Justice as a Virtue

First published Fri Mar 8, 2002; substantive revision Thu Jan 21, 2016

The notion of justice as a virtue began in reference to a trait of individuals, and to some extent remains so, even if today we often conceive the justice of individuals as having some (grounding) reference to social justice. But from the start, the focus on justice as a virtue faced pressures to diffuse, in two different ways.

First, “justice as a virtue” is ambiguous as between individual and social applications. Rawls and others regard justice as “the first virtue of social institutions” (1971, p. 3), but Rawls is not the first to think of justice as a virtue of social institutions or societies — Plato was there long before him. However, justice as a virtue of societies, polities, and their institutions is addressed elsewhere, so the focus in this essay will be on justice as a virtue in individuals. That said, individuals typically live as members of political communities, so the societal dimension of justice as a virtue will never be long out of view.

Second, from the start the effort to analyze the virtue of justice has led to attempts to formalize the requirements (or norms) of justice, and at times the latter project has threatened to swallow the first in ways that make thinking of a virtue of justice gratuitous or otiose. We might be tempted to think that the virtue of justice consists simply in compliance with the norms of justice our theory specifies: a just person will be one who complies with the norms of justice, whether those are narrowly interpersonal or more broadly social or political in scope. In this way the virtue becomes subsidiary to norms of justice independently specified. Doing so threatens to lose the force that the notion of virtue had in the earliest thinking about justice.

A further complication is that even the idea of justice as a virtue of individuals seems ambiguous in regard to scope. Plato in the Republic treats justice as an overarching virtue of both individuals and societies, so that almost every issue he (or we) would regard as ethical comes in under the notion of justice. But in later usages justice covers only part of individual morality, and we don't readily think of someone as unjust if they lie or neglect their children — other epithets more readily spring to mind. Individual justice first and most readily regards moral issues having to do with distributions of goods or property. It is, we say, unjust for someone to steal from people or not to give them what he owes them, and it is also unjust if someone called upon to distribute something good (or bad or both) among members of a group uses an arbitrary or unjustified basis for making the distribution. Discussion of justice as an individual virtue often centers on questions, therefore, about property and other distributable goods, though the broader sense broached by Plato never entirely disappears.

1. History

1.1 Ancient

Philosophical discussion of justice begins with Plato, who treats the topic in a variety of dialogues, most substantially in Republic. There Plato offers the first sustained discussion of the nature of justice (dikaiosune) and its relation to happiness, as a departure from three alternatives receiving varying degrees of attention. First, there is a traditionalist conception of justice (speaking the truth and paying your debts). Second, Plato has Socrates rebut the Sophist conception of justice which built on a distinction between nature (phusis) and convention (nomos) As Plato has this conception articulated by Thrasymachus in Book I, justice is simply the “advantage of the stronger,” not tracking anything like the sort of value attributed to it by traditionalists. Finally, Plato has Socrates confront a conventionalist conception of justice that anticipates modern contractarian views, in which justice — forbearing preying on others in exchange for not being preyed on by them — is a “second-best alternative,” not as good as being able to prey at will upon others, but better than being the prey of others. These last two challenges give rise to the central question of the book: to whose advantage is justice? Would we really be better off being unjust if we could get away with it? Plato’s negative answer to that question is the project of the balance of the work.

Plato’s method involves the provocative idea that justice in the city (polis) is the same thing as justice in the individual, just “writ large.” There are good reasons to worry about that assumption (Williams 1973; Keyt 2006). But in Plato’s sociology of the city, there are three classes engaged in a kind of division of labor. There is a guardian class which rules, a class of “auxiliaries” that provide the force behind the ruling, and the class of merchants that produce to satisfy the needs and desires of the city. Similarly, the psyche of the individual has three parts: a reasoning part to rule, a “spirited” part to support the rule of reason, and an appetitive part. Plato finds justice in the city to consist in each part “having and doing its own,” and since the smaller is just like the larger, justice in the individual consists in each part of the psyche doing its own work. (This grounds the idea, later enshrined by Justinian, that justice is “giving every man his due;” Justinian I.i). Further, Plato argues, justice is a master virtue in a sense, because in both the city and the psyche, if each part is doing its own job, both city and psyche will also have wisdom, courage, and moderation or self-discipline. This conception of justice sustains the contrast with the conventionalist view advocated by the Sophists. On the other hand, at least initially it leaves it an open question whether the just individual refrains from such socially proscribed actions as lying, killing, and stealing. Plato eventually seeks to show that someone with a healthy, harmonious soul wouldn't lie, kill, or steal, but it is not clear that argument succeeds, nor, if it does, that that is the right understanding of why we ought not to lie, kill, or steal (Sachs 1963, LeBar 2013, ch. XII).

