Louis de La Forge

First published Tue Nov 15, 2011; substantive revision Mon Nov 2, 2015

Louis de la Forge was among the first group of self-styled disciples to edit and disseminate the writings of Descartes in the years immediately following his death in Sweden (1650). La Forge initially used his medical training to comment on Cartesian physiology. He also wrote the first monograph on Descartes' theory of the human mind, in which he defended substance dualism and proposed a theory of occasional causation that was adopted and developed by other Cartesians, including Malebranche.

1. Life and Works

La Forge was born on 24 or 26 November 1632 in La Flèche, in the Loire valley in central France, the same town in which Descartes had attended college between 1607 and 1615. He became a medical doctor, and then moved to Saumur, where he married Renée Bizard in 1653. He practised medicine at Saumur until his premature death in 1666. There had been a Huguenot college at Saumur since 1599, when it was founded by Philippe Duplessis-Mornay (1549–1623). Moïse Amyraut (1596–1664) and Robert Chouet (1642–1731) were among the notable contemporary scholars who taught there. There was also an Oratorian school (the Collège royal des Catholiques) and an adjoining seminary in the same town, at Notre Dame des Ardilliers. A number of Catholic philosophers had studied in the latter, including Bernard Lamy (1640–1715) and, for a brief period, Nicolas Malebranche. Both colleges were receptive to the ‘new’ philosophy of Cartesianism and, apparently, their staff members enjoyed more amicable relations than might have been expected from the history of the religious traditions that they represented. Following revocation of the Edict of Nantes (1685), the Calvinist college was razed, while Notre Dame des Ardilliers survives as a school to this day.

La Forge became acquainted with Cartesianism when he studied at La Flèche, and he continued his interest while practicing medicine at Saumur, where he had opportunities to discuss philosophy with other sympathetic readers of Descartes at both the Oratorian school and at the Reformed Academy, especially with Chouet. Although he lived in the provinces, he corresponded with some leading Cartesians of the period, including Géraud de Cordemoy (1626–84), who published his own contribution to Cartesianism in the same year as La Forge (Cordemoy 1666). When Claude Clerselier (1614–84) began to edit Descartes' works and prepare them for publication, he acquired manuscript copies of two of his unpublished essays entitled Traité de l'Homme and Description du Corps Humain, both of which have since been lost. The Traité was the second part of a book that Descartes had planned to publish as Traité de la lumière. However, those plans were deferred indefinitely when news of Galileo's condemnation reached Holland in 1633 and, as a result, the Traité de l'Homme remained unpublished during its author's lifetime. Nonetheless, Descartes retained the manuscript throughout his peripatetic life; he also appears to have made at least two copies for friends (Otegem, 2002: II, 485–536), through whom in turn his physiological studies acquired a limited dissemination. In 1648, Descartes revisited his early work in physiology; he reported that it was almost illegible, due to the condition of the manuscript, and he began to draft a supplementary sketch of the conception and birth of animals in a manuscript entitled Description du Corps Humain.

Both unpublished texts were still in poor condition when Descartes died in 1650. Among other deficiencies, they lacked most of the diagrams that were required to make his theory intelligible to readers, which Descartes had been unable to draw. Since Clerselier was equally incapable of providing adequate illustrations, he invited various people to prepare them. A number of those who understood Cartesian physiology (including Henricus Regius) refused to cooperate. Clerselier eventually identified two willing collaborators; one was Louis de la Forge, in Saumur, and the other was Gerard van Gutschoven (1615–68), a professor of anatomy in Louvain. Clerselier accepted both offers of assistance and published their illustrations in the first edition. When the results of their artistic efforts coincided, he usually preferred those of Gutschoven because they were better drawn; however, when they differed, he published both and used the letters ‘F’ and ‘G’ to identify their respective authors. La Forge was thus credited with seven of the published illustrations. Descartes' Traité de l'Homme, with these illustrations and extensive notes by La Forge, was published in Paris in April 1664. Thus La Forge's first publication was the lengthy set of notes that explain various features of Descartes' Traité, which appeared as Remarques on pp. 171–408 of the first French edition of that work. Meantime, Florentius Schuyl (1619­–69) had already published independently a Latin translation of the manuscript of the Traité in 1662, under the title De Homine (Descartes 1662).

