official ideologue, of Mexican liberalism as the official and triumphant ideology of the political regimes emanated from the 1910 revolution (Reyes Heroles 1957). Though professional historians are divided among those who claim that Latin American societies were indeed hostile ground for liberalism (Hale 1984) and those who more sympathetically present Latin American liberalism as a political movement that was responsive to local problems (Bushnell 1996), there is a growing tendency to abandon the “failure” view of liberalism and to focus on the reconstruction of what nineteenth century liberals aimed and accomplished, as a recent collection of essays shows (Jaksic and Posada 2011b). Whatever one may think about the “failure” view, however, it is certainly true that liberalism receded throughout Latin America in the first half of the twentieth century. An important reason for this is that alternative ideologies became prominent. Early in the century, positivism was condemned as utilitarian and materialist from the perspective of a new idealist mentality that developed among intellectual elites. By mid-century, socialist, Marxist, indigenous, agrarian, and populist political movements and ideologies had become dominant and displaced liberalism.

The late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries have seen a modest revival of a liberal political discourse that is partly due to the decline of socialist and Marxist political movements and ideologies. Two salient instances of this revival in political discourse are the recognition of the pluralism of forms of life and the demands for protection of the rights of minorities. In the sphere of academia, many scholars have enthusiastically welcomed the influence of Anglo-American contemporary liberalism. The works by John Rawls, Ronald Dworkin, Joseph Raz, and many others have received much attention and have been amply discussed in academic publications. It is interesting to notice, however, that there is a sharp separation between the reconstruction of nineteenth century Latin American liberalism, which continues to be the province of historians, on the one hand, and systematic reflection on liberal ideas and values by professional philosophers and political theorists, on the other. Little effort has been made to relate current work on liberal ideas and values inspired by Anglo-American authors to the nineteenth century Latin American tradition (a notable exception is Gargarella 2010 & 2013).


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