Plato gives a somewhat different treatment of justice in Crito, in which Socrates’ eponymous friend attempts to persuade Socrates to accept his (Crito’s) offer to bribe a way out of the death sentence Socrates is waiting to have executed. Here Plato’s arguments first associate the just life with the good life, thus the life Socrates has most reason to live. And justice, he then argues, requires not only not inflicting wrong or injury on others, even in response to wrongs from them, but fulfilling one’s agreements, and — in particular — abiding by one’s (tacit or explicit) agreement to abide by the laws of the city unless one can persuade it to change them. Of course, justice cannot require one to abide by laws that require one to act unjustly, as Socrates’ own case (as characterized in Apology) shows (Kraut 1984).

Aristotle does not see the virtue of justice in quite the comprehensive sense Plato does; he treats it as a virtue of character (in the entirety of one of the ten books of the Nicomachean Ethics, also common to the Eudemian Ethics), and as a virtue of constitutions and political arrangements (in Politics). The question naturally arises as to the relation between these forms of justice. Aristotle seems to think they are closely related, without being synonymous applications of the same concept. As the latter is a conception of political justice, we will focus here on the former. Justice as a personal virtue follows Aristotle’s model for virtues of character, in which the virtue lies as an intermediate or mean between vices of excess and defect (Nicomachean Ethics V). While he grants that there is a “general” sense of justice in which justice is coincident with complete virtue, there is a “particular” sense in which it is concerned with not overreaching (pleonexia). It is not clear, however, exactly how Aristotle understands this arrangement, or the nature of the vices of excess and defect which this particular justice is to counteract. One very plausible reading has it that justice is opposed to a desire for maldistribution of “goods of fortune” such as money, fame, or honor (Williams 1980, Curzer 1995). On another it is opposed to an insufficient attention to others’ rights (Foot 1988, p. 9). On still another it focuses on the goods of others, or common goods (O’Connor 1988, Miller 1995).

These issues remain open in part because Aristotle seems most interested in establishing a conception of the formal structure of justice, which seems to reflect a conception of desert. He distinguishes within particular justice between justice in distribution and justice in rectification. The former, he claims, adheres to a kind of proportionality, in which what each deserves is proportional to the relationship between the contributions. If A contributes twice as much as B (of whatever the metric of merit is relevant in some particular case), then A’s return ought also to be twice B’s. This conception of distributive justice obviously lends itself to “goods of fortune” — and to some goods, like wealth, more obviously than others — but it need not in principle be confined to such goods, although the examples Aristotle provides suggest such applications. Similarly, justice in rectification involves a sort of “arithmetical proportion.” If C defrauds D by amount X, then justice requires depriving C of X and restoring X to D, as a matter of reestablishing a kind of equality between them. These structural devices are elegant and attractive, but they leave open a number of questions. First, as indicated, to what are we to suppose they apply? Second, in what way do they figure into the nature of the person who is just in the particular sense? (That is, how are they related to justice as a virtue?) Does a model of particular justice as a virtue fit the general model of virtue as a mean, and if so, what sort of mean is it? Aristotle seems torn between a conception of justice as a virtue in his distinctive understanding of what a virtue is — with a requirement that one have all the virtues to have any (Nicomachean EthicsVI.13), and rooted in the doctrine of the mean — and justice as having the form of a formal normative structure, to which the virtue threatens to become subsidiary. All this is to leave aside questions of the relation between this particular sense of justice and political justice, and the role of the virtue of justice in the individual as it contributes to justice in the polis.

Epicurus’ conception of the role of justice was more central to his eudaimonism perhaps than its counterpart in Plato and Aristotle, but that reflects in part his distinctive understanding of eudaimonia, or happiness. For Epicurus this consisted in ataraxia — tranquility, or freedom from disturbance. Given that the good life is the life without disturbance, justice plays a key instrumental role. One might, Epicurus thinks, withdraw entirely from human society to avoid disturbance, but the alternative is to live socially under terms which secure the avoidance of disturbance. This is the structure of the ideal Epicurean community, in which each forbears aggression (Armstrong 1997, Thrasher 2013). Justice is a matter of keeping agreements generally, and in particular the agreement not to harm or transgress social norms.

In this way Epicurus offers a conception of the virtue of justice that harmonizes both its personal and its political dimensions. The personal virtue consists in the motivation to abide by a contract not to aggress or harm others. The political virtue inheres in a polity in which such norms regulate the conduct of its citizens, and these two dimensions of justice as a virtue reinforce each other.

The other great ethical tradition of antiquity (Stoicism) had remarkably little to say about justice (Annas 1993, p. 311), so we pass on to the modern period.

1.2 Modern

Both Plato and Aristotle were rationalists as regards both human knowledge and moral reasons, and what they say about the virtue of justice clearly reflects the commitment to rationalism. Much subsequent thinking about justice (especially in the Middle Ages) was influenced by Plato and Aristotle and likewise emphasized the role of reason both in perceiving what is just and in allowing us to act justly rather than to give in to contrary impulses or desires. Aquinas for example largely defends Aristotle’s account of justice, including Aristotle’s distinction between general and particular justice, and similarly grounds justice in a kind of proportionality among people.

But to the extent Christian writers allied themselves with Plato and Aristotle, they were downplaying another central element in Christian thought and morality, the emphasis on agapic love. Such love seems to be a matter of motivationally active feeling rather than of being rational, and some writers on morality (eventually) allowed this side of Christianity to have a major influence on what they had to say about virtue.