While preparing his explanatory notes for the French edition of Descartes' Traité de l'Homme, La Forge adverted to the opening sentences of that book, which referred to the hypothetical men described in it:

These men will be composed, as we are, of a soul and body. First I must describe the body on its own; then the soul, again on its own; and finally I must show how these two natures would have to be joined and united in order to constitute men who resemble us. (CSM I, 98)

Since Descartes died before he had completed even the first of these three stages, La Forge decided to fill the lacuna by developing what he believed Descartes would have written about the human mind and its union with the body had he had time to complete his theory, and he did so by borrowing extensively from Descartes' published and unpublished work. The result was the Traité de l'Esprit de l'Homme, which was composed contemporaneously with La Forge's commentary on Descartes' Traité de l'Homme, and in which he referred on numerous occasions to a work in progress on the human mind (H 172, 262, 299, 315, 334, 335). This treatise was printed in Paris in November 1665, although the publication date on the title page was 1666.

There is no official record of La Forge's death. However, Clerselier confirmed in the preface to the third volume of Descartes' correspondence (which was printed in September 1666) that La Forge had died soon after publishing his Traité de l'Esprit de l'Homme (Clerselier 1667: Preface ã2). It seems likely that he died sometime in early 1666, at the age of thirty-three.

2. Explanation

La Forge endorsed fully Descartes' critique of the use of faculties or powers in scholastic explanations. He reported that, for example, many physicians attributed the beating of the heart to a pulsific faculty of the soul, and added:

one cannot deny that the heart has a faculty of beating since it does indeed beat … however, here and in many other places this word [faculty] is useless and does nothing to explain how the thing occurs. (H 183)

Likewise he asked:

does one really explain the cause of diarrhoea, for example, by saying that it results either from the fact that the expulsive faculty of the intestines is irritated or that their retentive faculty is weak? Is that not the same as saying, in good French, that I know nothing about it? (H 217)

He argued that all appeals to faculties and powers were nothing more than re-descriptions of the phenomena that need to be explained.

In physiology, La Forge supported an alternative Cartesian model of explanation in terms of parts of matter in motion which, when linked together by contact action, form a machine.

By the word “machine” one cannot understand anything other than a body composed of many organic parts, which, united together, combine to produce some movements that they would be incapable of producing if they were separated. (H 173)

This concept of a machine applies

not only to watches or other automata … but to the human body and that of all animals, and even the whole universe could be considered a machine. (H 173)

Accordingly, the disciples of Descartes

try to explain everything that occurs in an animal in the same way as the movements of an automaton occur. (H 335)

The same principle had been identified by critics of Cartesianism as one of its major defects rather than one of its strengths.

Assuming that the motions and interactions of parts of matter are sufficient to explain the human body, La Forge acknowledges that the explanatory enterprise must be hypothetical, and that hypotheses cannot be restricted to what is visible to the naked eye.

We would be very ignorant if we had to doubt everything that we do not see … one surely sees that the Sun and the Moon are sometimes in the East … and sometimes in the West, but one has never seen them move there; nevertheless almost no one doubts their movement. (H 217)

For similar reasons, one should not reject Descartes' assumptions about parts of matter in motion in the human body (such as animal spirits or the nerves) simply because, given their size, they are unobservable. Although Descartes and La Forge were attempting to describe parts of the human body and their motions before the invention of the microscope, the methodological issue involved would not have changed even if the threshold of observability had been modified by optical instruments: the Cartesian theory of explanation supported the postulation of unobservable particles of matter to explain visible effects whenever they were thought necessary. Their explanatory role justified their hypothetical postulation.

This required La Forge to address the topical question about how, and the extent to which, explanatory hypotheses may be confirmed. He offered the same solution that was supported by other natural philosophers in the seventeenth century, such as Robert Boyle or Christiaan Huygens:

However, hypotheses are not only probable but also indubitable when they explain something very clearly and easily, when our senses do not contradict them, when reason shows that the phenomenon in question could not occur otherwise and it is deduced from principles that are certain, and when the hypotheses serve not only to explain one single effect but many different and even distinct effects; for it would be impossible for hypotheses not to be found defective in some situation if they were not true. (H 218)

Although he exaggerated the degree of certainty that could be legitimately claimed for his hypotheses, La Forge did not claim explicitly that all explanations must be mechanical. He is best understood as contrasting the emptiness of scholastic explanations, which were certain but non-explanatory, with the epistemic risks involved in postulating hypotheses that were at least intelligible (since they involved only pieces of matter in motion) and were confirmed indirectly by their explanatory success. The limited choices available among physiological explanations at that time (either scholastic faculties, or matter in motion) did not imply any conclusion about how the discipline could develop at a later time.

