Yeshayahu Leibowitz

First published Tue Mar 29, 2011

Yeshayahu Leibowitz (1903–1994) was one of the most outspoken and controversial twentieth century Jewish thinkers and Israeli public intellectuals. Once termed “the conscience of Israel”[1] by his childhood contemporary from Riga, Sir Isaiah Berlin, Leibowitz's thought is founded on a far-reaching theocentrism that allows him to combine a commitment to Orthodox Jewish practice with a stripped-down definition of Jewish faith that yields a radically naturalistic theology—if, indeed, what is left can bear the burden of the term “theology” at all. But the influence of this theocentric commitment spreads far beyond the confines of his views on religious faith. It is the ultimate source of his unyielding criticism of the rabbinic establishment in Israel, and what—“in the face of so much pressure to be sensible, to be realistic, not to let the side down” as Berlin (1983, 18) put it—was seen at the time as a highly controversial stance regarding Israeli policy towards the territories captured during the Six Day war.

1. Life and Works

Born to an observant Jewish family in Riga in 1903, Leibowitz gained his education at the Gymnasium, with concurrent home-schooling for his Jewish studies, before the family fled Russia in 1919 for Berlin. At the University of Berlin, Leibowitz studied chemistry and philosophy, receiving his doctorate in the former in 1924. After studying at the Kaiser Wilhelm Institute from 1926–1928, Leibowitz went onto study medicine in Koln and Heidelberg, though with the Nazis gaining power he would gain his formal medical degree in Basel. In 1935 he moved to Palestine, initially as professor of biochemistry at the Hebrew University, going on to be appointed as head of biological and organic chemistry and professor of neurophysiology at the Medical School, as well as lecturing on the history and philosophy of science. Yet these formal academic appointments formed but one side of his work, and far from the most public, for in addition Leibowitz taught Jewish thought, whether in an academic context, in small study groups, or on television and radio, with a number of these broadcasts and study-group notes having since been published. But aside from these activities and his being editor in chief of several volumes of the Encyclopedia Hebraica, it was for his political interventions that Leibowitz would gain most notoriety on the Israeli public scene, whether in his criticism of the religious parties as the “kept mistress” (Judaism, 115) of the Israeli government, his argument as early as 1968 that Israel should withdraw from the newly-conquered West Bank and Gaza strip, or his public call for conscientious objectors from the time of the Lebanon war of 1982 and subsequently in the Palestinian territories. Leibowitz's ability to stir up public controversy was in evidence as late as 1993, the year before he died, in a speech to the Israel Council for Israeli-Palestinian Peace, where he reiterated his call on soldiers to refuse to serve in the Territories, using, not for the first time, highly provocative language comparing special units of the Israeli army to the SS. The speech followed the announcement that he was to receive the Israel prize—the country's most prestigious civilian award—in recognition of his life's work, a move that precipitated an appeal to the Supreme Court, and a threat to boycott the ceremony by Prime Minister Yitzhak Rabin. Leibowitz, however, saved everyone further embarrassment by declining the award.

1.1 Works

Leibowitz's philosophy found expression in numerous essays that first appeared in Hebrew periodicals and were subsequently collated, with some overlap, into a handful of volumes published at irregular intervals, most significantly Torah u-Mitzvot ba-Zeman ha-Zeh [Torah and Commandments in Our Time] (1954); Yahadut, Am Yehudi u-Medinat Yisrael [Judaism, Jewish People, and the State of Israel] (1975); and Emunah, Historiah, va-Arakhim [Faith, History, and Values] (1982). 1982 also saw the publication of the transcripts of his study-group on Maimonides' Shemoneh Perakim—the section of Maimonides' Commentary to the Mishnah that serves as an introduction to Tractate Avot (generally known in English as the Ethics of the Fathers). A number of his contributions to Israeli television and radio also appeared in print—including series on the philosophy of Maimonides and on the weekly Torah reading—and continue to do so posthumously, along with transcripts of further study-group discussions. Though far better known in Israel than in the English-speaking world, the publication in English translation of a collection of his writings in 1992—Judaism, Human Values, and the Jewish State—opened the way to a growing critical engagement with his thought beyond those oft disputed borders. One now finds a broadening of Leibowitz scholarship beyond exclusively Jewish concerns and the Kantian comparisons that were the staple of early critical work, to a clutch of recent attempts to place his work in proximity to that of Emmanuel Levinas, whose work Leibowitz held in high regard.[2] His radio broadcasts on Maimonides and on the weekly Torah reading of 1985–1986 are now also available in English.

1.2 Methodology

In the 1953 piece “Mitzvot Ma'asiyot” (a later version of which was translated as “Religious Praxis,” in Judaism), at once the most succinct statement of his philosophy and his most expansive essay that foreshadows much of what he would go on to write throughout his career, Leibowitz tells us that he is not concerned to “elaborate a philosophic justification or rationale for the Mitzvoth [commandments],” but instead to expand on “their meaning for Jewish religion as we live it” (Judaism, 4). Indeed, while some of Leibowitz's ideas are certainly drawn from (and relevant to) the philosophy of religion more generally, his writings are very specifically directed to giving a philosophical exposition of Judaism, and in particular of the mitzvoth that are at its heart. “Exposition” may, however, appear to be a misleading term to use given that the earliest published Hebrew version of this piece opens with some introductory methodological remarks “designed to guide the argument,” in which he states that argument “and not exposition—should be the main point of our discussion,” (Torah u-Mitzvot, 9).[3] Leibowitz's mixed signals here—talk of expanding on “meaning” suggests a more hermeneutical and expository approach, and yet he wishes to eschew “exposition” for argument—indicate important limits on what Leibowitz sets out to achieve. While he is certainly concerned with a correct understanding or description of the meaning of Jewish practice, he does nonetheless argue for his view. His construal of what constitutes argument, however, needs be understood rather narrowly and “scientifically.”

Given his scientific training, Leibowitz “argues” on the basis of empirical (most often historical) evidence for his conclusions regarding, for example, the centrality of mitzvoth in Judaism to the exclusion of mysticism, philosophy, or dogma. Yet, on the very same positivistic grounds, he is not willing to launch parallel “arguments” in order to justify specific practices or indeed Jewish practice as a whole. Thus, if one is expecting to find an argument justifying the halakhic way of life through syllogistic reasoning from foundational principles in the manner of the great medieval Jewish philosopher Moses Maimonides, one is likely to be disappointed. What we do find, in line with much contemporary Jewish philosophy, is an insider's account of the meaning of faith in Judaism as understood from within that tradition, albeit with implications beyond those boundaries. But in contrast to some of the best-known twentieth century Jewish philosophers, Leibowitz insists that the only reliable tool that we can use in order to investigate the meaning of faith is discursive reasoning. Thus we find Leibowitz arguing not only historically, but also in the sense of using the tools of rational philosophical discourse to trace the implications of certain positions to their logical conclusions.

Rather than setting out his philosophy comprehensively in the form of a system based on foundational premises, Leibowitz generally wrote short articles devoted to specific topics. It is nonetheless fair to say that there is a single axis around which his thought revolves and to which many of his views can ultimately be traced—the radical transcendence of God. In what follows we will begin with Leibowitz's understanding of God's transcendence, which will enable us to proceed to his conceptions of theology, Scripture, Jewish faith, ethics, and briefly politics, all of which ultimately wend their way back to that fundamental idea. While occasionally developments and changes in his thought will be noted, particularly in the political section, on the whole we will be dealing with his mature views since, as Hannah Kasher has argued, in the 1992 English translations to which most readers of this will have access, even the earlier essays have been translated in a manner that often reflects the later views (Kasher, 2000, 54).

2. God and Theology

According to Leibowitz, the central idea of Jewish monotheism is the radical transcendence of God, a view that has previously been given its starkest exposition by his philosophical hero, Maimonides. Postponing discussion of its precise logical status for Leibowitz, and provisionally accepting that “God is radically transcendent” is a cognitive statement, a rough first formulation of its meaning would be that God is an existent entity that is absolutely incomparable to any other form of reality that we can possibly encounter.

