International Distributive Justice

First published Thu Oct 24, 2013

International distributive justice has become a prominent topic within political philosophy. Philosophers have, of course, long been concerned with the wealth and poverty, and how the inequalities between persons might be justified. They have, however, tended to focus only upon inequalities between inhabitants of the same state. In recent years, though, a sustained philosophical dialogue has emerged on how these ideas might be applied to the relationships and institutions holding at the global level. This dialogue has been prompted by issues of philosophy, but also by the realities of globalization and global poverty; in a world as connected as our own, is it justifiable that some have so much while others have so little?

This entry is an introduction to the recent development of this dialogue. It is, perhaps, appropriate to start with some limitations. This entry will discuss only the distributive aspects of international justice, rather than on all aspects of international relations and institutions that might be morally important. Philosophical discussion of global justice has become sufficiently rich and complex that it is no longer possible to discuss all the various threads of this discussion in one entry (see Chatterjee (2011) for a more encyclopedic discussion of the various debates within global justice). This entry will, accordingly, leave to one side such important topics as fairness in trade (James 2012; Wenar 2009; Kurjanska and Risse 2008); immigration (Wellman and Cole 2011; Carens 1995); and gender (Kristof and WuDunn 2010; Jaggar 2005; Nussbaum 2001). The fact that we do not discuss these topics should not be read as implying their irrelevance; on the contrary, they are enormously important for any adequate theory of global justice, and deserve more attention than we can provide here. This entry will, moreover, discuss writings primarily within the tradition of liberal egalitarianism. Thinkers of a radical or a Marxist bent have had things to say about international justice, too, but these writings are here largely ignored (see Kohn, Humphrey, and Goto-Jones in Bell 2010, for discussions of these topics.) The entry is, finally, focused almost exclusively on fairly recent writings. The reason for this is the simple fact, noted above, that international justice has been a central research topic only in recent years. This is emphatically not to say that less recent philosophers have not had important things to say about international justice: Immanuel Kant's idea of a foedus pacificum continues to exert a strong influence over modern philosophical thought, for example, as does Mill's liberal nationalism (Kant, 1795; Mill, 1859.) The modern period, too, has seen some sustained discussion of global wealth and poverty, most notably in Peter Singer's discussion of the ethics of global famine relief (Singer 1972; see also Singer 2002). Nevertheless, the modern dialogue about international distributive justice can be largely traced to the initial publication of John Rawls's A Theory of Justice in 1971, and the prehistory of these ideas can be largely omitted in the present context.

1. Early Cosmopolitanism

We can begin, then, with John Rawls's A Theory of Justice. The influence of this work on modern political philosophy can hardly be overstated. It shifted the assumptions with which political philosophers have operated—in part by resuscitating the social contract tradition, and in part by giving a sustained and analytically robust argument regarding the injustice of particular forms of resource inequality. A full analysis of Rawls's work is beyond the scope of this entry; readers can see the related entries in this encyclopedia for more detail. Rawls introduces two principles of justice, which he argues represent the principles of justice we would accept as governing the “basic structure” of our society were we to bargain with one another under fair conditions. These principles of justice deal with political justice, and with what fairness would demand of the rules allocating persons to positions within the basic structure, but they also constrain inequality. In particular, the only inequalities of “primary goods” that could be justified are those that can be shown to be to the advantage of the least advantaged representative position. This idea—called the difference principle—represents a significant block to the exercise of the market, in that individuals are no longer entitled to obtain whatever share of resources their talents might obtain in a standard capitalist model of the labor market.

It is not part of our current project to criticize or defend the difference principle. We are, instead, simply going to highlight two facts about this principle. The first is that the principle does seem to place a significant constraint on the types and degrees of inequality that might be justifiable. The difference principle requires that all such inequalities of social primary goods must be justifiable to the representative worst off party within society; appeals to utility, or to efficiency, or to other forms of social value simply will not suffice. The second thing to note is that this principle seems to apply only within the context of the domestic state. Rawls is explicit, in his theory, that his principles should be taken as only describing the nature of justice within the political society represented by a territorial state. When Rawls does deal with the issue of international justice, it is in a manner markedly less reformist than that with which he approaches domestic justice. Rawls argues that a just international regime would involve states agreeing to treat one another fairly in their mutual interaction—but that this fairness would not involve any sort of distributive consideration, or demand for economic justice. Indeed, Rawls argues that the principles to which states would agree would largely resemble those found in contemporary 20th century international law. In contrast with the radical (or at least surprising) conclusions drawn domestically, Rawls argues that in international justice, there would be “no surprises” in the principles we ought to select (Rawls 1971, 378).