3. Substance Dualism

La Forge was among the first commentators to attribute to Descartes an unambiguous dualism of mind and body. He defined a substance as ‘a thing in which some property, quality or attribute (of which we have a real idea in ourselves) resides immediately as in a subject and by which it exists’ (H preface ù3). His Remarks were designed to extend the explanatory scope of the machine model of the body to include all the actions of non-human animals and, in the case of the human body, to explain how ideas arise in the brain, how they are stored in memory, and how they are re-activated in the imagination. Accordingly, he initially used the word ‘idea’, as Descartes had done, to refer to the brain-states that are associated with the occurrence of thoughts in the mind (H 262), and he defined memory as the physical capacity of the brain to facilitate the repeated occurrence of such traces. Since the relevant brain-events were understood as patterns in the flow of animal spirits, memory was explained as an acquired disposition of the paths through which animal spirits flowed to re-open on subsequent occasions when appropriately stimulated (Sutton 1998).

Memory, which consists in nothing else, when considered from the perspective of the body, than the facility which remains in the pores [of the brain] which had been opened previously to re-open subsequently. (H 304; cf. T 280–81: THM 178)

This Cartesian use of the term ‘idea’ was ambiguous, since it referred to thoughts in the mind and the brain-states that accompany them. For that reason, La Forge decided in the Treatise to restrict the use of the term to thoughts, and to rename physical ideas in the brain as ‘corporeal species’ (T 158, 256; THM 77, 159).

According to this theory, the delicate fluid material called ‘animal spirits’ functions in a quasi-hydraulic machine (T 279; THM 177). Impressions on the external senses are transmitted to the ‘common sense’ in the brain, and the patterns in which animal spirits emerge from the brain in response to external stimuli are corporeal species. All voluntary or involuntary bodily actions, such as walking or blinking, are explained by the motion of animal spirits from the brain to the muscles, while internal sensations (such as hunger or thirst) are likewise experienced by the subject as a result of associated motions of animal spirits in the opposite direction, from other parts of the body to the brain. Even the passions or emotions are triggered by similar mechanisms. Thus everything that occurs in a human body may be explained by the motion of various kinds of matter in its various parts (e.g., the brain, nervous system, or the veins and arteries). The only exception in human nature to this type of physiological explanation, i.e., thought, was reserved exclusively to the mind.

La Forge began the Traité (1666) with a lengthy preface in which he compared Descartes' theory of the human mind with that of Augustine, from whom he quoted extensively to show that the mind is a distinct substance that is immaterial and survives the death of the body. This immaterial substance has two characteristic properties, by which alone it is known: understanding and willing. The understanding can generate ideas or conceptions of realities that have never been observed or imagined, and to that extent it is independent of the human body. Pure understanding ‘is a faculty which is independent of the body in the same way as the will is’ (T 292; THM 188).

Thus ideas originate in the mind in two distinct ways: in one case, they are triggered by sensations, and in the other they arise without any corresponding bodily stimulus. However, La Forge also repeated Descartes' theory of the origin of ideas, according to which all ideas are innate (in some sense) in the mind. He identified the ‘principal and effective’ cause of ideas as the mind, while bodily sensations were described as the ‘remote and occasional’ causes of some ideas. The argument here seemed to depend on the dissimilarity between the body and the mind:

Although one could say that the bodies that surround our bodies … are in some sense the cause of the ideas we then have … because these are material substances, the action of which does not extend to the soul insofar as it is simply a thing which thinks … they cannot be more than their remote and occasional causes which, by the union of mind and body, cause our faculty to think and determines it to produce ideas of which the faculty of thinking itself is the principal and effective cause. (T 176; THM 92)

The mind is thus an active cause of all its own ideas, including those that it generates on the occasion of being stimulated by the senses. In that sense, all ideas are innate because the mind is their principal and effective cause.