Following Maimonides' negative theology, Leibowitz claims that we are unable to make any meaningful statements that purport to describe God. Any attempt to speak of God's properties or characteristics transcend the limits of human thought and language. In good Kantian, or even positivist fashion, human categories of thought only get any purchase in the human context within which they are formulated. They cannot be assumed to retain their meaning when applied beyond the boundaries of possible human experience. Of course, this depends on the further assertion that God is not a possible object of such human experience, a point to which Leibowitz swiftly proceeds. For a thoroughgoing commitment to the idea of the radical transcendence of God yields a number of important ontological conclusions that go beyond the semantic point made thus far. For Leibowitz, the idea of radical transcendence, if taken seriously, implies that God cannot be “contained” within any reality that we encounter. Nature is nature, history is history—and if God is truly transcendent neither are God or are related to God in any direct sense. Thus, in a self-aware, if not self-deprecating moment, Leibowitz sets out his “heresy” (his description, not mine) thus: “God did not reveal himself in nature or in history.” (Yahadut, 240) Were things otherwise, then nature and history would be “Godly”—and thus would be perfect and worthy of worship themselves. There would be “no room for ‘the holy God’ who transcends natural reality, since then reality itself is divine and man himself is God” (Judaism, 25).

For Leibowitz, the only alternative to this view is a form of pantheism—the attribution of divinity in some sense to natural objects—an idea that he admits finds “echoes … in Jewish mysticism,” which to that extent is therefore “incompatible with halakhic Judaism” (Judaism, 26). The idea that any material object can be holy is something that, in Leibowitz's eyes, is the ultimate definition of idolatry, potentially leading to the worship of people, objects, or—significantly for his brand of Zionism—land. In contrast, though it might seem ironic at first glance given his view of pantheism, Leibowitz here takes up an almost Spinozan approach to nature. For Leibowitz, taking God's transcendence seriously entails the elimination of superstitious beliefs in holy entities with supernatural endowments, and thus a Spinozan demythologization of the natural world.[4] But while Spinoza is willing to speak of “God or nature,” for Leibowitz, the natural world must be purified of any trace of divinity; divinity—or holiness—is a notion that Leibowitz retains as a term to be used in connection with the God who radically transcends nature, with no remainder.

Denuding the world of divinity does not stop for Leibowitz at the natural world. History, as the story of humankind in the natural world, can no more carry divine significance than can a material object. The idea that there is some divine purpose in history, that God exerts some form of providence over humankind, would similarly contradict the idea of God's transcendence and is thus a baseless notion for Leibowitz for whom “an unbiased examination of the history of humankind and of the Jews as related in the Bible will not reveal in the entire process … any design or definite direction, or gradual approach to a specific goal” (Judaism, 102).

On the basis of these remarks, one immediately sees that Leibowitz's thought will be devoid of much that passes for traditional Jewish or general theology. Faith cannot be formulated around propositions that speak of God and his providential relationship to the universe. Holiness is confined to God and cannot be predicated of anything that exists in the world (which also, incidentally, explains his opposition to any ethnocentric interpretation of the idea of Chosen-ness based on some intrinsic “property” of holiness that Jews inherit). Any attribution of holiness to objects that might be found in Jewish texts is to be understood as attributing functional rather than essential holiness to the object in question.[5]

Leibowitz's God is not a providential God; history has no teleology; and we find no attempts at theodicy in Leibowitz. In contrast to many contemporary Jewish philosophers, the holocaust merits barely a mention in his philosophical writings, other than to dismiss it from theological discussion. A thoroughgoing commitment to transcendence cannot allow for a God who is involved in human affairs. Those who would question, indeed those who lost their faith in God as a result of Auschwitz “never believed in God but in God's help… [for] one who believes in God … does not relate this to belief in God's help” (Accepting the Yoke, 21).

For Leibowitz, this is a direct result of taking one's commitment to the radical transcendence of God to its logical conclusion. It is one thing, Leibowitz might say, to pay lip service to the idea of God's transcendence. But if God is to be truly transcendent, then we cannot associate our reality at any level with that of God. The one statement that we can make regarding God—that he is radically transcendent—can only be fleshed out further by clarifying how God is not anything that we can encounter in ordinary, or for that matter extraordinary, human experience. That Leibowitz here goes beyond even Maimonides is clear inasmuch as for Maimonides, though we cannot speak of God's intrinsic properties, we can speak of his “actions,” which is to speak of the course of nature, of which God is the first cause. And yet for Leibowitz, even this would transgress the limits to which the notion of radical transcendence binds us. To say that nature reflects God's actions renders God immanent in nature, and thus no longer transcendent. From both a semantic and ontological perspective, therefore, Leibowitz takes the notion of God's transcendence further than even his own philosophical “idol.” (See Statman 2005)

3. Interpreting Scripture

Leibowitz begins with a definition of God and draws out its implications for how we are to conceive of the world from a Jewish perspective. But where does he find this starting point? Textually speaking, one might claim to find grounding for the radical transcendence of God in various biblical verses and statements drawn from the Jewish tradition more generally, but no less than one can find quotes to question this account of God's relationship with nature and with history—as Leibowitz himself often acknowledges.[6] Indeed, any plain reading of Jewish Scripture would seem to suggest a God very closely involved with history and nature. Leibowitz's reading of Jewish Scripture is therefore based on a very particular hermeneutic approach to the Tanakh (the acronym used to refer to Jewish Scripture, based on the three works of which is composed—Torah, (lit. instruction), Nevi'im (Prophets), and Ketuvim (Writings)).

Leibowitz's definition of the Tanakh as Holy Scripture would appear atypically to place him in uncontroversial territory. But, what, for Leibowitz, does it mean to accord it this status and how is it to be interpreted? For simplicity's sake, we will focus in what follows on the Torah, the founding constitution of Judaism and the most authoritative part of the Tanakh. Traditionally, it was believed that: 1) The Torah is the word of God as dictated to Moses; and 2) it contains both the history of ancient Israel and the eternally valid laws that bind the Jewish people—the mitzvoth. Though both claims are contested in contemporary denominations of Judaism, Leibowitz is highly critical of such denominations, identifying himself with Orthodox Judaism within which these would usually remain fundamental tenets. Yet his view of Scripture is some distance from the traditional picture.

While many traditionalists would read the Torah as containing the prehistory of Judaism—if not of the world—and thus as being full of factual statements teaching such information, Leibowitz cannot accept this to be the case. Beginning with a basic epistemological point, Leibowitz's scientific training and vocation led him to take a positivistic approach to knowledge claims. Thus he writes that “our source of information is science. To the extent that we possess any real knowledge it is by way of scientific cognition” (Judaism, 136). But, given God's transcendence, there can be nothing holy about history or nature, or the information it provides. So were the Torah a history book or a scientific tract detailing the science of the universe—and it is of course often read as at least giving an account of the origins of the universe—“it would be difficult to see where [its] sacredness resided” (Judaism, 140). The Torah cannot be a holy book if it is teaching us information that is by (Leibowitz's) definition profane.[7]

But this means that the prima facie factual assertions that we encounter must be read as nothing of the sort. The Torah is not a work of fact containing truths that we can obtain through standard epistemic procedures. It is rather, a sacred work, a work that is concerned with the realm of the religious. Not for Leibowitz therefore the time-honoured medieval conundrum regarding faith and reason. While for his medieval Jewish forbears reason and revelation were competing for the same territory—raising the question of the relevance of the latter for those enamoured of the former—Leibowitz is happy to give reason its due without worrying about its encroachment into the territory of revelation, and vice versa. The Torah as a sacred work is dealing in the realm of the sacred and is not supposed to be a repository of the propositional truths of history or science. What it provides instead is “the demand made of man to worship God” (Judaism, 136). The Torah is the source of the commandments—the mitzvoth—which are the manner in which Jews are to serve God.

In one sense, this hermeneutic serves Leibowitz well, allowing him to bypass textual objections to his anti-providential reading of the Torah by claiming that the apparent references to God's role in nature or history are no longer to be understood factually, but rather as expressing something about the nature of our obligation to God. Similarly, stories of individuals are not to be mined for their historical content but for what they teach regarding the nature of religious obligation. At the same time, it demands a far from intuitive reading of much of Scripture, especially the stories of individuals that are certainly presented as if they are in some sense historical, and that in the later books of the Prophets that are also part of Holy Scripture are surely historical in part. Yet Leibowitz insists that in attempting the impossible—speaking of God—the Torah necessarily uses various literary forms amenable to human comprehension, but that nonetheless “from the standpoint of religious faith, the Torah and the entirety of Holy Scripture must be conceived as a demand which transcends the range of human cognition … a demand conveyed in various forms of human expression: prescriptions, vision, poetry, prayer, thought, and narrative” (Judaism, 140).