In particular, the “moral sentimentalists” Hutcheson and Hume treated morality as grounded in something other than reason, and the influence of Christian ideas and ideals of agapic love on Hutcheson (at least) is well documented. For Hutcheson, universal (i.e., impartial) benevolence is the highest and best of human motives, but we know this, not through reason, but through a moral sense (or sensitivity). Also, according to Hutcheson, the individual virtue of justice (ultimately) consists in being motivated by universal benevolence, and he explicitly denies that benevolence can ever conflict with true justice.

Hume saw (or believed he saw), however, that individual justice at least sometimes conflicts with what benevolence or even a simplistic prudence would motivate us to do. He is as much a sentimentalist as Hutcheson, believing that judgments about virtue and rightness depend on our passions rather than on some form of reason (or on a distinct moral sense). But he thinks that the sentimentalist owes us an account of how a sense of justice that is sometimes opposed to benevolence, sympathy, and apparent self-interest can nonetheless develop out of such motives. Motives like benevolence, curiosity, sympathy, and prudence Hume calls natural in the twofold sense that they exist apart from social convention(s) and that they do not require explicitly ethical thinking (or conscience) or in order to issue in action. But the virtue of justice is not natural, but rather should be considered “artificial,” according to Hume, because it depends for its existence on human conventions and artifices and because the primary motive to justice is a reflective recognition of its necessity for social life (Hume 1751).

Now Hume thinks of the individual virtue of justice quite narrowly as comprising a certain kind of respect for (other people's) property. The just person doesn't steal from others and returns what he has borrowed (and Hume points out the similarity of this usage to the Aristotelian notion that justice consists in everyone getting his due, what he merits). But there are other artificial virtues, according to Hume, among them fidelity (keeping one's promises), law-abidingness, and (feminine) modesty or chastity. Hume thinks that it is difficult to account for any one, or all, of these artificial virtues in (his own) empiricist anti-rationalist terms, and there are at least two reasons for this.

One has to do with the inadequacy of natural motives like benevolence or prudence for grounding the requirements of justice, given the scarcity of the means of meeting our needs. In primitive or simple societies, there may always be reasons of prudence to act justly with respect to the property of others: violations of justice are always likely to be detected by others and to lead to consequences one would prefer to avoid. In such circumstances honesty (a term Hume tends to use narrowly as synonymous with “justice”) really is the best policy. Furthermore, within the narrow confines of a small group, personal affection and benevolent concern for those one knows and lives with may lead one to refrain from violations of their property. But in a larger (and more advanced) society, things will be different.

In large-scale modern societies (of the sort Hume lived in) we may not know our neighbors, much less all those people our actions might affect, and the people whose property justice calls on us to respect include a vast majority who don't know us either. Under conditions of such relative anonymity and complexity, the identity of a thief may be much more difficult to ascertain, and if one (knows one) can get away with stealing on some occasions, then prudence is presumably incapable of motivating a just refusal or unwillingness to steal. More importantly, perhaps, the conditions of a modern society leave us without strong ties of affection to many of the people we interact with or may affect by our actions, and Hume thinks that normal humanity or humane benevolence isn't a strong enough motive to get us to refrain from a theft that would greatly benefit ourselves or our families (those we do have strong affections toward). So if we refrain from such theft, we cannot explain or justify such refraining by reference to any actual natural motives.

But of course we do (many of us) justly refrain from taking or violating other people's property on occasions when natural motives as such may seem incapable of explaining why we do, and Hume believes (not uncommonsensically) that it is artificial motives or motivation that explain why we do so. Someone who can get away with stealing and who has stronger reasons/motives of affection to steal than not to steal may nonetheless refrain from stealing because she thinks it unjust or wrong to steal. A sense of duty or conscience is thus for Hume absolutely essential to understanding the virtue and obligation of justice/honesty.

Moreover (and this is perhaps the most important point for Hume), even if human beings were capable of the strong universal and impartial benevolence that Hutcheson regarded as the cornerstone of moral virtue, such benevolence would not in all instances suffice for us to fulfill our intuitive obligations of justice. Justice and moral obligation sometimes seem opposed to the dictates of (what would be motivated by) universal benevolence, and Hume cites one's obligation (of justice) to return what one owes to a “seditious bigot” as one glaring instance of this point. Concern for the good of society or of humanity would presumably dictate that one not return to the bigot money or property he would use to subvert and corrupt society or the state, but, according to Hume, we nonetheless think it obligatory to return what we owe, and what gets us to do so, therefore, is a(n artificial) sense of duty (or justice) rather than any (even hypothetically imaginable) natural motive.

It is possible to question this, and Bentham, for example, claimed that his disagreement with Hume's view of our actual obligations in such cases was what initially led him to utilitarianism. However, the idea that we should return the money or property despite what free-wheeling prudence or benevolence would lead us to do is intuitively forceful, and Hume shows himself aware of the potential clash here between benevolence and justice in a way that Hutcheson was not. Moreover, we dwell at some length on Hume in part because the question of whether justice can be understood entirely in terms of natural motives is (as Hume rightly saw) absolutely crucial to understanding the nature of justice as an individual (or, for that matter, social) virtue.