The will is equally active; it is an

active power … of choosing or determining ourselves from within ourselves to everything to which we determine ourselves. (T 182; THM 97)

La Forge argued that, in addition to understanding and willing, the human mind must have an intellectual memory; since it can reason about purely spiritual realities, and since reasoning involves moving from one step to another and remembering those on which one relies for progress, the human mind must be capable of remembering purely spiritual concepts of which it has had no corresponding corporeal species (T 291; THM 187). La Forge concludes in Chapter xxv that the human mind is immortal; since its essence is to think, the mind continues to think constantly for eternity and may also remember things that do not presuppose the presence of a body.

The stark definition of the human mind and body as distinct, simple substances did not prevent La Forge from describing their union in human nature as a ‘composite subject’ (T 112; THM 39) and as ‘a unity of composition and association’ (T 98; THM 28). It is known from experience that there is some kind of union involved here, which Descartes had struggled to describe in terms of an intermingling of two substances. La Forge describes it more analytically in causal terms; it consists in

a mutual and reciprocal dependence of thoughts of one of them on the movements of the other, and in the mutual interaction of their actions and passions. (T 210; THM 122)

La Forge frequently describes this interaction in causal terms, apparently without qualification or reservation. Accordingly, external bodies that interact with our sensory organs ‘cause’ sensations in us; the motions of external stimuli are the ‘true causes’ of our sensory perceptions (T 165, 326; THM 83, 215). The interaction of mind and body is reciprocal,

for not only can the body stimulate (exciter) various thoughts in the mind, but the mind can also cause (causer) various movements in the body. (T 215; THM 126)

In general, the link between the human mind and body

must consist in the relation or concurrence of the actions and passions of the mind and body. (T 212; THM 124)

Critics of substance dualism claimed, or assumed without argument, that it concealed an explanatory gap, since it failed to explain how two substances that were so dissimilar could interact causally with each other. La Forge addressed that issue in Chapter XVI of the Traité.

4. Occasionalism

La Forge borrowed a distinction from Suarez and other scholastic philosophers between univocal and equivocal causes. The former were causes that resembled their effects (as when one fire causes another), while the latter were causes that were dissimilar to their effects. The degree of dissimilarity that was required for this distinction was unspecified; for example, could a living creature give rise to a dead one if ‘living’ and ‘dead’ are exact opposites? Thus a metaphysical distinction originated from an inadequately analysed description of observable properties. Without addressing that issue, La Forge argued that even radical dissimilarity could not constitute a valid objection in principle to the efficacy of a putative cause; otherwise God, the supreme cause of everything, could not cause creatures that are so dissimilar to his nature (T 213; THM 124). The assumption that the term ‘cause’ could be applied univocally to God and to natural events concealed a major assumption, which facilitated the transition to occasionalism for which La Forge then argued.

Assuming that God is the cause of creation, then a fortiori the mere dissimilarity between minds and bodies could not be an objection to their reciprocal causal interaction. In fact, La Forge claims that

it is no more difficult to conceive how the human mind … can move the body and how the body … can act on the mind, than to conceive how a body has the power to move itself and to communicate its motion to another body. (T 235; THM 143)

What is needed, initially, is a general explanation of how one thing can be a ‘cause’ of something else, and La Forge begins to address that issue by inquiring how one body moves another on impact.

One can observe that heavy bodies fall towards the earth, and that the motions of bodies change in systematic patterns as a result of impact. However, one cannot observe why bodies fall or how movement is transferred from one body to another on impact. To understand the cause of such motions, La Forge proposed a distinction between the observable or local motion of a body and the force that causes its motion. He defined local motion, as Descartes had done in the Principles of Philosophy (CSM I, 233), as the transfer of a body from the vicinity of those with which it is immediately in contact and which are regarded as at rest to the vicinity of others. In that sense, motion is a mode of a body that cannot be separated from that body and, therefore, cannot be transferred to others. In contrast, the motive force (force de mouvoir) that moves a body is distinct from the moved body. La Forge argued as follows:

Now if the force which moves is distinct from the thing which is moved and if bodies alone can be moved, it follows clearly that no body can have the power of self-movement in itself. For if that were the case this force would not be distinct from the body, because no attribute or property is distinct from the thing to which it belongs. If a body cannot move itself, it is obvious in my opinion that it cannot move another body. Therefore every body which is in motion must be pushed by something which is not itself a body and which is completely distinct (entièrement distinguée) from it. (T 238; THM 145)

It is difficult to understand how this argument is supposed to work.