This does not rule out in principle the possibility of the narratives happening to contain historical information in part. Scripture's narratives could at times coincide with historical facts, though whether or not this is the case would be subject to independent verification of these purported historical facts by standard epistemic criteria. But even allowing for this possibility, the historical meaning would be merely accidental. Such facts would not take on any sacred meaning in virtue of that facticity, but rather on account of imparting an ahistorical sacred message. The Torah, qua Holy Scripture, cannot be read as a repository of historical fact. To read it “from the standpoint of religious faith,” is to read it for the demands it places upon us.

Nonetheless, given Leibowitz's views on God's transcendence, it is clear that the sacred and historical interpretations of the text are mutually exclusive when it comes to references to God's “intervention” in history or nature. And Leibowitz's particular hermeneutic allows him to deny that the Torah teaches us anything about God's actual intervention in nature or his directing of history, since apparently factual statements to this end in the Torah are not to be construed as such, but rather in terms of the normative messages that they carry. Here, the priority that Leibowitz gives to his understanding of God's transcendence appears forcefully, constraining him to take this hermeneutic stance. It does, however, raise the question of Leibowitz's understanding of the divine status of the Torah. For, if we cannot speak of it being revealed by God in any historical sense, whence its divinity? Leibowitz, fully aware of the problem, maintains that it is the Oral Torah that establishes the divine status of the Written Torah.

Traditional Jewish teaching maintained that at the same time as he transmitted the Written Torah, God transmitted an oral teaching to Moses that was not to be written down. This Oral teaching developed into the multi-layered work that was eventually written down as the Talmud by the end of the sixth century and that was the source of the complex practical system of law—halakhah—that governed Jewish life until the nineteenth century and continues to structure the life of contemporary Orthodox Jews. Leibowitz maintains that “religiously and from a logical and causal standpoint the Oral Law, the Halakhah, is prior to the Written Teaching” (Judaism, 12), and thus it is the Oral Torah that grants divine status to the Written Torah:

“The decision about which books to accept as Scripture was not made behind the veil of mythology or pre-history, but took place in the full light of history and in the course of halakhic negotiation… . Scripture is one of the institutions of the religion of Israel” (Judaism, 12).

This, Leibowitz admits, yields an inescapably circular account whereby the divinity of the Written Torah is established by the Oral Torah, which only gains its own authority on the basis of the Written Torah that it is being used to support. More significantly Leibowitz emphasizes time and again that the Oral Torah is a human product. Thus we end up with human beings stipulating that the Written Torah is divine, a stipulation, however, that only has authority based upon the Written Torah's own statements to the effect that one must follow the words of the human sages.[8] Reinforcing the circularity, this reading of the relevant verses in the Torah is itself an interpretation of the sages.

Leibowitz maintains, then, that we can say one thing about God—that he is radically transcendent, a statement the content of which is exhausted in the denial of divinity to any other reality. Allowing for this denial of any positive theology that would relate God to history or nature, we still find one thing to which we can attach divinity, and that is Scripture. However, the most basic question regarding whether or not God revealed the Torah in any historical sense must be answered negatively by Leibowitz, as noted in Statman 2005 (60) and Sagi 1997a (213), leaving him with an account of the divinity of Scripture that is circular, and that ultimately seems unable to escape its reliance on human decision.

4. Jewish Faith and Jewish Law

The “top-down” approach to Leibowitz's theology taken so far places extreme limits on what one can say or know about God but does not yield a constructive account of the nature of Jewish faith. His positive formulation therefore proceeds from an altogether different direction. Taking a more “bottom-up” approach methodologically speaking, Leibowitz utilizes a historical argument in defining Jewish faith, arguing that throughout history, at least until the emancipation of European Jewry beginning at the end of the eighteenth century, Judaism was defined through adherence to Jewish practice, to the commandments of the Torah itself, and the subsequent development of these commandments into the all encompassing system of Jewish law, or Halakhah. Any definition of Jewish faith must therefore centre upon Jewish practice, on the mitzvoth that governed the everyday life of Jews until modern times. Moreover, Leibowitz's concept of faith makes no allowances for any theological accretions, be they mystical or philosophical, which would purport to define it. Jewish theology through the ages has always adapted itself to prevailing philosophical or mystical winds, and is seen by Leibowitz as “episodic and fleeting” (Judaism, 8). Whether the conceptual scaffolding was kabbalah or rationalist philosophy, Judaism “was never dependent upon some specific philosophy, ethic, world view, or theology” (Judaism, 8–9), though it is mysticism and not rationalism which, along with Reform Judaism, he classifies one of “the two great distortions of Jewish faith” (Judaism, 111).

This historical account also melds with Leibowitz's theological starting point. Given God's transcendence, we know that the realm of natural or historical fact cannot be holy. Faith cannot therefore be “a conclusion a person may come to after pondering certain facts about the world,” and instead is “an evaluative decision that one makes, and, like all evaluations, it does not result from any information one has acquired, but is a commitment to which one binds himself.” (Judaism, 37, emphasis added). Jewish faith, therefore, rather than consisting of propositional beliefs concerning God upon which foundation halakhic observance is based, is instead founded upon the evaluative decision to commit to that very system of observance. For Leibowitz it is the mitzvoth themselves “which demarcate the realm of the sacred … [and] anything outside that realm lacks sanctity and is unworthy of religious adoration” (Judaism, 25).

This assertion of the primacy of practice is not unique to Leibowitz, having recently been resurrected by scholars such as Menachem Kellner (2006) and Kenneth Seeskin (1990). Steven Schwarzschild memorably termed this “the Jewish twist” (Schwarzschild 1977, 139) that in his view Jewish thinkers had applied since time immemorial to the systems of thought with which they grappled in order to partially assimilate them into a Jewish philosophical context. But Leibowitz gives this idea its most extreme formulation.

Ordinarily one might assume that the commitment to the practice of the halakhic way of life is an independently specifiable mental act and certain statements that Leibowitz makes in his earlier writings, vestiges of which remain in some less careful later formulations, might appear to suggest this.[9] Yet for Leibowitz, faith is not an independently specifiable psychological state. Indeed he castigates those who “wish to distinguish a specific psychological-conceptual content of the religious consciousness from its concrete institutionalized embodiment” (Judaism, 38). Leibowitz will not allow us to pinpoint a particular psychological state that constitutes this commitment, and correlatively is highly critical of mystical approaches to Judaism that revolve around putative religious experiences. A religion devoted to halakhic practice “does not depend upon the incidence of religious experience” (Judaism, 13), which is a mere “embellishment” to halakhic practice. Indeed, “the aim of proximity to God is unattainable” (Judaism, 16).

Clearly for Leibowitz, the problem with specifying some psychological basis for this commitment is defining what the content of this mental act would be. To what am I committed? The natural answer is that we are committed to worshipping God. But any attempt to unpack that statement further will lead us to transgress the boundaries of human cognition according to Leibowitz. The proposition “I am committed to God” is not open to further elaboration if God is beyond our categories of language and thought. Belief in God for Leibowitz, which cannot be formulated propositionally, can only then be embodied in a commitment to a particular way of life, which can only be expressed by subordination to the actual practical regime of halakhic practice. Thus, we are thrust back to the mere practice itself as the content of our faith rather than the symptom of some independently specifiable psychological commitment. It turns out then that, “[Jewish] faith is nothing but its system of mitzvoth, which was the embodiment of Judaism” (Judaism, 38, emphasis added). Jewish faith is equivalent to the observance of mitzvoth with no remainder; the concept is exhausted by the performance of Mitzvoth.

This contraction of faith to a behavioural definition means that halakhic observance itself constitutes a faith which cannot be identified independently of this practice, which Leibowitz concedes might create the appearance of paradox:

“Halakhah is founded on faith, yet at the same time constitutes this faith. In other words, Judaism as a living religion creates the faith upon which it is founded. This is a logical paradox but not a religious paradox” (Judaism, 11).

Asa Kasher, a neo-Leibowitzian, has argued that Leibowitz here does not present a paradox at all, but instead a form of the circle discussed in section 2 (A. Kasher 1976). Leibowitz in response concedes that there is no paradox, but stresses that no matter how many times one goes around the circle, the ultimate commitment to the life of mitzvoth must come from beyond the circle, from the conative — rather than cognitive — commitment that is beyond reason (see “Responses,” 277–278). The claim here ultimately for Leibowitz—that the practice of halakhah constitutes faith, while faith is the basis for practice – can be broken down into the following two claims:

Claim 1:
Faith is defined as, or constituted by halakhic practice
Claim 2:
Faith, defined as halakhic practice, is the basis of faith in the practice.