This difference in treatment between the domestic and the international context was immediately troubling to many philosophers. One way of highlighting this is by noting the apparent contradiction between the universalism of Rawls's moral theory and the localism of its realm of application. The first argues that what is morally arbitrary should not be taken as legitimately grounding an inequality of wealth or income. If liberalism means anything, after all, it means an aversion to inherited caste privilege and other forms of feudal birthright privilege (Carens 1992). The second, however, applies this universal guarantee only within the very local context of the nation-state, ignoring the fact that membership in that state was, itself, morally arbitrary. The net result was, for many commentators, a sort of internal inconsistency in Rawls's theory; if Rawls was to regard income inequality above that permitted by the difference principle as unjust, he should do so in a thoroughgoing way, and condemn the inequalities between the wealthy and the impoverished internationally (see Pogge 1989, 1992, 1994; Beitz 1973, 1979, 1983; Scanlon 1973).

Rawls can, on this account, be taken as the originator of the modern dialogue on global distributive justice—not because he was the first to speak out against international inequality, but because he did not do so. Many of those who first did speak about international inequality, though, used Rawlsian ideas and concepts to do so. We can therefore proceed to examine some representative arguments used by these thinkers, to see how their cases were constructed.

Many initial commentators on Rawls's work argued that the proper interpretation of Rawls's principles was one in which the difference principle was applied at the global level. These authors are often referred to as “cosmopolitans”; this term, however, is often less than illuminating (see the accompanying entry on cosmopolitanism for more detail.) We will instead refer to these authors as Left Institutionalists, for reasons we hope will become clear. Left Institutionalists agree on the following conclusion: that Rawls's own limitation of his two principles of justice to the circumstances of a domestic society was a morally illegitimate constraint on his theory, so that a consistent liberalism taking off from Rawls's arguments must apply its liberal principles at the global level—and, therefore, the well-being of the worst-off representative member of the global society, rather than the domestic, ought to be our starting-point for the justification of inequality. In this way, liberalism is made coherent once again; rather than seeking some arbitrary fact to serve as a limitation on the liberal theory of justice, the cosmopolitans argue that we ought to live up to the globalism inherent in liberalism's self-understanding. See, for instance, Thomas Pogge's analysis of liberalism's domestic focus:

Nationality is just one further deep contingency (like genetic endowment, race, gender, and social class), one more potential basis of institutional inequalities that are inescapable and present from birth. Within Rawls's conception, there is no reason to treat this case differently from the others. And so it would seem that we can justify our global institutional order only if we can show that the institutional inequalities it produces tend to optimize (against the backdrop of feasible alternative global regimes) the worst social position. (Pogge 1989, 247.)

Rawls, of course, had reasons to resist this interpretation of his work. His own view—made more explicit in his The Law of Peoples, but present even in A Theory of Justice—is that what counts as justice within a given context must make reference to what that context is, and how we should understand its function and its rules. Thus, Rawls argues that his theory does not have application to such private institutions as churches or universities; it is only to be applied to the basic structure of a society—which is understood by Rawls as the major social institutions, and the ways in which they structure the rules of association and allocate the advantages of cooperation (Rawls 1971, 7). The first task of the Rawlsian cosmopolitan, then, is to analyze the notion of the basic structure, and demonstrate that such an entity is found internationally as well as domestically. Charles Beitz and Thomas Pogge both argue that the modern system of international trade has all the indicia given by Rawls to explain what makes the basic structure so central: international institutions allocate the advantages of trade, and their rules set the basic framework for the specific interactions taken among international agents. They argue, in short, that the international institutional set is indeed akin to a basic structure, in that this set is a site of cooperation, to which the principles of justice given in A Theory of Justice ought to apply. As Beitz has it:

[I]f evidence of global economic and political interdependence shows the existence of a global scheme of social cooperation, we should not view national boundaries as having fundamental moral significance. Since boundaries are not coextensive with the scope of social cooperation, they do not mark the limits of social obligation. Thus the parties to the original position cannot be assumed to know that they are members of a particular national society, choosing principles of justice primarily for that society. The veil of ignorance must extend to all matters of national citizenship, and the principles chosen will therefore apply globally. (Beitz 1979, 151)

Rawlsian principles must therefore apply to the set of persons in the world as a whole, so that global institutions should be arranged to maximize the expectations of the globally worst-off representative individual.

The early Rawlsian cosmopolitans were enormously influential, and can be credited with forcing the attention of the philosophical community towards the issue of global underdevelopment and inequality. The theories, of course, were subject to enormous criticism, and Rawls himself rejected their conclusions, as we shall see. For the moment, we might note only that many theorists were skeptical of the conclusion that Rawls's principles could apply as easily to the global community as to the domestic community. Two strands of criticism here deserve note: the first starting with coercion, and the second with the issue of nationality.