There is at least a conceptual distinction between the change of location of a body and whatever causes that change; the latter is the cause of the former, which is its effect. The link between that premise and La Forge's conclusion depends on adopting the definition of a ‘real distinction’ that he had borrowed from Descartes. According to that definition, a real distinction obtains only between one substance and another (or between one substance and the modes or properties of another). Thus there cannot be a real distinction, in this sense, between any body and its own properties, such as its motion or shape. Descartes had concluded that the modes of one substance cannot be transferred to another; for example, the shape of one body cannot be transferred to another. This way of talking assumes an understanding of modes that ties them, by definition, with the thing or substance to which they are attributed. Thus, if one body loses its cubic shape and another one gains a similar shape, the shape of the latter could not be the ‘same’ shape as that of the former body even if they had exactly similar dimensions.

Although La Forge does not use the phrase ‘real distinction’ in the passage quoted above (he uses the verb ‘distinguer’ throughout), the argument works only if that is assumed. It could be restated as follows:

  1. There is a real distinction (in Descartes' sense) between local motion and the motive force that causes it.
  2. There is no real distinction between a body and its modes.
  3. Therefore, the motive force that causes motion is not a mode of any body and is ‘completely distinct’ from it.

This implies that the motive force that explains why bodies move must be either a substance or a property of some other reality apart from bodies; if it is a property, the only other kind of entity to which it can be attributed in a Cartesian universe is a spiritual substance of some kind.

La Forge acknowledges later in the same text that he had assumed a real distinction between motion and force. He provides a supplementary supporting argument for that premise and, in doing so, he uses the phrase ‘really distinct’.

… if the force which transfers and which thereby applies bodies to each other could belong to them in such a way that the thing which is moved were itself the principle of its motion and this force were identical with it, then the notion of this force would have to include in its concept the idea of extension, as the other modes of body do. This is not the case. Therefore … the force which moves is no less really distinct (distinguée réellement) from matter than thought is and it belongs as much as thought to a spiritual substance. (T 238; THM 145)

La Forge assumes that Cartesian bodies are defined by extension, and therefore that any concept of a genuinely bodily mode (such as shape) must include the concept of extension. To reach the negative conclusion that force is not a mode of bodies, he argues that the concept of force contains no relation to the concept of extension. This argument seems to parallel his objection to the scholastic concept of weight, which he describes as inconceivable

because we could not imagine what it is and, in respect of bodies, we understand only what our imagination is capable of conceiving. (T 239; THM 144)

However, that kind of conceptual empiricism is inconsistent with the well-known Cartesian argument concerning the limitations of the imagination in the Sixth Meditation (CSM II, 50–51), and with La Forge's own discussion of the powers of the imagination, which includes the summary statement:

we perceive many properties of bodies by the understanding … which we could not imagine. (T 263; THM 165)

Thus a failure to imagine force, in the same way that we imagine the shape or size of a body, does not imply that it is incapable of being a mode of matter.

Despite this, La Forge concludes that force cannot be a mode of bodies. Since the human soul is linked to a body without being one of its modes, that suggests the possibility that motive force might be a substance, or it might be vaguely substantial like the ‘real qualities’ of the Schools, which could be distributed between bodies as divisible accidents. La Forge dismissed both solutions; he concluded without further argument that the motive force that moves bodies is not a substance, and that it must therefore belong to some spiritual substance.

This coincides with a suggestion that Clerselier had made in a letter to La Forge (4 December 1660) and which, though obviously not a letter to or from Descartes, was included in the third volume of Descartes' correspondence (Clerselier 1667: 640–46). Clerselier had distinguished, as had Descartes and La Forge, between the local motion of a body and the determination of that motion (which included its direction). He also suggested that since force belongs to a spiritual substance, it must be attributed to either an infinite or a finite spiritual substance. Clerselier combined these suggestions to propose that the force that causes motion comes from God, while finite spirits cause only the determination of motions that already exist (Clerselier 1667: 641–2). In other words, God exclusively provided the total quantum of motion in the universe, and human minds act merely to redirect motions that are already present in bodies.

La Forge offered an alternative path to this conclusion in the following thought experiment. Imagine that all motion was removed from the matter in the universe. How could it then acquire motion?