Claim 1 is simply the empirical/theological claim discussed above. In Claim 2, Leibowitz's point appears to be that while one may wish to argue that one's practice is founded on some independently specifiable faith such as the belief that God gave these commandments to the Jewish people, in fact immersion in the halakhic practice precedes any reflective version of such a belief, such that one's commitment is not based on that belief in any meaningful sense. At the point at which we are beings who are able to reflect thoughtfully about our commitment to our practices, we are already implicated in and formed by them.

As a justificatory argument for engaging in the practice, this might indeed create an impression of circularity—though circular arguments are neither formally invalid, nor paradoxical, but “merely” unpersuasive. Leibowitz, however, emphasizes time and again that he is not attempting to “justify” the commandments. Medieval Jewish thinkers believed that it was possible to “justify” Judaism by appeal to universal standards. Thus, to take Maimonides for example, if truth is the standard, then Judaism is clearly the most rational religion since it is a superior exemplar of, or means to attaining the truth, relative to the other monotheistic alternatives. If one were to begin from a neutral perspective, a rational being insofar as he is rational, could, in principle, be convinced of the superiority of Judaism. But this idea of a neutral starting point from which we can assess all the rational alternatives is one that Leibowitz rejects. The fiction that as fully formed rational beings we cast our eye without prejudice over the various modes of practical existence and decide in favor of the most rational is dismissed by Leibowitz. When it comes to faith, in Leibowitz's words:

“I know of no ways to faith other than faith itself… . [It] cannot be taught. One can only present it in all its might and power” (Judaism, 37).

This is where Leibowitz admits the limits of rationalism when it is understood as the metaphysical thesis that the world is intelligible “all the way down.” The world and our commitments within it are not rational all the way down. But once we have certain commitments, as every person does at the time at which he begins to reflect on them, our rational faculties are the only tools for exploring them, though not in the expectation that such reflection can be expected to produce meanings that will convince all rational beings to commit themselves to such a practice. And if we are to ask why commit, we are asking the question too late and assuming the theoretical stance towards faith that Leibowitz contends is questioned by Judaism.

Thus Leibowitz's contention that faith is based on halakhic practice and at the same time constituted by halakhic practice appears to be more a phenomenology of Jewish faith than a justification for faith, as one might expect from his methodological pronouncements. Much as Aristotle believed that virtuous action precedes the acquisition of the virtues, our commitment to the mitzvoth—or at least the conscious commitment that we make as reflective beings—is similarly preceded by participation in those very halakhic practices.[10] And just as for Aristotle it is only once we have acquired the virtues that those same acts becomes truly virtuous, in the same way halakhic actions only latterly become understood as acts of religious faith, in which one is conscious of a religious commitment to them. From this perspective, one might even argue that the circle becomes a virtuous circle, for the practice that is the basis of faith and yet ultimately constitutes that faith does indeed reinforce that faith—the practical circle is persuasive in a way that the circle of logical justification is not.

There is a sense in which this renders any commitment to a value system an expression of faith, rather than a result of rational reflection. But what then marks it out as specifically religious? What marks this out as Jewish faith is simply that it is the Jewish form of life, one that derives from specifically Jewish sources and has a specifically Jewish history. But for it to be religious requires that Leibowitz, in contrast to a secular ethicist, at least retain an ontological commitment to there being an entity that we can call God, to whom halakhic practices are directed. At this point therefore, one would wish to maintain that “God is radically transcendent” remains a cognitive statement. The mitzvoth are only “holy” inasmuch as they constitute holiness through being God's commands. It is in this way that this practice can constitute faith.

Yet as noted previously, Leibowitz cannot construe statements in the Torah regarding the event of revelation at Sinai as historical statements. So the problem remains of how a people could have been commanded and what exactly was “recognized” there if it is not the case that at some point in history the commandments were revealed by God. The problem for Leibowitz's account is that the mitzvoth are indeed enacted by human beings and thus play a role in the natural world. As a result, they must have a history. At the very least we can say that at some point they made their incursion into history. But how? If not through some miraculous revelatory event—a possibility that Leibowitz excludes[11]—then it must have been through some form of human initiative. Thus, in parallel to the attribution of divinity to Scripture, as Sagi notes, “the system is made religiously meaningful by the believers' perception of it as concerned with the worship of God,” while God collapses into a formal requirement of the system, “the supreme concept, uniting the system and endowing it with religious significance.” (Sagi 1997a, 213) Though it is not clear that this would concern Leibowitz, one ought to note that the mere institutional decision to categorize the mitzvoth as holy is not a firm basis for recovering their divinity in any sense that would pacify the religious adherents the nature of whose faith he is attempting to delineate.

Leibowitz's attempt to exclude God from history thus leaves him apparently unable to account for the divinity of the commandments in a manner that would render their performance acts of commitment to God in the ordinary sense. Indeed, when asked directly whether the statement “I believe in God” is meaningful, Leibowitz's response was: “I do not understand these words if they are divorced from the obligations that derive from them … faith in God is not what I know about God, but what I know about my obligations to God” (Sihot, 97). Talk of divinity should not be understood cognitively but in terms of the normative demands it imposes. Even talk of the revelation at Sinai is to be construed along these lines—“The meaning of the revelation at Sinai is the recognition of the command that we have been commanded” (Emunah, 154). But the truth in this for Leibowitz, phenomenologically speaking, is that the commitment to the practice is not based on an initial belief in God. Talk of God supervenes on the commitment to the practice rather than being a justification for it. Indeed, one generally only sincerely formulates the very idea that one is serving God subsequent to practice. Thus for Leibowitz, while it seems the term must have a referent, we use it without understanding it, and without needing to. In homage to Wittgenstein, Leibowitz writes: “That which cannot be said, is said by the religion of the Torah and the Mitzvoth,” (Yahadut, 343)—or at least by a commitment to them that cannot be given a specification independent of their practice. For Leibowitz, the realization that dawns with the rise of this commitment reveals that God cannot be spoken of as an entity who can be located in history or nature and that gives commandments over to a people in any conventional sense. Indeed, “the purpose of the mitzvoth is to educate man to recognize that knowing God and cleaving to him consist in the practice of these very precepts” (Judaism, 27). Thus, when the question is posed as to whether this leaves us with a robust enough idea to ground religious commitment, Leibowitz would claim that once those within the practice ask these questions, they will already be chasing their own tails. It is only subsequent to being committed to the practice that we reflect, analyse, and even formulate the very idea that we are practicing out of a commitment to God. Leibowitz seems to end up with a “leap of faith” type theology where the leap is taken retrospectively, by which time whatever independent specification one attempts to give of this notion ends up either transgressing boundaries that Leibowitzian transcendence sets on language and thought, or collapsing back into talk of commitment to the practice. The only way one can characterize Jewish faith is through the continued commitment to the practice itself, which thus constitutes that faith.

5. Worship Lishmah and the Meaning of Mitzvoth

Leibowitz cannot make sense of the divinity of the mitzvoth by claiming that God is their source in any straightforward sense. But he would not be the first Jewish philosopher to understand the divinity of the commandments as a function of their content rather than their historical source—according to many scholars, Maimonides also based his understanding of the divinity of the commandments on their being means to human perfection rather than on any direct historical experience of God.[12] Having reduced all meaningful discourse about God and faith to halakhic practice, one might thus look to the meaning of the practice for some such mark of divinity, and indeed Leibowitz has much to say about the nature of the mitzvoth, particularly as they relate to human values, and based on a basic Talmudic distinction between two forms of religious worship—worship that is “lishmah,” or “for its own sake,” and worship that is “Not-lishmah,” or “not for its own sake.”

Worship that is “Not-lishmah” Leibowitz characterizes in teleological terms. It begins with a set of human values and beliefs, and understands religion as the instrument for the realization of these values. Thus religious acts will be derived from this set of values, being those that best express them. These values, therefore, are prior to the religious act, much in the way utilitarian ethical theory prioritizes a definition of the good and defines right action in terms of what maximizes that good. Religious action then is at base motivated by human needs and the problem with such worship for Leibowitz is that it renders God the servant of man. It is what he terms “an endowing religion—a means of satisfying man's spiritual needs and of assuaging his mental conflicts. Its end is man, and God offers his services to man.” (Judaism, 14).