Now if we agree that the right and just thing to do in cases like that of the seditious bigot is to return what one owes, then the importance of artificial motives looms large. But this leaves Hume with a problem (or a set of problems). Hume is an empiricist and an anti-rationalist who emphasizes feeling or sentiment as the basis of morality. But if natural motives can't explain the virtue of justice, then the sentimentalist owes us an account of how the artificial motives can develop to do the necessary work. Rationalists tend to think of the sense of duty as a response of reason to certain moral facts or relations, so if Hume is to maintain his sentimentalism, he needs (among other things) to explain to us (in terms compatible with his empiricist premises) how for example a sense of duty develops out of (or can exist as a) feeling or feelingful motivation. And, as is well known, Hume finds this extremely difficult to do.

Hume seeks to explain moral judgment and a sense of duty or conscientiousness based in such judgment in terms of the same mechanisms of sympathy that operate within and through the natural virtues. However, we tend to be more sympathetic with those near and dear to us, and moral judgment seeks or presupposes some sort of impartiality regarding those affected by or engaging in actions (it is no more wrong for someone to kill a member of my family than for someone to kill someone I don't know). So Hume argues that we in various ways (try to) correct for personal (or temporal) bias when making moral judgments and take, in particular, the view of a sympathetic but impartial spectator in doing so. But this still can't explain why we should in all conscience and justice return what we owe to the seditious bigot: here the most extensive and impartial sympathy would seem to dictate acting for the greatest happiness rather than justly in Hume's terms.

Matters are even more problematic for Hume's theory of justice and the other artificial virtues because Hume makes it clear that he is (what we would call) a virtue ethicist. He says that the moral status of an action depends entirely on the goodness or badness of the motive that lies behind it, so that, e. g., it is only because certain helpful actions were intended to be helpful (were motivated by the natural virtue of benevolence) that we morally approve of them or judge them to be right and good. However, it is difficult to apply this virtue-ethical assumption to the artificial virtues, because the good motive operative in their instance is the conscientious desire to do one's duty or what is right or obligatory. According to Hume, if I return what I owe to the seditious bigot, my only just motive is the desire to do what is right and obligatory, but, in that case, the morally good motive that is supposed (according to Hume's virtue ethics) to explain the rightness or goodness of returning what I owe to the seditious bigot already makes essential reference to the rightness or goodness or obligatoriness of doing so. As Hume himself tells us, this seems to be arguing (explaining) in a circle, and Hume makes the same point (perhaps even more forcefully) about fidelity to promises.

One way of trying to square this circle involves seeing Hume as thinking of multiple levels at work in the explanation of actions flowing from the artificial virtues (Sayre-McCord 1996). In the case of justice, in particular, Hume believes that a kind of reflected force of prudence motivates us. We see the advantages of the kind of mutual constraint that figured in the contractarian story bruited by Plato. Hume thinks we do not need a contract or any other formal arrangement to begin to live with others in this way: like two oarsmen in a boat, we naturally begin to coordinate. So the motive which compels us to act this way is the familiar engine of self-interest. But that cannot itself support the thought that such a disposition is a virtue, for the reasons just given. It is only because of the great advantages of such a disposition — its central role in making possible and sustaining the utility of social life — that it is praiseworthy in the way that virtues must be. So on this view, Hume has devised a way to ground a disposition to abide by norms of justice that can tap into the font of motivation available to the passions surrounding self-interest. Not all commentators think this is an adequate way out: if it is not, then Hume's attempt to justify or explain justice as an individual virtue via empiricist sentimentalist (associationist) mechanisms cannot succeed.

Adam Smith, like Hume, has a general account of virtue built on sentiment, in particular “a desire for a mutual sympathy of sentiments.” His view of the virtue of justice is developed in contrast with the virtue of beneficence. In Smith, even more clearly than in Hume, one can see that the virtue consists in conformity to “rules” or “laws” of justice that seem to exist antecedently to the realization of the virtue itself, unlike ancient accounts. Smith indicates that it merits resentment when absent, that it may be “extorted by force,” and that in the main it requires forbearing from harming others, such that often all it requires is that we sit still and do nothing (Smith 1759, II.ii.I.5, 9). It is essential to the subsistence of society, Smith tells us, but — in contrast to Hume — is not reducible in its motivational basis to regard for society. Instead, our just concern for “multitudes” is compounded of our concern for individuals, which arises from “fellow-feeling,” which is yet short of “love, esteem, and affection.”