… among all the parts of this formless mass, [is] there one which could move itself or move its neighbour? It is easy to decide in the negative because extension, in which the nature of body in general consists and which is the only quality which it retains in this condition, is not active… not only can it not change its condition by its own power; I also claim that there is no creature, spiritual or corporeal, which can cause change in it or in any of its parts, in the second moment of their creation, if the Creator does not do so himself. (T 239–40; THM 146–7)

It is not clear whether the concept of an ‘active’ body is taken to be an independent and intuitively clear concept (are moving bodies not active?), or whether it merely repeats the claim already made that bodies as such do not contain any motive force. Assuming that matter is not necessarily active in the latter sense, it could begin to move only if an external source of motive force were applied to it. Since God was assumed to be the creator of matter, it seemed as if God were also the only possible source of motive force.

In the course of this argument, La Forge has introduced a divine creation to explain how matter might initially acquire motion. If God were left out of the discussion, one could accept the claim that motionless matter is conceivable, and therefore that motion is an additional quality or attribute that requires an explanation. La Forge argues (as Descartes had done: CSM I, 237–9) that it would be impossible to move only one part of matter without moving others in its vicinity, because matter is impenetrable; therefore, any given part of matter could move only if other parts move to make room for its relocation. One may conclude, if the language of God as cause is re-introduced, that God could move one part of matter only by moving some other contiguous parts simultaneously.

However, the conclusion for which La Forge argues is a more radical one: that ‘no body has the power to move itself’ and ‘that the force which moves it must belong to some other substance’ (T 241; THM 147). Since he also assumed that God created the universe, and since motive force was an extra property that is really distinct from matter, he concluded that ‘God is the first, universal and total cause of motion’ (ibid.). This still left open at least two alternative theological interpretations.

One is that God created the universe of matter in motion, as in the Genesis account, and also the laws by which nature is regulated, and that he then left creation to operate in accordance with those laws. Descartes had made a significant contribution to dynamics by showing that it is not necessary to explain why bodies in motion continue to move, and that an explanation is required only for a change in the condition of motion or rest of a given body. That implies that, once we assume the existence of bodies in motion (however that came about), no further explanation is required of why bodies in motion continue to move. However, the apparent transfer of motion from one body to another requires an explanation, and this explanandum remains to be addressed even if God created matter in motion.

The other alternative is to think of God as continuously involved in the conservation of the universe, so that his causal activity continues throughout time. La Forge adopts this second option.

Just as He had to use his omnipotent word to draw the whole of nature out of nothingness, it is also by means of this word that He drew this same nature out of chaos by producing motion in it. And just as nature would revert to nothingness if He ceased drawing it out from it at every moment in which He conserves it, it would likewise return to its pristine confusion if He did not maintain the motion which He produced (T 241; THM 147–8).

He adds another unsupported premise: that it would amount to inconstancy on God's part if he were to change the total quantity of motion in the universe.

The thesis about God's creative action (however it is understood in relation to time) begins to implode when La Forge accepts the traditional scholastic view that ‘everything that is in God is God himself.’ That principle implies that ‘this force [which moves bodies] is nothing other than God’ (T 242; THM 148). According to La Forge, therefore, it is possible for something that is identical with God (i.e., motive force) to be distributed in matter and to be transferred from one body to another when they collide. One might object that it is even more difficult to explain how a property of God—or God Himself, since there is no distinction between God and His properties—is transferred from one body to another on impact than to explain the observable phenomena of colliding bodies without any mention of God. Alternatively, La Forge assumes that something that is observable but not understood is ‘explained’ by something else (i.e., God's powers and attributes) that, in principle, is both unobservable and beyond our understanding. It seems as if La Forge has breached the fundamental Cartesian prohibition, that one not pretend to explain something that is not understood by means of something else that is even less well understood.

When faced with this objection, God's omnipotence fills the explanatory gap, because God can do anything, even things that are not conceivable to us. A theological belief has been substituted for a mechanical explanation.

Although La Forge concluded that ‘God is the universal cause of all the motions which occur in the world’, he also recognised ‘bodies and minds as particular causes of these same motions … in determining and compelling the first cause to apply his force and motive power to the bodies to which he would not otherwise have applied it’ in accordance with laws of nature that God decreed (T 242: THM 148). He confirmed this view when he wrote, in relation to the reciprocal interaction of motions in the human body and thoughts in the mind:

One should not say that it is God who does everything and that the body and mind do not really act on each other. For if the body had not had such a movement, the mind would never have had such a thought, and if the mind had not had such a thought the body might also never have had such a movement. (T 245; THM 150)

God has arranged matters, in human nature, so that certain thoughts in the mind are accompanied by changes in the brain, and certain motions of animal spirits trigger specific thoughts in the mind. God's creative arrangement by which these twinned realities interact provides the ultimate explanation (if it is such) of a familiar fact of our experience. In that sense, the role of God in relation to mind-body interaction is exactly similar to God's role in relation to body-body interactions.