Reflecting an ambivalence that runs through statements in the Jewish tradition regarding such worship, Leibowitz vacillates between recognizing worship “Not-lishmah” as a genuine if flawed form of worship and as not seeing it as worship at all—indeed, seeing it as idolatrous in its reduction of worship of God to worship of man, thus implying that man is holy.[13] Philosophically speaking, his negative attitude can again be traced back to his strictly scientific approach to the world and his views concerning God's transcendence. Regarding the former, Leibowitz dismisses the idea that human beings exist at some supra-natural level. As creatures of flesh and blood, we are governed by the same natural laws as the rest of nature. Human beings have no special endowment that transcends their physical nature. Given that this is the case, human needs cannot be sacred, and thus the service of human need cannot be the purpose of the mitzvoth. Coming from the opposite direction, given that God is transcendent and cannot be related to any form of concrete reality, including human reality, how could the service of our own needs, which are a function of our humanity, constitute worship of God? God must be the exclusive locus of religious value, to the exclusion of human values. Man, in comparison, is but human, and a part of nature. Thus, while Medieval Jewish philosophers usually take the statement at Genesis 1:27 that man was created “in the image of God” as placing man on a pedestal by somehow comparing him to God, Leibowitz takes the term “image” in its more prosaic, if not pejorative Platonic sense (Judaism, 90).

In marked contrast to all of this, Leibowitz presents the idea of worship “lishmah,” which is the mark of a demanding religion. Here, the religious act is prior to any set of human needs or values. It is characterized by acts of worship demanded by God, where the demands made, and the motivations for serving, are simply that—they are Gods' demands. Here man is “an instrument for the realization of an end which transcends man … [who] serves his God lishmah—because He is worthy of worship” (Judaism, 14). Essentially, Judaism is a religion that demands the service of God, not man. Mitzvoth, for Leibowitz, are not therefore based on human needs and desires since that would subordinate God's values to human values, rendering God a slave to humanity, and placing humanity at the pinnacle of all value. Most mitzvoth for Leibowitz must therefore “be meaningless except as expressions of worship. They have no utility in terms of satisfaction of human needs” (Judaism, 16). Thus he sees much of halakhah as constitutive of religious “reality” rather than as regulating pre-existing profane reality. The dietary laws, to take an obvious example, are not there to regulate some form of pre-existing “spiritual” reality. Reality is equivalent to physical reality and the dietary laws are nothing more (nor less) than requirements of worship constituting a halakhic “reality,” which is a reality that has no referent beyond itself.

This sui generis understanding of halakhah is important if we are to understand Leibowitz's retreat from facts to values in the realm of faith. We have seen that to speak of any factual reality as divine impugns God's transcendence for Leibowitz. But one might ask why speaking of God as a source of values within our world is any less of an intrusion upon his transcendence. Leibowitz's point is that God is not a source of values within our world, since halakhah is not a function of any human values, indeed not a function of any set of values to which we have any independent access. In this way Leibowitz retains the transcendence of God in the evaluative realm of faith commitments in a way that is not possible in the realm of facts. And if we wish then to base the divinity of the mitzvoth on their content as opposed to any historical event of revelation, the content of the mitzvoth that marks them out as divine is their very “contentless-ness.”

5.1 Ethics and Religion

Leibowitz's view of mitzvoth clearly has important implications for the relationship between ethics and religion in general and more specifically for the relationship between ethics and halakhah. Religious values cannot be subordinated to ethical values which, since dictated by human interests for Leibowitz, are profane by definition, and therefore he draws a sharp distinction between mitzvoth and the realm of the ethical:

“The Torah does not recognize moral imperatives stemming from knowledge of natural reality or from awareness of man's duty to his fellow man. All it recognizes are Mitzvot, divine imperatives” (Judaism, 18).

Leibowitz does not deny that there is a genuine realm of ethical value, writing that both the theocentric (religious) and anthropocentric (Kantian) conceptions of value are “legitimate” (Judaism, 208). But he sees ethical values as distinct from the realm of religious value and stresses the importance of not confusing the one with the other. Much like Kierkegaard, Leibowitz argues that religious values are ultimate and if one is to serve God, all other values, including ethical values, must be subordinated to serving God, as exemplified by the biblical story of Abraham's (non) sacrifice of Isaac.[14] Ethics, as he notes, is the “atheistic category par excellence” (Judaism, 18), placing man at the apex of our values in place of God.

Much has been made of the formal similarities between Leibowitz's approach to mitzvoth and Kantian ethics, given the categorical nature of both the ethical and halakhic imperative, neither of which can be instrumental means to ends beyond the respective duties themselves. Both stress “worship lishmah”—it is just that Kantian ethics “worships” man “lishmah,” or as an end in himself, while religion worships God. Moreover, as with Kantian moral imperatives, the upshot of acting on religious imperatives for Leibowitz is autonomy. But while ethical action is autonomous for Kant inasmuch as it is a deliverance of our own practical reason, that very fact means that for Leibowitz ethical action is not an expression of human autonomy, but of our enslavement to our own nature. Recalling that for Leibowitz man is simply a part of nature like any other, when acting in accordance with that nature, man is “in effect, nothing but a robot activated by the forces of nature, just like the cattle grazing in the pasture, which are also ‘free from the Torah and Mitzvoth’; that is, from any law externally imposed” (Judaism, 21).

Though perhaps his rhetoric gets the better of him in comparing man acting on his own nature to an animal acting on its own nature, Leibowitz's central incompatibilist point is that freedom cannot be a function of acting according to one's own nature if man's nature “is only the last link in a causal chain of the forces of inorganic and organic nature which act upon him and within him” (ibid.). If this is the case, then the ethical dictates of human reason no more render man autonomous than do the ‘acts’ of his digestive system. Man is only “free from the bondage of nature because he lives a life that is contrary to nature,” and thus “emancipation from the bondage of nature can only be brought about by the religion of the Mitzvoth” (Judaism, 22).

Yet this apparently clear contrast with Kant actually betrays a deeper similarity. Kant sees ethical action as the route to autonomy precisely because it is through practical reason that we transcend our own nature and make contact with the noumenal realm. In effect therefore, and despite Kant's wish to keep religion and ethics apart from a motivational perspective, Kant and Leibowitz are in agreement that human autonomy requires that man transcend his phenomenal nature. The difference is that while for Kant ethics is, in a certain sense, transcendent—at least transcending man's empirical if not his rational nature—for Leibowitz ethics is nonetheless a function of human nature and therefore mired in the “phenomenal” realm destined never to escape. Leibowitz's view of autonomy appears to depend again on his thoroughgoing “naturalism” in regard to the physical and human world. Only the realm of mitzvoth can effect the sort of limited Leibowitzian transcendence that yields autonomy, which through its foundation in a primordial heteronomy—the imposition of mitzvoth by God—yields one of the fertile areas of comparison to Levinas in Fagenblat 2004, though as Fagenblat notes, for Levinas the realm of the ethical itself is a realm of transcendence beyond discursive human rationality. Unlike Leibowitz and closer again to Kant, for Levinas we need not go as far as mitzvoth to find the realm of transcendence.

Despite all of this, it is not clear that mitzvoth could not carry some sort of ethical valence. Much as Kant does for moral value, Leibowitz locates the religious value of our acts in our intentions. Holiness, he tells us, “is nothing but halakhic observance; the specific intentional acts dedicated to the service of God” (Judaism, 24, emphasis added). Presumably then the mitzvoth could be performed for the sake of worshipping God and yet have incidental benefit to us. As long as the motivation is the worship of God, any incidental benefits would surely be legitimate, or at least not rule out the act as religiously worthy. What matters here is the hierarchy of values—observance of mitzvoth cannot be subordinated to ethical values. Yet Leibowitz's intentionalism dictates that such acts, even if they incidentally satisfy certain human needs, would still not be ethical acts given their religious motivation.

At this point, Leibowitz's description of the religious and halakhic realms, even if disputable, appears to be consistent. Judaism is for him a deontological system of divine duties, rather than a teleological system designed to promote any form of human “good.” From a human perspective, the mitzvoth might indeed be meaningless; if they do end up promoting some form of human good, this would be accidental and not part of the essential nature of mitzvoth. But while this conception of mitzvoth works well for most ritual commandments, it comes under pressure in relation to what would ordinarily be termed ethical mitzvoth—were it not for the fact that this is now an oxymoron for Leibowitz—such that even “You shall love your neighbor as yourself,” is to be regarded as a mitzvah, not as an ethical precept. The key phrase in the verse containing this commandment for Leibowitz is that which follows immediately to end the verse: “I am God.” It is a duty towards one's neighbor that is based on man's position before God, not his position before his fellow man.