In Kant we see the completion of the distinction between justice as a virtue and justice as a norm to which a virtue may or may not correspond. While Kant has a theory (or “doctrine”) of virtue, he distinguishes that theory precisely against a counterpoised theory of justice. The two are complementary elements in the “metaphysics of morals.” Moreover, the doctrine of justice itself has two parts, roughly corresponding to the distinction present since Plato’s work, between the role of justice in the individual and the role of justice in the state. Kant calls these “private right” and “public right,” respectively. But right in either case is not how Kant at least conceives of virtue; instead, it is a “condition” that can obtain between the moral agents comprising a moral or legal community, in virtue of their principles of choice in acting (Kant 1797). Little remains here of the notion of justice as a virtue of individuals as it began with the ancient Greeks.

2. Social Psychology and Justice

20th-century developmental psychology drew deeply on the Kantian legacy. Piaget (1932/1948) treated moral development as principally involving increasing cognitive sophistication. More particularly, Piaget saw that sophistication as a matter of taking more and more general or universal views of moral issues, and endorsed the Kantian and rationalist idea that morality rests on and can be justified in terms of considerations of justice. Piaget saw a “law of evolution” in moral development, from an understanding of rules (including moral rules) as being “heteronomous” impositions of authority, to which one is objectively responsible, to a grounding in mutual respect, accompanied by subjective responsibility to others (Piaget 1932/1948, p. 225). This transition is fostered through social interaction, and attention to norms of equality and reciprocity replace those of mere obedience.

Educational psychologist Lawrence Kohlberg was inspired by Piaget to propose a conception of moral development that postulated six stages of human moral development. In his earliest work, Kohlberg identified the highest stage of such development with a concern for justice and human rights based on universal principles. Concern for relationships and for individual human well-being was embedded in a framework of conformity to social norms, at lower stages of the process. Moreover, he saw the ordering of the different stages in Piagetian fashion as basically reflecting differences in rational understanding: those whose moral thinking involved the invoking of universal principles of justice and rights were thought to show a more advanced cognitive development than those whose moral thought appeals primarily to the importance of relationships and of human well-being or suffering. The paradigm of moral development involves judgments that are “reversible,” in the sense that each party to the issue can accept the correct judgment by reversing his or her perspective and taking up the viewpoint of the other (Kohlberg 1981). The sophisticated moral reasoner will engage in a process of “moral musical chairs,” taking up the positions of the parties to the conflict successively. It is, on this version of Kohlberg’s thought, that formal feature of the deliberative process that is characteristic of greatest moral development. As his research and thought progressed, however, Kohlberg increasingly acknowledged that these formal features were less characteristic of overall moral development and thought than of the deployment of specifically justice-based concepts. In fact, Kohlberg was impressed by the work of Rawls, and thought that the nature of Rawls' "original position of equality" exemplified the kind of reversibility that is paradigmatic of the highest form of moral thought (Kohlberg 1981, p. 204). However, his approach treats utilitarianism as less cognitively advanced (more primitive) than rationalist views like Kant's, and utilitarians (like R.M. Hare) naturally called into question the objectivity and intellectual fairness of Kohlberg's account.

More significantly, perhaps, the evidence for Kohlberg's stage sequence was drawn from studies of boys, and when one applies the sequence to the study of young girls, it turns out that girls on average end up at a less advanced stage of moral development than boys do. In her 1982 book In a Different Voice: Psychological Theory and Women's Development, Carol Gilligan responded to Kohlberg's views by questioning whether a theory of moral development based solely on a sample of males could reasonably be used to draw conclusions about the inferior moral development of women. Gilligan argued that her own studies of women's development indicated that the moral development of girls and women proceeds and ends in a different fashion from that of boys and men, but that that proves nothing about inferiority or superiority: it is merely a fact of difference. In particular, Gilligan claimed that women tend to think morally in terms of connection to others (relationships) and in terms of caring about (responsibility for) those with whom they are connected; men, by contrast and in line with Kohlberg's studies, tend to think more in terms of general principles of justice and of individual rights against (or individual autonomy from) other people. But Jean Hampton, among others, responded that Gilligan’s critique was itself a distortion, and that concerns for justice and individual rights are as significant for and in the moral lives of women as for men (Hampton 1993).

3. Caring and Justice

Subsequently, many have questioned the empirical validity or accuracy of the studies Gilligan relied upon, but others have pointed out that the idea of a “different voice” need not be tied to specific assumptions about differences between the sexes. The voice of justice and principle arguably represents a different style of moral thinking (and of an overall moral life) from that of caring for and connection with others, and later writers (notably Nel Noddings, but also Gilligan herself in later work) tried to elaborate what a morality (moral life) based in caring would be like and also to show that such a morality may be superior to that embodied in traditional thinking about justice and rights and universal(izable) moral principles.

The primary fulcrum for articulation of any ethic of care or caring seems to lie in an ideal that stresses connection over separateness. The Kantian emphasis on the autonomy of the moral person and the Rawlsian or contractarian assumption of separate individuals coming together to forge a social contract see us as essentially separate from others, whereas an ideal of caring concern for others sees our (initial) actual historical and personal connections with others as the basis for a positive and caring response to such connection. (However, an ethic of caring doesn't favor social conservatism in the way much communitarian thought does: any social structure that shows insufficient concern for one group or another can arguably be criticized via the ideal of mutual caring.)