Some thinkers, then, have questioned whether or not the simple act of exchanging goods—even a great many goods—places people in a relationship that is morally akin to that shared by people who are liable to the same territorial state. Something like this point was noticed early by Brian Barry, who notes that

[T]rade, however multilateral, does not constitute a cooperative scheme of the relevant kind. Trade, if freely undertaken, is (presumably) beneficial to the exchanging parties, but it is not, it seems to me, the kind of relationship giving rise to duties of fair play.…Trade in pottery, ornamentation, and weapons can be traced back to prehistoric times, but we would hardly feel inclined to think of, say, the Beaker Folk as forming a single cooperative enterprise with their trading partners. No more did the spice trade unite East and West. (Barry 1982, 233)

Barry's intuition, here, is that there seems to be something normatively distinct between what is shared by trading partners and what is felt by fellow citizens. One way of noticing this is to notice that some left Rawlsians seem to sever the distributive component of Rawls's theory from the other aspects of that theory—in particular, from the parts of the theory dealing with political rights and political justification. There is, of course, a reason for this dismembering: there is, internationally, no polity, and the very concept of having (for example) democratic rights within that polity might seem misplaced. But many have thought that something has been missed that is morally relevant, and that we might better regard Rawls's distributive conclusions and his political conclusions as more tightly linked than that. Some thinkers, in particular, have argued that Rawls's conclusions are best read as principles intended to justify the coercive acts of a territorial state, rather than as principles applicable to cooperative ventures more generally (Blake 2001; Nagel 2005). These theorists have suggested that the state stands in need of justification, and that the justification we offer makes distributive principles applicable here—but not everywhere.

A second critical strand, as above, begins with the notion of nationality. The idea here is that the relationships that are most central to human flourishing and human creativity are always specific relationships, with specific persons and with specific cultural contexts. As such, the use of abstract principles like Rawls's to determine what we owe to one another generally is either suspect or outright self-destructive. This critical posture, of course, can end up being a criticism of the liberal project itself (see Sandel 1982). But it can also end up being a simple criticism of the attempt to do justice without looking at the messiness of nations, of cultures, and of communities. These latter entities, it might be felt, are in need of support—and, in particular, are in need of support by individuals who are taken as duty-bound to prefer the good of that community to the abstract rights of foreign citizens (Miller 1995; Kymlicka 1995). What is missed in the cosmopolitan argument, on this account, is not the presence of the coercive state, but the presence of the cultural nation. The nationalists, it should be noted, are not hostile to all notions of global justice; they are, instead, committed only to the relatively modest conclusion that nationality has some moral relevance—and that the principles of distributive justice that are right within the nation may not be right at the global level (Miller 2012).

There are a variety of ways of arguing for such a conclusion. Some theorists begin with dissatisfaction at the deracinated and abstract forms of philosophy practiced by cosmopolitans (Walzer 1983). Some theorists begin with the need for communities to preserve themselves, if they are to provide individuals with the goods needed to live decent lives (MacIntyre 1984). More generally, these theorists argue that the needs of community are such that the cosmopolitan does damage to what is needed by actual humans, by considering individuals without considering the communities within which they live:

[P]atriotism requires me to exhibit peculiar devotion to my nation and you to yours. It requires me to regard such contingent social facts as where I was born and what government ruled over that place at that time, who my parents were, who my great-grandparents were, and so on, as deciding for me what the question of virtuous action is—at least insofar as it is the virtue of patriotism which is in question. Hence the moral standpoint and the patriotic standpoint are systematically incompatible. (MacIntyre 1984, 5)

Both of these criticisms seem, to some degree, to be accepted by Rawls himself, in his fuller explanation of his own international theory in The Law of Peoples. Rawls is more explicit in this work—as he is in his 1993 volume Political Liberalism—that he takes the political dimension of the state as of primary importance, and that his principles of justice apply only within the state for that reason. He is, further, more explicit about his debt to the liberal nationalist idea in this volume, writing approvingly that these ideas help guide his vision of a just international regime. We may, then, proceed to examine Rawls's Law of Peoples directly.

2. Justice and respect for nations

The trend towards greater and more sophisticated theorizing about international justice was both exemplified and encouraged by the publication of Rawls' The Law of Peoples. This work—an extensive elaboration and revision of an earlier essay (Rawls 1993b)—discusses and, has influenced the subsequent discussion of, a variety of issues of international and global import, including and especially the obligations of distributive justice in the international realm. Before we turn to Rawls's account of international distributive justice, we should acknowledge some salient features of how he conceives of his project. Rawls' perspective is unabashedly international rather than global. Unlike the early left institutionalists who conceive of the world as a single cooperative unit and seek a single principle of distributive justice to govern everyone, Rawls explicitly seeks principles that will regulate the interactions among territorially defined political, corporate agents that have a monopoly on the legitimate use of force, called peoples—and, only indirectly, govern individuals (Rawls 1999a, 6).