Despite these explicit confirmations of the efficacy of dependent causes (i.e., those that are other than God), it is difficult to avoid the conclusion that La Forge assumes a clear conception of how God's creative action operates, and that the sufficiency of God's causation makes the causation of natural events redundant. Nonetheless, La Forge failed to provide any account of how God creates, what kind of activity is involved in creation, and how it can give rise to effects that are significantly dissimilar to the divine cause. One might expect him to have argued in the opposite direction, from an understanding of causation in nature (however imperfect it may be) to a conception that is acknowledged to be less clear, and merely analogical, of causation in God.

Secondly, La Forge's conception of a continuous divine creation remains opaque. He assumed a scholastic distinction between two kinds of cause, a causa secundum fieri and a causa secundum esse. The former applies to cases where an effect continues to exist (as a thing) even when the relevant causal activity ceases. In that sense, an effective builder can stop building once a house has been completed, and the house continues to exist. The second type of causation applies when an effect occurs only as long as the cause remains active, as when the Sun heats the earth. If God's creative action were understood by analogy with the work of an artisan, as in the opening chapter of Genesis, it is unclear why God must continue to create if He wishes to prevent creation from lapsing back into nothingness.

The use of tensed language to speak about God, as if He acted in time, was prohibited in principle by those who constructed the medieval concept of a creative God. This may have provided a reason to speak of God, in a kind of atemporal present tense, as creating the universe, and that in turn may have suggested that one should think of God as a causa secundum esse. According to this metaphor, God sustains every created thing in existence and nature would revert back into nothingness if God did not maintain it in existence from one moment to the next. However, that seems to be something that theists say about the effects of God's creation (i.e., that their existence depends on His creative action), rather than about some activity in God which creates (i.e., that it is continuous, and is subject to temporal qualifications).

Having adopted the language of continuous creation, La Forge uses it to extend God's causal activity into the details of each body's modes. For example, God could not create a body, such as a block of marble, in some generic way that abstracts from its precise location in space and time, because those modes are (according to Descartes's definition) inseparable from the body. He must create it either in motion or at rest, at a specific place and time, and He must do likewise for all other bodies in its vicinity.

Since it was He who produced this part of matter in place A, for example, not only must he continue to produce it if He wishes it to continue to exist but also, since He cannot create it everywhere or nowhere, He must put it in place B himself if He wishes it to be there. For if He put it anywhere else there is no force capable of removing it from that location. (T 240; THM 147)

However, by extending God's creative activity in this way to the modes of bodies, La Forge seems to reduce the whole account to incoherence, because the same considerations would apply to human minds, as Nadler points out (Nadler 2011: 123–41). God could not create a human mind without its specific modes, which include all its thoughts and acts of the will. However, acts of the will as modes of a human mind are assumed by La Forge to be the basis on which human minds are genuinely active in determining themselves. If God creates even the acts of will of individual agents, it seems to undermine the claim that they are self-determining when, according to La Forge, they are determined by God's creative activity.

This conclusion is an exact parallel, in an occasionalist account of natural causation, to the theological controversy about God's grace that engulfed both Catholicism and Calvinism in the same period. Those who emphasized the sufficiency of grace to explain morally meritorious human action concluded that the human will was therefore inefficacious in relation to the same actions. To avoid these unwelcome conclusions about nature and grace, God's creative action would have to be described as some transcendent and unintelligible event, and the causation of natural events and human decisions should be explained, insofar as it is possible, without reference to the dominant causation of God.

Thirdly, La Forge seems to have understood causation by analogy with human agency, in which a cause does something—such as building a house or injuring an enemy—and an effect is sufficiently distinct to be observed as such. The conceptual limitations of this framework were exacerbated by conceiving of the causal activity in terms of something passing from the cause to the effect. Once motion was defined in Cartesian terms as a mode that, like shape, is inseparable from the substance of which it is a mode, it was conceptually impossible for the motion of one body to be shared with another or to pass from one to another. The metaphor of something being transferred from a cause to its effect was incompatible with the Cartesian definition of motion as a mode that is inseparable from its host body.