In addition, an ethic of justice and rights — if removed from the original context of justice as a virtue of individuals — may tell us to regulate our actions or lives in accordance with certain general moral principles (or explicitly moral insights), whereas the ethic of care stresses the good of a concern for the welfare of others that is unmediated by principles, rules, or judgments that tell us that we ought to be concerned about their welfare. In an ethic of care, therefore, caring is treated as a natural virtue in Hume's sense, but this further highlights the way in which such an ethic involves us in connection with, rather than separateness from, other people. If we are concerned about others on the basis of a conscientious desire to do our duty or adhere to certain moral principles, then our concern for them is mediated by moral thinking, and someone, therefore, who cares about the welfare of others without having to rely on or be guided by explicit moral principles (or thinking) is more connected with those others than someone who acts only on the basis of such mediating principles (or thought). So the ethic of care or caring stresses connection with others both in what it says about the normative basis of morality and in what it says about the ways in which moral goodness shows itself within a morally good life.

As indicated above, defenders of an ethic of care or caring have increasingly come to view caring as grounding (offering a normative basis for) morality as a whole. That means that ideas about justice and rights either have no validity or can actually be reinterpreted and given an arguably firmer justification in terms of (what we originally regarded as the opposed notion of) caring. But it is difficult to believe that morality can properly or plausibly be confined to intimate relations of caring. For better or worse, we have to learn to live together in larger social units, and we cannot be intimate or even acquainted with every human being whose actions and fate are morally significant for us. So an ethic of caring that seeks to account for individual and social morality generally needs to say something in its own voice about social and international justice and about how given individuals can realize the virtue of justice.

In answer to this more or less explicit challenge, some care ethicists have highlighted potential analogies between the way a mother cares for her children and the kinds of care a government, state, or society can offer to its citizens or inhabitants (who presumably cannot provide everything they need and want on their own). Others have noted that the notion of caring doesn't have to be restricted to close personal relationships and that one can intuitively speak of caring, in humanitarian fashion, about people one doesn't know (except by description). This then allows there to be obligations of caring both toward near and dear and toward humanity more generally, though the issue of how to balance these concerns becomes very important at that point.

But all these ways of developing and extending an ethic of care seem united in stressing (what Hume calls) natural motives over artificial ones. If someone who doesn't care about his family, or about human beings in general, always fails to act helpfully toward others, he exhibits a lack of caring, and an ethic of care regards acts which display such morally deficient motivation as morally criticizable and wrong. This is virtue ethical in Hume’s sense, as the criterion of the rightness of an action has to do with the inner state or motive that lies behind it. But by the same token individuals who demonstrate the virtue of caring act in ways that show how much they care or are concerned about others, in ways that demonstrate their emotional connectedness with others; in particular such people don't have to remind themselves of moral ideals and obligations in order to get themselves to help those they care about. They help because they care, not for some other abstract reason.

Is this sort of natural virtue really adequate to those moral/political concerns that transcend intimate personal relationships? Hume and Smith didn't think so, and it is not obvious on the face of it how an ethic of caring could handle such issues. Still, Hume makes things difficult for natural virtue by conceiving individual and social justice in highly conservative terms. According to Hume we have a strict obligation of justice to allow people to keep (most of) what they have earned through their own diligence and ingenuity rather than (say) tax it away. Hume seems to assume the empirical issues bearing on such obligations are settled, in a way which forecloses moral critique. Arguably such justice should be conceived in less austerely rigid and more humane terms than those assumed and relied on by Hume.

However, when it comes to the individual virtue of justice, Hume himself supplies some of the means toward a (virtue-ethical) account relying solely on natural virtue (and thus not subject to “Hume's circle”). He points out that it is easier to bear not having (or being given) something than to bear having something taken away from one (thus anticipating what later psychologists have said about “adaptation levels”). And this in and of itself gives someone who is benevolent or caring about the well-being of others some reason (or motive) not to steal or allow stealing from others. However, there is also the fact that stealing (as opposed to merely allowing a theft to occur) is a positive commission, and a natural virtues approach to individual justice (vis-a-vis property) would certainly be helped along, if the distinction (say) between commission and omission, or between doing and allowing, could somehow be captured in non-artificial or natural sentimentalist terms. This seems a tall order, and in fact the suspicion or belief that something more rational than sentiment can account for such distinctions (as, e. g., in Kant's “formula of humanity”) may represent one of the largest challenges a sentimentalist ethic of caring needs to face.