One of Leibowitz's concerns seems to be that for the imperatives to be truly categorical, they must draw their authority from something other than human needs and values, which are too weak a foundation to ground categorical imperatives. One can always excuse oneself with the claim that other people's needs are not overriding in any given situation. There is no escape, however, from the authority of a divine demand, thus locating ethical imperatives within a religious system gives them the necessary foundation. Their position as commandments transform them from “mere good counsel, a noble aspiration, or a sublime ideal,” and instead gives them “the reality of law, something one is compelled to take seriously as one must take a police ordinance seriously” (Judaism, 19). But more than that, for Leibowitz this deprives them of their ethical character. Acting for noble ideals, while legitimate, would still render acts ethical, not religious. Thus an important distinction remains, and it is not clear that it is a distinction that can do justice to the ethical prescriptions of the Torah qua ethical prescriptions. Ought I to act justly towards my neighbor out of my concern for him, or out of concern for God? While it seems clear that Leibowitz could only see the latter as a religious act, it is not clear that this sits comfortably with our ethical intuitions—though presumably Leibowitz would simply retort that this is precisely what it means to subordinate human interest to the ultimate value that is the worship of God. While a Levinasian squaring of the circle would allow that our ethical concern for the other is itself a mark of transcendence, for Leibowitz, a religious act, even if it may serve one's fellow man incidentally, can neither be motivated by such a goal, nor allow such goals to play a role in our understanding of it as a mitzvah, since this would render God the slave of human interests.

Nonetheless, Leibowitz recognizes that beyond the realm of halakhah “flourish many good deeds and events of grandeur and sublimity” (Judaism, 25). Generally for Leibowitz, halakhah is not all-encompassing and does not govern all behavior, as he makes explicit in his interviews with Michael Shashar where he asks rhetorically whether Judaism has a perspective on the decision whether to build a bridge over a particular river (Sihot, 91). For Leibowitz then, there are clearly other aspects of human life that are necessary, indeed valuable, and that need not be dedicated to the worship of God. Religion must be the highest value for Leibowitz to which all others are subordinated in times of conflict; it need not be the only value. But in acting for the sake of one's fellow man, one must recognize that this is the performance of a noble ethical act, not a holy religious act. The question that arises, however, is whether in the case of ethically motivated acts that coincide with mitzvoth, a Jew ought to have instead performed the act for religious reasons—a position that would not leave much room for a religious person to perform an ethical action. Indeed, it would seem that if one wishes to perform the mitzvah of, for example, “loving one's neighbor,” one ought not to be acting based on ethical motives. As such, it is not clear what becomes of the legitimacy of the ethical realm for a religious Jew, since every ethically motivated act constitutes a missed opportunity for the worship of God. Each act ought to be religiously rather than ethically motivated, even when the mere act itself would be the same. While it is not as if one who is ethically motivated can sincerely transform that ethical motivation into a religious one, it seems as if becoming the type of person who naturally acts religiously in such cases would have to be the ultimate aim for Leibowitz. This would not deny all value to ethically motivated acts, but it certainly seems to render those that coincide with specific mitzvoth problematic for Jews.

5.2 Meta-Halakhah and the Status of Women

Leibowitz's account of halakhah is not uni-dimensional. His claim that most of the mitzvoth are meaningless according to human conceptions of value leaves an important gap that he exploits elsewhere in his writings, particularly in a short late piece on the status of women in Judaism, where he distinguishes between two types of mitzvoth in a manner that renders the picture considerably more complex.

Thus on the one hand, we have the ritual commandments required of men and not required of women. These mitzvoth are indeed “meaningless,” having no intrinsic value beyond their status as mitzvoth that God requires in his service by men and not women. They do not reflect any exalted status for men or yield access to some sort of religious experience beyond the mere burden of performance. Given this, the desire of women to take on such practices in the name of equality reflects a fundamental misunderstanding—or at least a non-Leibowitzian understanding—of the nature of these commandments. And yet, when it comes to the highest level study of Torah and access to public office, both of which had traditionally been halakhically forbidden to women, Leibowitz takes a very different view. Barring women access to the study of Torah “is not to exempt them from a duty … but is to deprive them of a basic Jewish right … [that] renders their Jewishness inferior to that of men” (Judaism, 129). The original restriction, as well as that regarding attaining public office, reflected the prevailing socio-cultural norms of the surrounding society rather than any essential halakhic determinations. Thus Leibowitz wishes to distinguish between

“absolute demands reflecting acceptance of the ‘yoke of the kingdom of heaven’ that are not amenable to adjustment to natural or social factors, [and] practices which reflect given circumstances and the views shaped by them; in other words, between unconditional prescriptions and proscriptions and norms reflecting a given sociocultural milieu and its prejudices” (Judaism, 131).

We find, therefore, a realm of mitzvoth that do appear to be subservient to human values and societal change. That Leibowitz believes in such a category, independently of the highly charged gender question, is clear from the following:

“Consider the proscription of ploughing with an ox and an ass yoked together. Does this imply a duty to base agriculture on animal power and to create the opportunity for fulfilling the prohibition? Reversing the terms, is mechanized agriculture, which obviates the use of animals as a source of energy forbidden because it removes all opportunity for observing this mitzvah? Or is it permissible to assume a hypothetical imperative: in the event that animals are used, avoid ploughing with an ox and an ass yoked together?” (Judaism, 149).

The Torah clearly contains laws or commandments that react to political and social institutions already in place—hence laws concerning slavery for example. Thus it turns out that there are two categories of mitzvoth for Leibowitz: type1 acts without intrinsic meaning that are constitutive of a halakhic reality and not amenable to change; and type2 acts where the halakhic community has responsibility for regulating a pre-existing reality. These halakhic acts can change depending on the general sociocultural norms governing that particular aspect of reality, be it agriculture, or gender equality. Indeed, Leibowitz often notes explicitly that Judaism is not to be identified with the specific laws with which it began, but with the “recognition of a system of precepts as binding, even if their specifics were often only determined with time” (Judaism, 4)

What is one to make of this concession? While there might be strong arguments for drawing such a distinction on both textual and common sense grounds, the question is whether Leibowitz can consistently allow such external concerns to intrude upon religion without usurping it. The meta-halakhic issue, as Leibowitz terms it, regarding the status of women in the Jewish community, drives specific halakhic changes. And ultimately what appears to be driving these changes is an ethical assumption regarding unjustified gender inequalities. But if one is allowing religious norms to be subordinated to human values, then by Leibowitz's standards one is serving man rather than God—if the motivation here is ethical or more broadly social, then surely by his intentional definition of mitzvoth, they cease to be religious acts.

In the particular case of gender equality, however, there are broader concerns that come into play—the survival of Judaism. While this is not explicit in everything that Leibowitz writes, he makes precisely this claim regarding the gender issue in an interview with Michael Shashar—“the future of Judaism depends on it” (Sihot, 110). One might argue therefore that our being responsive to the ethical concerns presented in these cases has religious significance since it is subsumed under the overriding religious concern to maintain the existence of Judaism. Thus these acts would retain their religious significance given the more general religious motivation for the changes. It is very difficult, however, to escape the feeling that Leibowitz is driven here by his ethical impulses, and more significantly it is clear that all manner of halakhic decisions are motivated by explicit consideration of ethical principles such as “the ways of pleasantness” or “doing the right and the good.” Unless he is going to allow ethical motivation for certain mitzvoth and problematize his system then, it appears as if these areas of decision and action cannot be deemed religious in the strict sense. Leibowitz certainly recognizes that halakhic decisions are “grounded either in the Halakhah itself or in the conditions necessary for halakhic observance” (Judaism, 4), and thus it may be that these ethical halakhic decisions are “enablers” rather than direct loci of religious worship. By contracting the religious sphere in this way, Leibowitz could maintain some indirect religious value for the ethically motivated acts of a religious Jew. But the contraction that such a move necessitates would relegate enormous tracts of the Talmud to this lesser status, which seems problematic. The possible counter that all of those decisions were taken by the sages with the general motivation of “serving God,” would make it difficult to retain any form of distinction between religion and ethics of the form that Leibowitz clearly wishes to maintain. Of course many of these problems (including those discussed at the end of section 5.1) hang on the thread of Leibowitz's concept of intention—one that assumes that intentions can be clearly and exclusively identified as “ethical” or “religious.” Melzer (1976, 261), however, has argued that Leibowitz's concept of intention is impoverished.