Second, and partly as a consequence of this conceptualization of international justice, Rawls does not attempt to derive complete principles of international and global justice. Rather, he describes principles that ought to regulate the foreign policy of a liberal people (Rawls 1999a, 9–10). Thus, when Rawls says, for example, that some non-democratic peoples are sufficiently well-ordered to be worthy of full membership in the society of peoples, he is arguing that democratic peoples may not use political power or pressure to change them—not that non-democratic but well-ordered peoples are ideal or beyond moral criticism. Furthermore, he argues that the ideal case of international justice is a world composed entirely of well-ordered peoples whose interactions are governed by a set of moral principles. The account is then extended to cover various non-ideal cases: societies burdened by poverty and failing institutions or rogue states that wage aggressive war. What constitutes a minimally just or well-ordered people is a matter of immense controversy, but the broader conceptual point is unchanged: Rawls conceives of international justice as being ideally about the interactions of morally justified, centralized territorial polities.

Third, his account of the law of peoples is constrained by the need that it describe a ‘realistic utopia’ (Rawls 1999a, 11–12) that follows Rousseau's dictum to take ‘people as they are and laws as they might be.’ As a consequence, there are at least three distinct instances where Rawls appeals to empirical facts as a way of ‘realistically’ grounding particular normative claims. First, an international system composed of well-ordered peoples with representative governments will be peaceful (Rawls 1999a, 44–54); second, cultural, transportation, and communication difficulties will make a world state fundamentally unworkable (Rawls 1999a, 36); and, lastly, the primary causal component of national wealth and prosperity is the political culture and the corresponding effectiveness of their political institutions (Rawls 1999a, 108–110).

With the above normative and descriptive picture in view, Rawls presents a provisional list of principles that peoples could reasonably endorse:

  1. Peoples are free and independent, and their freedom and independence are to be respected by other peoples.
  2. Peoples are to observe treaties and undertakings.
  3. Peoples are equal and are parties to the agreements that bind them.
  4. Peoples are to observe a duty of non-intervention.
  5. Peoples have the right of self-defense but no right to instigate war for reasons other than self-defense.
  6. Peoples are to honor human rights.
  7. Peoples are to observe certain specified restrictions in the conduct of war.
  8. Peoples have a duty to assist other peoples living under unfavorable conditions that prevent their having a just or decent political and social regime. (Rawls 1999a, 37)

Notably absent from this list is the difference principle or anything like it. When deciding on these principles, peoples do not know how big, rich, prosperous, or powerful they will be. Yet, unlike individuals in the first original position, the peoples represented in this second, international original position will not demand that inequalities among them be justified by improving the lives of the least well-off person or people. The peoples in the second original position know that they have sufficient resources to be well-ordered, and they need no more. So, in the ideal case, where international society is fully composed of well-ordered states that follow the law of peoples, there are no distributive requirements at all. Some peoples may be very rich and others quite poor and, correspondingly, there could be large differences in wealth among individuals of different countries, but there is no principled reason—on Rawls' view—to find that objectionable.

The Law of Peoples does include some possibly distributive elements. We shall mention three. First, inequalities that undermine the instantiation, enforcement, and maintenance of other principles will violate the Law of Peoples:

The Law of Peoples, on the other hand, holds that inequalities are not always unjust, and that when they are, it is because of their unjust effects on the basic structure of the Society of Peoples, and on relations among peoples and among their members. (Rawls 1999a, 113)

So, if one could show that a deep material inequality among peoples undermined their ability to, say, be considered equals in the negotiation of treaties or tempted peoples to inappropriately intervene in the domestic affairs of other peoples, then that would be a reason—from the standpoint of international justice—for eliminating that inequality. However, this principle must be moderated in light of Rawls suggestions that even rich well-ordered peoples will be ‘satisfied’ with their political and economic position within the Society of Peoples (Rawls 1999a, 27–30), and that the most important determinant of wealth is the political culture and institutions of a people. Well-ordered peoples—rich or poor—will generally act according to the principles that make up the law of peoples and even poor peoples will have fairly strong political institutions, so Rawls would argue that it is unlikely that mere inequality will be a problem among well-ordered states. Second, all members of the Society of Peoples must respect human rights that guarantee that every person, regardless of society, a minimum level of material prosperity and physical security, though this minimum level will fall far short of distributive equality (Rawls 1999a, 65). Third, Rawls writes:

Burdened societies, while they are not expansive or aggressive, lack the political and cultural traditions, the human capital and know-how, and, often, the material and technological resources needed to be well-ordered. The long term goal of (relatively) well-ordered societies should be to bring burdened societies, like outlaw states, into the Society of well-ordered Peoples. Well-ordered peoples have a duty to assist burdened societies. (Rawls 1999a, 106)

Some societies are sufficiently poor or have sufficiently weak institutions that they are unable to become and remain well-ordered on their own. In those cases, the Society of Peoples must produce the material, human, and institutional support to help these burdened societies become minimally just. This could very well include some wealth transfers from richer nations to burdened ones, but Rawls is skeptical that this will be the primary tool of assistance.