But a plausible response to this challenge comes from the way caring about and for others is grounded in natural human empathy (Slote 2010, ch. 1). Normal human caring isn't impartial (in the manner of “universal benevolence”), because it is easier to empathize with those near and dear to us, i. e., those with whom we share thoughts, lives, roots, or familial (or ethnic or national) traditions. But recent psychological studies of empathy and its relation to altruism indicate that we also tend to empathize more with those whose problems are immediate for us. We respond more to a child drowning right before our eyes than to the plight of a child we don't see and whom we know (only by description) to be in danger of dying of starvation in some distant country; and, similarly, we respond more to the “clear and present” danger faced by miners we hear are trapped underground than to dangers we know will arise in some indefinite future. But if such perceptual and temporal immediacy make such differences (respectively) to empathic concern for others, arguably causal immediacy does as well. The harm I could cause is more immediate for me than harm that I might merely allow to occur. We naturally flinch from (inflicting) the former more than from (allowing) the latter; “naturally” here is appropriate because, as with cases of perceptual or temporal immediacy, this is not a matter of being guided by moral principles or strictures, but of responsiveness to non-moral situational differences. If we are in this way more sensitive and responsive to differences in the strength of our potential causal relation to some harm or evil, then a moral sentimentalism that restricts itself to natural virtues — grounded in caring — may possess the resources to distinguish between commission and omission, and it may be able to use that distinction (among other things) to explain why stealing, promise-breaking, and killing are worse than allowing others to do these things. This might well then allow such an approach to account for the virtue of individual justice more successfully than Hume's theory of artificial virtues can.

4. Justice as a Virtue of Societies

Such a conclusion has led many subsequent ethical thinkers to think that justice cannot be based in sentiment but requires a more intellectually constructive rational(ist) basis, and in recent times this view of the matter seems to have been held, most influentially, by John Rawls in A Theory of Justice. Rawls makes clear his belief in the inadequacy of benevolence or sympathetic human sentiment in formulating an adequate conception of social justice. He says in particular that sentiment leaves unanswered or indeterminate various important issues of justice that a good theory of justice ought to be able to resolve.

Rawls's positive view of justice is concerned primarily with the justice of institutions or (what he calls) the “basic structure” of society: justice as an individual virtue is derivative from justice as a social virtue defined via certain principles of justice. The principles, famously, are derived from an “original position” in which (very roughly) rational contractors under a “veil of ignorance” decide how they wish to commit themselves to being governed in their actual lives. Rawls deliberately invokes Kantian rationalism (or anti-sentimentalism) in explaining the intellectual or theoretical motivation behind his construction, and the two principles of justice that he argues would be agreed upon under the contractual conditions he specifies represent a kind of egalitarian political liberalism. Roughly, those principles stress (equality of) basic liberties and opportunities for self-advancement over considerations of social welfare, and the distribution of opportunities and goods in society is then supposed to work to the advantage of all (especially the worst-off members of society). He also says that the idea of what people distributively deserve or merit is derivative from social justice rather than (as with Aristotle and/or much common-sense thinking) providing the basis for thinking about social justice.

According to Rawls, individual justice is theoretically derivative from social justice because the just individual is to be understood as someone with an effective or “regulative” desire to comply with the principles of justice. However, it is not merely social justice that Rawls understands in (predominantly) rationalist fashion. When he explains how individuals (within a just society) develop a sense and/or the virtue of justice, he invokes the work of Piaget. Rawls lays more stress than Piaget does on the role our affective nature (sympathy and the desire for self-mastery) plays in the acquisition of moral virtue. But, like Piaget, he stresses the need for a sufficiently general appreciation and rational understanding of social relations as the grounding basis of a sense of duty or of justice and he explicitly classifies his account of moral development as falling within the “rationalist tradition.”

5. Recent Developments

While Rawls’ work has sparked an explosion of work in distributive justice and social justice more generally, in recent years a variety of strategies to return to a focus on justice as a personal virtue has emerged. These strategies vary across both dimensions we have considered, taking with various degrees of seriousness the connection between institutional and personal forms of justice, and focusing on the latter as a virtue, among (and like) other virtues.

One such strategy is that of Jon Drydyk, who builds on the “capability approach” to human welfare to make a case for a capabilities-based account of the justice of individual agents, in particular as against an “Aristotelian” approach that stresses justice as a matter of response to merit. Acting justly involves “striving to reduce and remove inequalities in people’s capabilities to function in ways that are elemental” to a truly human life (Drydyk 2012, pp. 31, 33). This is a “subsidiary” virtue account, in that we begin with a prior conception of the content of the requirements of justice, and conform the virtue to this conception. However, Drydyk is emphasizing justice as a virtue of individuals, rather than institutions or societies. Drydyk’s strategy offers a counterpoint both to the Rawlsian way of thinking about just societies and to the ancient Greek way of thinking about justice as a virtue of individuals.

John Hacker-Wright argues that what is needed to replace a “legalistic” concern with moral status (as on modern liberal conceptions of justice) is instead an ethic of virtue with a different conception of the virtue of justice. Instead of a concern for the resolution of claims in something like reciprocal, contractual relations, Hacker-Wright’s conception of the virtue of justice is a matter of sensitivity to “vulnerability of value” in things, animate and otherwise. Thus, the threat of unjust — vicious — wronging hangs not only over people who are sufficiently cognitively impaired so as not to perceive insults, but also corpses, animals, and even rare and valuable rock formations (p. 463). This counts as a sense of justice in that, on Hacker-Wright’s view it is not merely that we can act wrongly or viciously toward such entities, but (following Midgley 1983) that they can be wronged by us by our doing so. However, while Hacker-Wright claims that on a virtue ethic “The character of the agent is recognized as ineliminable in picking out facts as they figure in our moral deliberation,” this does not strictly speaking seem to be true, as prior to virtue there is value which it is up to the just or virtuous person to respond with sensitivity (pp. 461, 463, 464).