Setting aside the problems just identified, Leibowitz's distinction remains problematic in the context of his overall system. He explicitly categorizes the realm of synagogue ritual to type1 acts. Yet in much of contemporary orthodoxy, this is one of the most fought over issues, and one in which the inequalities for women are understood by some as tantamount to the denial of “a basic Jewish right … [that] renders their Jewishness inferior to that of men.” Should women feel so marginalized by this particular inequality that it threatens the future of Judaism, leading to sanctioning the participation of women in certain rituals, Leibowitz's type1 mitzvoth would have to be recategorized as type2 mitzvoth and we would have to conclude that the categories are fluid and that commandments can move between categories. But then the question of how we categorize the commandments seems to become dependent on human perception and values, which would be problematic for Leibowitz.

Ultimately then, Leibowitz struggles to maintain God's radical transcendence in its most pristine form. Neither history, nor nature, including human nature, are sources of religious value. God's prescriptions alone are holy and Jewish worship, indeed Jewish faith, is simply the commitment to this behavioral regime. But while he begins with a tidy definition of religious acts as absolute commands performed with the intention of serving God, as acts that cannot be motivated by human concerns or interests, the fact that life involves other given civil and social settings requires that we deal with such interests. This yields type2 acts, with resulting questions regarding whether or not certain mitzvoth can be unequivocally placed into one or other of the categories, and whether indeed there can be movement between the categories without Leibowitz's theocentrism folding into a form of anthropocentrism. The distinction necessary to prevent this amongst halakhic decisors—that between the intention of “realizing the Torah” and the intention to “adapt Halakhah to a variety of human needs” (Judaism, 4)—is not always easy to discern, and, one imagines, could very easily fall victim to self-deception.

6. Religion, State, and Israel

Leibowitz was an unabashed Zionist. However, Zionism for Leibowitz was defined simply as “the endeavor to liberate Jews from being ruled by the Gentiles” (Judaism, 214), an endeavor that the state of Israel “completely satisfies.” Thus, despite being a religious Jew, Leibowitz's Zionism is avowedly secular, and his secular version of Zionism flows directly from the central tenets of his philosophy. Firstly, it is dictated by his intentional approach to religious action—the motivation for setting up the state was political and nationalistic rather than religious. Indeed, Zionism was initially a secular Jewish revolution, a political movement with nationalist aspirations. Secondly, it is directly implied by his view that the service of human needs and interests cannot be equated with the service of God. For Leibowitz, the state serves a perfectly noble political purpose, serving human needs. But again this should not be confused with its having religious value in itself:

“Counterfeit religion identifies national interests with the service of God and imputes to the state—which is only an instrument serving human needs—supreme value from a religious standpoint” (Judaism, 226–227).

Thus, it would seem as if religion and state cannot possibly be linked, and this indeed was a position that Leibowitz would take. Here though, it seems as if Leibowitz's thought, or at least his attitude towards what constitutes meaningful discourse, underwent significant development.

In his earlier writings, Leibowitz challenged the religious rabbinic establishment to take the courageous steps necessary to provide a vision for a “halakhic state,” a state that could run according to Jewish law; that could accommodate, for example, the needs of a country to have a fully working police force and electrical system on the Sabbath without being parasitic on Jews who do not observe the laws forbidding such action on the Sabbath. Thus “a specific and detailed halakhic code for administering the full panoply of state functions is called for … [to give] a clear picture of how the religious parties would run the state if and when they came to power” (Judaism, 170–171).

This would have necessitated a halakhic revolution, utilizing innovative and creative techniques of Jewish legal interpretation and application. But instead, in Leibowitz's eyes the religious parties prostituted themselves to the state to protect their own brand of religious sectarianism, subordinating religion to the machinery of the secular government. Just seven years later in recognition of this reality, Leibowitz changed his tune, presenting a call for the separation of religion and state as the only program “that would be in the religious interest in the existing situation” (Judaism, 175). Still, at this point, though reality has bitten, there is no statement that in principle religion and state must remain separate. A decade later, however, Leibowitz comes close to espousing such a view, stating that “no state whatsoever, in the past, present, or any foreseeable future, in any society, in any era, in any culture, including the Jewish culture, ever was or will ever be anything but a secular institution” (Judaism, 215–216).

On the one hand, this should come as no surprise given that politics is concerned with human institutions that serve human needs, and Leibowitz cannot allow for acts of religious worship that are directed towards human needs. Yet, on the other hand, in noting that the state “sets the ground for the struggle for religion, which is by its very nature an eternal struggle that will never end in victory” (Judaism, 215–216), he does appear to open up the possibility of political action having religious import. Indeed, he goes on to say that the reason that Israel has no religious significance is precisely “because no such struggle is being conducted in it” (ibid.), which appears to imply the possibility of a state having such significance were it to provide for such a struggle. As mentioned earlier, Leibowitz speaks of “conditions necessary for halakhic observance” (Judaism, 4), essential conditions for individuals to worship God that would include human social and political organization. Judaism does not present any specific form of political organization as the right one, since political acts are not themselves halakhic acts. It is merely the scaffolding without which individuals would not have the capacity to engage in their individual “religious struggles,” which presumably yields this lesser category of “religious significance” to the political state that enables it. Given his intentionalism though, mere political organization can have no religious significance in itself; it can only have such significance if the political action is driven by the intention that the state be an enabling condition for religious worship. But clearly this is not the case for the current Israeli government, and the religious authorities have no jurisdiction over such political matters.

It seems that later in his career, Leibowitz's positivistic leanings prevent him from being willing to engage in what is ultimately utopian speculation concerning a halakhic vision for the state. The earlier program is a mere pipedream when the state is catering for a nation that has no interest in Jewish observance. Were the entire population unanimously in favor of such observance, Leibowitz might once again take up the cause. But Leibowitz is unwilling to engage in such idealistic guesswork, which he dismisses as meaningless, claiming fundamentally not to understand how one is to relate seriously to such ideals (Sihot, 92). The possibility that a state might have religious significance “in principle” is not a discussion that can have any political purchase. Political action cannot be religious action in the contemporary world. In reality then—and present reality is the only reality he is willing to recognize by this point—Leibowitz wishes to keep political questions separate from religion, which in the contemporary state contracts itself to the private sphere.

None of this is to say that religion cannot be relevant to the state in any way, even today. Though he does not wish to speak of how religion can serve the state, since this inverts the correct hierarchical relationship between the two, religion can nonetheless have a “function” within the state for Leibowitz as a “critical friend” that can “check the influence of political values and … restrain the patriotism and nationalistic enthusiasm” (Judaism, 209–210). Thus “if religion has a function, it is to place man's limited values in a true perspective” (Judaism, 210–211). Indeed, the mistaken religious significance that people do impute either to the land or to the state is nothing short of scandalous for Leibowitz, both religiously and morally.

Religiously speaking, a physical land simply cannot be holy for Leibowitz: “The idea that a specific country or location has an intrinsic ”holiness“ is an indubitably idolatrous idea.” (Judaism, 226–227). Thus, claims that a two-state solution to the Israeli-Palestinian problem cannot be countenanced because the land is holy to Jews are absurd in Leibowitz's eyes. Moreover, given his hermeneutic of Scripture, attempts to base the Jewish “right” to the land on the basis of historical claims in the Torah are just as baseless. Indeed, without quite using the term “nonsense on stilts” Leibowitz nonetheless evinces a Benthamite scepticism to the notion that any nation has a legal right to a land—“talk of rights is pure nonsense. No nation has a right to any land” (Judaism, 241). Rights to land for Leibowitz are a matter of historical consciousness. And the problem for Israel and the Palestinians is that both tell a story that stakes a claim on this basis such that “in consequence of centuries of history, members of each feel passionately that this is their land” (Judaism, 241).

Moreover, imputing religious significance to the state (as opposed to the land) is no less a form of “idolatry.” It yields violence and injustice in the name of religion that is in truth the sheer willingness to commit moral atrocities in the name of the state, hiding behind an illusory cloak of religious piety.