Nonetheless, a similar restriction was not applied to motive force when it was attributed to God. Therefore it remains as obscure as ever how this property of God (rather than of bodies), which is not distinguishable from God, could be maintained at a constant level in the effects of his creative action without identifying the natural world with God, and without leaving unresolved the original explanandum, namely, how motive force is transferred between bodies on impact.

Once this occasionalist account of causation had been adopted to explain what happens when bodies collide and, as a result, how they change their speed or direction, there was no new challenge in explaining how human minds and bodies interact. The assumed dominance and efficacy of divine causation made the human mind a mere occasion on which appropriate motions are triggered in the body, and motions in the body (such as those associated with sensations) became the occasions on which thoughts are caused in the mind. As in the case of body-body causation, this account provides no genuine understanding of what occurs in mind-body interactions; instead, it transfers the explanandum to God, for whom all such causal interactions are easy to achieve, even if they remain unexplained to us.

In his discussion of ‘How the Mind and Body Act on each other, and how one Body moves another’ (T 235;THM 143), La Forge took the first tentative steps towards occasionalism, without realizing the revolutionary implications of what he believed was a restatement of the philosophy of Descartes.


La Forge's Works

  • [H] Clerselier, Claude (ed.), 1664, L'Homme de René Descartes et un Traitté de la Formation du Foetus du mesme autheur, Avec les Remarques de Louys de la Forge, Docteur en Medicine, demeurant à La Fleche, sur le Traité de René Descartes; & sur les Figures par luy inventées, Paris: Charles Angot.
  • La Forge, Louis de, 1666, Traitté de l'Esprit de l'Homme, de ses facultez et fonctions, et de son union avec le corps. Suivant les Principes de René Descartes, Paris: Theodore Girard. [Another printing the same year, in Paris, by Michel Bobin and Nicolas Le Gras.]
  • La Forge, Louis, 1669, Tractatus de Mente Humana, Ejus Facultatibus & Functionibus, Nec non De ejusdem unione cum corpore; secundum Principia Renati Descartes, Amsterdam: Daniel Elzevier. [a posthumous Latin translation]
  • [T] La Forge, Louis de, 1974, Oeuvres philosophiques, avec une étude bio-bibliographique, Pierre Claire (ed.), Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
  • [THM] La Forge, Louis de, 1997, Treatise on the Human Mind, trans. Desmond M. Clarke, Dordrecht: Kluwer.

Related Early Works

  • Clerselier, Claude (ed.), 1657, 1659, 1667, Lettres de Mr Descartes, 3 vols., Paris: Charles Angot.
  • Cordemoy, Géraud de, 1666, Le Discernement du Corps et de l'Ame en six Discours, pour servir à l'éclaircissement de la Physique, Paris: Florentin Lambert.
  • Cordemoy, Géraud de, 1968, Oeuvres philosophiques, P. Clair and F. Girbal (eds.), Paris: Presses universitaires de France.
  • Cottingham, J., R. Stoothoff, and D. Murdoch (eds.), 1984–85, The Philosophical Works of Descartes, 2 vols., Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. [CSM]
  • Descartes, René, 1662, De homine; figuris et latinitate donatus a F. Schuyl, Leiden: Leffer & Moyardus.
  • Descartes, René, 1972, Treatise of Man, trans. Thomas S. Hall, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Descartes, René, 1996, Le Monde, L'Homme, Annie Bitbol-Hespériès (ed.), Paris: Éditions du Seuil.
  • Descartes, René, 1998, The World and Other Writings, trans. S. Gaukroger, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Clarke, Desmond M., 1989, Occult Powers and Hypotheses: Cartesian Natural Philosophy under Louis xiv, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Clarke, Desmond M., 2003, Descartes's Theory of Mind, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Nadler, Steven, 2011, Occasionalism: Causation Among the Cartesians, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Ott, Walter, 2009, Causation and Laws of Nature in Early Modern Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Sutton, John, 1998, Philosophy and Memory Traces: Descartes to Connectionism, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Van Otegem, Matthijs, 2002, A Bibliography of the Works of Descartes (1637–1704), 2 vols., Utrecht: Zeno (The Leiden-Utrecht Research Institute of Philosophy).

Other Internet Resources

  • Occasionalism, by Jason Jordan (U. Oregon), in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

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Desmond Clarke <clarkedesmond@gmail.com>

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