It is important to see that the duty of assistance to burdened societies is structurally dissimilar from the difference principle. First, the difference principle is meant to continuously apply, via the basic structure, to the flow of social and economic interactions, but the duty of assistance has a target and a cutoff point: once all societies are well-ordered, no people has any further obligation to distribute resources to burdened nations. Second, while the difference principle is explicitly about the distribution of primary goods, the duty of assistance might, in the end, have very little to do with actual wealth; burdened societies might be quite wealthy in terms of resources but have failing or deeply embedded non well-ordered institutions while well-ordered nations may be quite poor. Furthermore, when confronted with consistently failing institutions, well-ordered peoples will probably do more to assist burdened societies by providing technical know-how, information, and institutional assistance than financial support. So, Rawls argues for a two-tiered theory of distributive justice. The respect for the free and equal status of each citizen in domestic context demands an egalitarian distribution of primary goods, but equality in the international context requires that each person find themselves in a well-ordered people and that those peoples are respected within international society. Economic inequalities are inherently problematic—and require justification—at the domestic level but not at the international. In other words, the distributive outcomes of international trade and the global economy are only indirectly relevant to international justice.

But why this strong distinction between domestic and international? Rawls's response has several themes. First, Rawls suggests that limitations on distributive justice are a consequence of tolerating and respecting the economic decisions of peoples (Rawls 1999a, 117–118). Insofar as peoples are well-ordered, they have made decisions about savings rates, education, and population policy that essentially determine national prosperity, and it would be disrespectful of the decisions made by richer and poorer nations—who presumably adopted these policies for what they took to be good reasons—to require one people to compensate another. This argument is especially controversial because Rawls argues that non-democratic ‘decent consultation hierarchies’ are well-ordered and ought to be accepted into the ranks of the Society of Peoples (Rawls 1999a, 62–78). This leaves open the possibility that individuals will become impoverished as a consequence of public policies and choices that they had no hand in deciding. Kok Chor Tan, for example, has argued that Rawls has improperly stretched his argument for toleration of reasonable, but illiberal, comprehensive doctrines within a generally liberal political culture into an argument for respecting illiberal political cultures (Tan 1998).

Rawls further seems to suggest that the ‘basic structure’ of international realm is quite different from the basic structure of the domestic state. In the domestic case, the basic structure is composed of powerful and effective institutions to which the principles of justice apply. In the international case, Rawls suggests that the basic structure simply is the principles by which well-ordered peoples govern themselves—there are no institutions distinct from the acts and decisions of the peoples themselves. In other words, the interactions among peoples are not—and need not be—regulated by a robust set of political, economic, and social institutions that would constitute an independent basic structure. As a consequence of this lack of an international basic structure, Rawls argues that the moral objections to inequality in the domestic case do not apply (Rawls 1999a 114–115). Inequality among individuals of different peoples does not, for example, undermine the fair value of the political liberties or fair equality of opportunity since they are not co-members of economic and political systems, and peoples will treat other peoples as equals insofar as they are well-ordered and reasonable. Since the political culture and institutions of a people are primary cause of wealth and its distribution, the criterion of reciprocity does not demand equal distributive shares among members of different polities.

Rawls's arguments should not be taken as a defense of the status quo in international relations. Many states—especially authoritarian, weak, and failing ones—are not well-ordered, and the principles informing current foreign policies are not those described in the The Law of Peoples. Neither Rawls nor his critics would defend the justice of the world today. The theoretical difference between these perspectives, though, is profound. The real point of dispute between them is this: once well-ordered nations have ensured that every person lives in a well-ordered state and are thereby guaranteed certain minimum protections against starvation and poverty, does the international order represent a basic structure of the right type, and robustness, so that the fact that some peoples are much wealthier than others ought to be considered an affront to justice? Rawls himself will answer in the negative, while his critics will answer in the affirmative.

3. Varieties of Institutionalism

Despite the fact that almost no element of The Law of Peoples has escaped controversy, it served as a well-spring of additional theorizing (Martin and Reidy 2006) and has structured the subsequent debate concerning international distributive justice. Rawls's two-tiered account strongly influenced those theorists who were unsatisfied with both cosmopolitan and nationalist accounts of distributive justice. Much of the ensuing discussion has pitted two groups of theorists who both purport to be building upon what they take to be the key insights of Rawls's view. One group—we will call them right institutionalists—has followed the general contours of Rawls's two-tiered account, developing more detailed accounts of why we should sharply distinguish between the international and domestic. They aim to justify Rawls's fundamental position that egalitarian distributive justice only operates at the state level, even if they disagree with Rawls as to the rationale Left institutionalists, on the other hand, have argued that international politics is characterized by a sufficiently robust set of institutions as to ‘trigger’ principles of distributive justice that are more robust and that, pace the duty of assistance, operate directly on the distributive consequences of international economic regimes. As a consequence, left institutionalists generally argue for more robust distributive obligations and more radical institutional changes than right institutionalists even though the extent and nature of those obligations varies from thinker to thinker.