David Schmidtz and John Thrasher suggest rethinking the relationship between social justice and individual justice (Schmidtz and Thrasher 2014). Turning Plato’s account of justice in Republic on its head, they depict justice as a bridge between a virtue of the soul and of the polis: because we are essentially social, we need community, and justice is a matter of harmony with the community. On their view this is (largely) a matter of compliance with rules and institutions that enable people to live in harmony and flourish together.

An alternative proposal for thinking of the justice as a personal virtue ties it intimately to the experiences we have as emotional creatures. On this approach, instead of justice standing as distinct from “natural virtues” motivated by passions (as on Hume’s account), or needing to be replaced by sentimentally-driven attitudes such as care or compassion, justice is to be seen as a virtue largely constituted by emotion (Solomon 1994, Roberts 2010). The virtue amounts to a stable disposition of character to respond in the relevant ways to instances of injustice, perhaps consisting in those occasions in which one does not receive his or her due, and on the other hand to be disposed to a “will to give each his due” (Roberts 2010, p. 38). For Roberts, this is a will to realize “objective justice,” and as on other recent accounts, the virtue (and the passion) are theoretically subsidiary to this primary notion of “objective justice.”

There are also recent ventures in the spirit of the ancient Greek thinking about the individual virtue of justice. Rasmussen and Den Uyl (2005) argue for two interpersonal senses of justice (pp. 160-63). One is the familiar Aristotelian virtue. The second is a “metanormative” principle governing the institutions and legal frameworks in which individual agents (just and otherwise) live their lives and exercise their practical agency. The second of these senses of interpersonal justice does not draw its content from the exercise of virtue, but rather makes a place for it. The former does depend on virtue overall (including the exercise of practical wisdom) for its demands, but these are construed broadly in the traditional way of rendering to each his due. Bloomfield (2011) similarly suggests extending the Aristotelian virtue of justice, but in an inward direction, arguing that self-respect is necessary for happiness, and treating oneself fairly requires treating oneself fairly, as one treats others fairly, as a property of justice as individuals.

Recent thinkers have grappled with the question of priority between formal principle and virtue that vexed Aristotle, and offered solutions that for the most part subordinate the virtue of justice to the prior notion of the justice of distributions, as Aristotle himself seems to have suggested. Bernard Williams claims explicitly that this is so (Williams 1980, p. 197), as does David Wiggins, in an attempt to bring a “pre-liberal,” Aristotelian conception of justice to bear on modern liberal conceptions, a la Kant and Rawls (Wiggins 2004). To do so, Wiggins distinguishes three senses of justice: (A) a matter of outcomes or states of affairs in which each gets what is due; (B) a disposition to promote justice (A); (C) a condition of the polis in virtue of which (A) is realized. Wiggins claims that the proper outcome of this collision of conceptions is one that recognizes a form of logical priority of justice (A) over justice (B) (p. 489). At the same time, against Williams he insists that the normative demands of justice (A) are “comprehensible” only within the perspective of a person with justice (B). And in fact he claims that a necessary condition on acts and outcomes satisfying the norms of justice (A) is that they be recognized to be so by those with the virtue of justice (B). Wiggins’ thinking here is not transparent, but perhaps the thought is that the logical point is purely formal: someone with justice (B) must, in act or judging justly, be responding to some norm which counts as justice (A). But, as merely formal, that tells us nothing about the substantive content of that norm. To get that, we have ineliminable need to refer to the judgment of the person with justice (B). That marks a way perhaps of restoring Aristotle’s focus on virtue in coming to understand the virtue of justice.

LeBar (2013, 2014) takes a similar tack in attempting to incorporate Kantian and post-Kantian insights into just demands on the treatment of others into an Aristotelian virtue framework. On his view, there is no way to specify the contents of the demands of justice, or to spell out its norms, independently of the wider possession and exercise of the virtues, including the virtue of practical wisdom. At the same time, what the virtuous and just person sees, in inhabiting a social world with equals in moral standing, are the norms which have become associated with the liberal conception: the standing to obligate others and hold them accountable, for example.

6. Conclusion

There are many different conceptions of the virtue of justice, and only some of them are distinctively virtue ethical. Many non-virtual ethical approaches put forward theories of virtue, and what distinguishes them from virtue ethics is that the given theory of virtue comes later in the order of explanation, rather than itself serving as the basis for understanding (all of) morality. This is especially the case with justice, where (as we have seen) it is naturally tempting to account for the norms of justice first and derive an account of the virtue in light of those norms. The question of the priority of norms of justice or the virtue of justice is likely to continue to generate exploration and debate, as is the question of how our lives as social and political animals contributes to understanding the virtue of justice. These vexed questions have inspired a profusion of views and no doubt will continue to do so.


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Michael Slote

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