Leibowitz's moral critique of the actions of the state and the Israeli army, which rose to a new pitch subsequent to the Lebanon War of 1982, gives a clear indication of the significance of morality qua morality for Leibowitz in a manner that is entirely consistent with the view discussed earlier that morality must be subordinated to religion and not vice versa. It is precisely because people mistakenly impute religious value to objects or institutions that they commit moral atrocities in the name of religion for Leibowitz. And it is precisely the understanding of the state as a secular institution that for Leibowitz would prevent such actions, since we will then judge these actions correctly—i.e., morally, not religiously. And by ethical standards, Leibowitz clearly believes that they cannot be justified. Yet again, it is the ascription of holiness to profane things, to the natural world and our human needs and interests within it, that is at the root of all that he decries in religion and that has dire political and moral consequences in the contemporary political sphere. While one might disagree with his political assessment on political grounds, he would argue that it is only on such grounds that one can disagree, and that is a dispute for a political forum.


Primary Literature

Cited Works of Leibowitz

  • Torah u-Mitzvot ba-Zeman ha-Zeh [Torah and Commandments in Our Time], Tel Aviv: Schocken, 1954. Cited as Torah u-Mitzvot.
  • Yahadut, Am Yehudi u-Medinat Yisrael [Judaism, the Jewish People, and the State of Israel], Tel Aviv: Schocken, 1975. Cited as Yahadut.
  • Emunah, Historiah, ve-Arakhim [Faith, History, and Values], Jerusalem: Academon, 1982. Cited as Emunah.
  • Judaism, Human Values, and the Jewish State, Eliezer Goldman (ed.), Eliezer Goldman, Yoram Navon, Zvi Jacobson, Gershon Levi, and Raphael Levy (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1995. Cited as Judaism. [This is a selection of articles from the above Hebrew collections, translated into English.]
  • Yeshayahu Leibowitz al Olam u-Melo'o, Sihot im Michael Shashar [Yeshayahu Leibowitz On Just About Everything: Talks with Michael Shashar], Jerusalem: Keter Publishing House, 1988. Cited as Sihot
  • Accepting the Yoke of Heaven: Commentary on the Weekly Torah Portion, Shmuel Himelstein (trans.), New York: Urim Publications, 2002. Cited as Accepting the Yoke. [This is a translation of radio broadcasts originally published as He'arot le-Parshiyot ha-Shavua (Notes to the Weekly Torah Reading), Jerusalem: Academon, 1988.]
  • “Responses,” [Hebrew], Iyyun 26 (1976), 265–81. [Leibowitz's responses to a set of articles about his thought published in this issue of the journal Iyyun.] Cited as “Responses”

Further Selected Publications of Leibowitz

Study-Group Discussions
  • Sihot al Pirke Avot ve-al ha-Rambam [Discourses on the Ethics of the Fathers and on Maimonides], Jerusalem: Schocken, 1979.
  • Sihot al Shemoneh Perakim la-Rambam [Conversations on Maimonides' Eight Chapters], Jerusalem: Keter, 1986.
  • Sihot al Mesilat Yesharim la-Ramchal [Conversations on The Paths of the Righteous of Rabbi Moses Hayyim Luzzato], Jerusalem: Greta Leibowitz, 1995.
  • Sihot al Torat ha-Nevu'ah shel ha-Rambam [Conversations on Prophecy in Maimonides], Jerusalem: Greta Leibowitz, 1997.
  • Sihot al Mivchar Pirkei ha-Hashgachah mitokh “Moreh Nevukhim” shel ha-Rambam [Conversations on Providence in Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed], Jerusalem: Mira Ofran, 2003.
  • Sihot al Pirkei ta'amei ha-Mitzvot mitokh “Moreh Nevukhim” shel ha-Rambam [Conversations on the Reasons for the Commandments in Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed], Jerusalem: Mira Ofran, 2003.
Published Broadcasts, Interviews, and Correspondence
  • Guf va-Nefesh: Habe'ayah ha-Psikho-Physit [Body and Mind: The Psycho-Physical Problem], Tel Aviv: Misrad ha-Bitahon Publications, 1984.
  • Emunato shel ha-Rambam [The Faith of Maimonides], Tel Aviv: Misrad ha-Bitahon Publications, 1985. Translated as The Faith of Maimonides, John Glucker (trans.), New York: Adama Books, 1989.
  • Hamisha Sifrei Emunah [Five Books of Faith], Mira Ofran (ed.), Jerusalem: Keter, 1995.
  • Sihot al Hagei Yisrael u-Moadav, [Discourses on the Jewish Holidays], Jerusalem: Greta Lebowitz, 1999.
  • Sheva Shanim shel Sihot al Parashat ha-Shavua [Seven Years of Discourses on the Weekly Torah Reading], Jerusalem: Greta Leibowitz, 2000.
  • Mah She-lema'lah u-mah she-lemattah: Dialogim im Toni Lavi [What is Above and What is Below: Dialogues with Toni Lavi], Or Yehuda: Maariv Book Guild, 1997.
  • Ratziti lish'ol otcha, Professor Leibowitz: Michtavim el Yeshayahu Leibowitz u-mimenu [I Wanted to Ask You Professor Leibowitz: Letters To and From Yeshayahu Leibowitz], Jerusalem: Keter, 1999.

Selected Secondary Literature and Works Cited

  • Berlin, Isaiah, 1983. “The Conscience of Israel” [Hebrew], Ha'aretz, 4 March: 18.
  • Fagenblat, Michael, 2004. “Lacking All Interest: Levinas, Leibowitz, and the Pure Practice of Religion”, Harvard Theological Review, 97: 1–32.
  • Hartman, David, 1990. Conflicting Visions, New York: Schocken Books.
  • Kasher, Asa, 1976. “Paradox—Question Mark” [Hebrew], Iyyun, 26: 236–41.
  • Kasher, Asa and Levinger, Jacob (eds.), 1977. The Yeshayahu Leibowitz Book [Hebrew], Tel Aviv: Agudat ha-Studentim.
  • Kasher, Hannah, 2000. “On Yeshayahu Leibowitz's Use of Religious Terminology”, The Journal of Jewish Thought and Philosophy, 10: 27–55.
  • Kasher, Naomi, 1976. “Kant's Ethics and Leibowitz's View of Religion” [Hebrew], Iyyun, 26: 242–55.
  • Kellner, Menachem, 2006. Must A Jew Believe Anything, 2nd edition, Oxford: Littman Library of Jewish Civilization.
  • Maimonides, Moses. Guide of the Perplexed, trans. S. Pines. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1963.
  • Marantz, Haim, 1997. “Bearing witness: morality and religion in the thought of Yeshayahu Leibowitz”, Judaism, 46: 35–45.
  • Melzer, Yehuda, 1976. “Ethics and Halakha Once Again” [Hebrew], Iyyun, 26: 256–64.
  • Nadler, Steven, 2006. Spinoza's Ethics: An Introduction, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Newton, Adam Zachary, 2000. The Fence and the Neighbour, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Ravitzky, Avi (ed.), 2007. Yeshayahu Leibowitz: Between Conservatism and Radicalism, Jerusalem, Hakibbutz Hameuchad Publishing House.
  • Sagi, Avi, 1992. “Rabbi Soloveitchik and Professor Leibowitz as Theoreticians of the Halakhah”, Da'at, 19: 131–48.
  • –––, (ed.), 1995. Yeshayahu Leibowitz: His World and Philosophy [Hebrew]. Jerusalem: Keter.
  • –––, 1997. “Contending with Modernity: Scripture in the Thought of Yeshayahu Leibowitz and Joseph Soloveitchik”, The Journal of Religion, 77: 421–441.
  • –––, 1997a. “Yeshayahu Leibowitz—A Breakthrough in Jewish Philosophy: Religion Without Metaphysics”, Religious Studies, 33: 203–216.
  • –––, 2009. Jewish Religion After Theology, Boston: Academic Studies Press.
  • Schwarzschild, Steven, 1977. “Moral Radicalism and ‘Middlingness’ in the Ethics of Maimonides,” in The Pursuit of the Ideal: Jewish Writings of Steven Schwarzschild, Menachem Kellner (ed.), Albany: SUNY Press, 1990, 137–160.
  • Seeskin, Kenneth, 1990. Jewish Philosophy in a Secular Age, Albany NY: SUNY Press.
  • Statman, Daniel, 2005. “Negative Theology and the Meaning of the Commandments in Modern Orthodoxy”, Tradition, 39/1: 55–68.


I would like to thank Michael Harris, David Shatz, and Daniel Statman for helpful comments and discussion.

Copyright © 2011 by
Daniel Rynhold <>

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