Before we go deeper into the divide between left and right institutionalism, it's important to note what the two sides agree on and to see where the actual disagreements between the two sides lie. The important point of agreement lies in their mutual focus on institutions or rule-governed practices as the trigger of genuinely egalitarian distributive obligations. Both right and left institutionalists accept that principles of distributive justice only apply or are activated in particular institutional contexts or when people mutually participate in practices that are distributionally relevant. So, both right and left institutionalists would deny that we have obligations of distributive justice to, say, the lost city of Atlantis (should it appear) since Atlanteans have not participated with us in shared institutions or practices. In other words, principles of distributive justice apply to, and are activated by, a basic structure that mostly determines the distributive shares the participants receive. Right and left institutionalists disagree, then, concerning which institutions activate obligations of distributive justice among participants.

3.1 The Basic Structure as Coercive Legal System

Right institutionalists have generally adopted Rawls's two-tiered approach, arguing for a sharp distinction between domestic and international distributive justice. While Rawls himself did not say much about why international politics was so different, much of the subsequent work by right institutionalists has been to find some morally salient feature that distinguishes the domestic from the international which justifies such strong differences in distributive principles in the face of growing globalization, increasing economic interdependence, and strengthening international civil society. In order to do so, right Rawlsians have argued that the international and domestic realms differ fundamentally in terms of political structure. Kenneth Waltz describes the difference nicely:

The parts of domestic political systems stand in relations of super- and subordination. Some are entitled to command; others are required to obey. Domestic systems are centralized and hierarchic. The parts of the international-political systems stand in relations of cooperation. Formally, each is the equal of all the others. None is entitled to command; none is required to obey. International structures are decentralized and anarchic. (Waltz 1979, 88)

More specifically, domestic politics is characterized by the existence of a superior political authority that claims—and possesses—sovereign judicial, legislative, and executive powers. No such shared, coercive legal system exists in the international realm. Since the world state is, at best, a distant possibility, this is unlikely to change. Domestic legal systems define the very terms of economic activity and represent a kind of fundamental political power over individuals. Samuel Freeman writes:

When Rawls says that the political constitution is part of the basic structure, he does not just mean the procedures that specify how laws are enacted and that define offices and positions of political authority. He means more or less the entire legal system, including most public and private law, that is the product of the constitution in this procedural sense. Modern legal systems, such as the federal system of the United States, are made up of countless acts of legislation, administration, judicial precedent, and other legal rulings that are issued by multiple legal bodies with lawmaking authority. An economic system that is regulated by the legal norms that are issued by the political constitutions is also part of the basic structure. Here, of course, the legal norms of property, contract, commercial law, intangibles, and so on that are essential for economic production and exchange are to be included in the basic structure. What makes possible the incredibly complicated system of legal norms that underlie production, exchange, and consumption is a unified political system that specifies these norms and revises them to meet changing conditions….Nothing comparable to the basic structure of society exists on the global level. (Freeman 2006, 38–39, emphasis added)

A Canadian citizen—no matter how economically and culturally entwined with the United States—does not get a vote in American elections, and the Canadian's economic interactions and relationships are regulated and governed by Canadian, not American, law. As a consequence, the American government lacks “original jurisdiction or effective [or basic] political power” over Canadians. The Canadian citizen lacks the same hierarchical relationship with American political authorities that American citizens have, except under special circumstances are that are themselves negotiated by Canadian and American legal authorities. Different right institutionalists emphasize different elements of the domestic, coercive legal system. Matthias Risse (2006) and Michael Blake (2001), for example, emphasize the coercive nature of domestic legal systems. Risse has argued that the pervasiveness and immediacy of the coercion in domestic legal systems makes them fundamentally different from the kinds of interactions that occur at the international level: even international laws call on the powers of the state for their enforcement. Michael Blake, on the other hand, emphasizes how domestic legal systems structure the most basic of economic interactions, make determinate individual rights, and enforce them against abuses of private power. He suggests that egalitarian principles of distributive justice are what justifies the imposition of coercive political authority on autonomous agents. Samuel Freeman (2007) says that the international system—because it lacks the features and powers of a robust legal system—does not constitute ‘a system of social cooperation’ and, therefore, does not invoke Rawls's ‘Criterion of Reciprocity’ that underlies the difference principle.

Blake, Risse, and Freeman all represent—along with Rawls himself—the moderate wing of right institutionalism. They are united by three claims. First, the presence of a coercive legal system leads to more demanding requirements of egalitarian distributive justice. Second, the international institutions, regimes, and organizations do not constitute a coercive legal system. However, moderates are aware of the many ways in which the international order can make the world hospitable for, or hostile to, well-ordered states. As a consequence, moderates argue for principles of international distributive justice that assist and protect legitimate peoples, with the goal of ensuring that everyone lives within a well-ordered state. International institutions don't activate principles of justice that apply directly to distributive outcomes of global trade or economic activity. Rather, those principles are activated in the event only insofar as member polities (peoples, states, and the like) fail in their own distributive requirements (such as when peoples fail to prevent severe poverty, violating the human rights of their citizens) or need assistance. Moderate Right Institutionalists share, then, Rawls's indirect account of international distributive justice, justifying the two-tiered account by appeal to the necessary relationship between the co-membership in a coercive legal system and distributive justice.

More extreme right institutionalists, most vividly represented by Thomas Nagel in his article ‘The Problem of Global Justice,’ (2005) argue that the lack of an international legal system with sovereign coercive authority does not simply undermine claims of egalitarian distributive justice; it undermines all claims of justice outside the state. So, Nagel accepts the first two claims of the moderates but suggests that together they imply that justice is chimerical in the anarchic realm of international politics. He does accept that we have moral obligations to prevent people from starving, being assaulted, or murdered, but these are obligations of a universal ‘humanitarianism.’ Justice, for Nagel, is a moral value that is necessarily indexed to coercive institutions, as coercive institutions are necessary for large-scale social coordination and cooperation. Claims of distributive justice only apply to those institutions that engage in such large-scale economic coordination, do so coercively, and do so in the name of the individuals coerced. For Nagel, that last part is essential: the answer to the question, “Why do we owe someone equal distributive shares (or equal consideration in light of the difference principle)?” is “We structure their economic lives through coercive political institutions in their name.” Co-citizens have their wills invoked as shared participants in the creation of distributively relevant public policy, and this invocation gives rise to egalitarianism. Since the international realm is characterized by institutions that do not invoke the wills of those involved as a justification of coercion, justice simply fails to apply to that realm.

Both the extreme and moderate versions of right institutionalism have been criticized, broadly, on two fronts. First, some have argued that the right institutionalist focus on coercion has been misguided. If we strip away coercive institutions, or were somehow able to make coercive institutions non-coercive, but retained the various regimes of economic cooperation, we would still have obligations of distributive justice. I turn to these arguments in the next section. The second objection is an internal critique that denies their second shared claim. On this objection, the international realm is a coercive legal system and thereby activates principles of distributive justice akin to those in the domestic arena. Right institutionalism depends on the coercive nature of domestic politics being different from that of international politics. Those who argue against it thereby try to close the gap by pointing out the many ways in which coercion is deployed internationally. Cohen and Sabel (2006) argue that the collective activities of various states have created an international organization (the WTO) that can essentially issue coercive threats: follow WTO or suffer impoverishment as a consequence of being denied access to global markets. They write:

Still, it might be said that any complaint against global rule-making bodies should really be directed against the state for accepting their [the World Trade Organization] directives…But this point seems almost facetious. Opting out is not a real option (the WTO is a “take it or leave it” arrangement without even the formal option of picking and choosing which parts to comply with), and given that it is not, and that everyone knows that it is not, there is a direct rule-making relationship between the global bodies and the citizens of different states.

Eric Cavallero (2010), on the other hand, argues that the international system is coercive in a much more direct way: Great Powers (including and especially the United States) coercively enforce international norms of property by invading or covertly deposing nations that misbehave. Arash Abizadeh (2007) has emphasized the coercion inherent in the maintenance of borders and territorial integrity, especially in response to immigration. If states claim the right to determine who enters their territory, then they place themselves in the position of coercing non-citizens in virtue of the methods they use to prevent those who wish to cross their borders from doing so. In each case, the structure of the objection is quite similar: states coerce via invasion and espionage, via collective action through international institutions, and via border maintenance, therefore the international system is coercive in nature and, thus, appropriately calls for egalitarian distributive justice.

These objections have forced right institutionalists to become more attentive to the ways in which coercive contexts can be different. As a consequence, the responses to these objections will be complex. For example, it is clear that a state requiring a citizen to purchase health insurance, stopping a non-citizen at the border, or using a covert paramilitary organization to topple an unfriendly regime are all examples of coercion, but are they all the same type of coercion and do they all subsequently demand the same normative response? Furthermore, should we evaluate these coercive activities in their current form—where the international world is populated by rogue states, failed and failing states, and burdened societies—or should we evaluate these coercive activities based on how they would operate with a genuine Society of Peoples? At any rate, the debate is ongoing as right institutionalists are pushed by these objections to create more sophisticated accounts of coercion and to consider coercion is more specific contexts (see Blake 2011).

3.2 The Basic Structure as Cooperative Interdependence

Left institutionalists are distinguished from right institutionalists in three ways. First, left institutionalists tend to argue for more robust distributive obligations that operate directly on the institutions that characterize international politics. Second, they tend to reject a strongly bifurcated view of the differences between international and domestic justice, some arguing that there is no difference, others arguing that there are many institutional contexts that give rise to distributive obligations, and still others claiming that domestic and international institutional contexts, and their corresponding principles of distributive justice, operate on a smooth continuum. Lastly, and perhaps most importantly, left institutionalists reject the right institutionalist emphasis on coercion in activating claims of distributive justice. To the contrary, left institutionalists typically characterize the basic structure in terms of cooperation, the provision of basic goods, or economic interdependence. (Sangiovanni, 2007, 19–20)

We have already examined some early left institutionalist responses above. We will, here, consider some more recent extensions of the view. These thinkers generally accept that the state—with its coercive legal apparatus—gives rise to especially stringent demands of distributive justice. However, they argue that the nature of the global economic system also gives rise to robust distributive obligations. These distributive obligations arise directly in virtue of the institutional features of the global economic system irrespective of their effects on domestic justice. What differentiates them from the early, more radical left institutionalist thinkers, is that they recognize and accept that distinct norms of egalitarian concern might be appropriate in the domestic and global contexts. Moderate left institutionalists then accept with Rawls a two-tiered account of global justice; they differ from right institutionalists (and from Rawls) in arguing that distinct norms of distributive justice apply to individuals at the global level.

Moderate left institutionalists generally present some view as to what activates these distributive obligations. Darrell Moellendorf (2011), for example, offers the following, jointly sufficient criteria:

The version of membership dependence that I affirm is based upon what I term the principle of associational justice. The idea is that duties of social justice exist between persons who have a moral duty of equal respect to one another if those persons are co-members in an association that is (1) relatively strong, (2) largely nonvoluntary, (3) constitutive of a significant part of the background rules for the various relationships of their public lives, and (4) governed by norms that can be subject to human control.

Cohen and Sabel (2006) have offered three distinct principles by which these distributive duties might be justified. Andrea Sangiovanni (2007), despite the fact that his view has much in common with right institutionalisn, presents a left-oriented view because his account of international distributive justice is both non-coercive and direct:

I will argue that equality is a relational ideal of reciprocity among those who support and maintain the state's capacity to provide the basic collective goods necessary to protect us from physical attack and to maintain a stable system of property rights and entitlements. (Sangiovanni, 2007, 19–20.)

These views can all be used to directly evaluate global inequalities. However, unlike the more extreme left institutionalism of early Beitz and Pogge, each view produces comparatively less egalitarian results at the global level. Mollendorf argues that, even though both the global economic system and the state satisfy all four criteria, the former activates obligations of ‘reciprocity’ while the latter activates the obligations of ‘inclusive and equal citizenship.’ Cohen and Sabel argue that the state requires liberal egalitarianism while international institutions create obligations of ‘inclusion.’ In both cases, the obligations at the global level are less robust than at the domestic. Similarly, Sangiovanni argues that the provision of collective goods generates an obligation of reciprocity, understood as egalitarian shares. The global economic system gives rise to distributive obligations, but the scope of the obligation is limited to the public goods produced by the system itself, in the event it comes to produce them (whether it currently does so is a matter of controversy). This means that Sangiovanni's account could be indifferent to considerable inequality among citizens of different countries as long as reciprocity held within each country and obtained in the contribution to a system of physical and economic rights made by the international system. What is important to note about moderate left institutionalism, and what distinguishes it from the more extreme version, is that moderates seek robust principles of distributive justice that apply to the particular domain of the global that are of apiece with the principles of distributive justice domestically but are nonetheless sensitive to the differences between the two domains.

Moderate left institutionalist views are considerably more diverse when compared to moderate right institutionalists: there is no central concept—like coercion—that binds them together. And moderate left institutionalism, as a view that is responsive to the particular features of international institutions, has much to recommend it. However, there are some areas of concern. First, one might worry that many left institutionalist arguments import notions of coercion into their view. Mollendorf makes ‘non-voluntariness’ one of the criteria of distributively relevant institutions, which seems to imply that individuals or states that don't wish to participate in the global economy will be coerced into doing so, generally by threat of economic catastrophe. Similarly, Cohen and Sabel present their three ‘weak’ non-coercive accounts of when obligations of distributive justice are activated, but their argument that the WTO should invoke norms of inclusion is based—at least partly—on the fact that the WTO can issue coercive threats. Sangiovanni discusses the provision of public goods, which may seem non-coercive, but if these public goods are necessary for even minimally decent lives, then it seems that the threat of their non-provision could very well be a coercive one. To put it another way, is it really the case that economic cooperation through trade—even institutionalized in order to solve coordination problems—is ever enough to invoke norms of distributive justice if there is no chance that that economic cooperation, no matter how unequally distributed, will undermine the possibility of the participants to live decent lives? The worry here is that left institutionalists might be begging the question by assuming that the international system is indeed coercive, will remain coercive even if reformed, and is coercive in precisely way needed to generate obligations of distributive justice. Left institutionalists, therefore, are quite adept at identifying injustices in the international arena, but they are less persuasive at showing that the appropriate normative response to these wrongs is to have the international system be governed by principles of distributive justice. For example, suppose Mollendorf is correct that the WTO wrongly forces an inappropriate development model on weak and failing nations that serves the rich and powerful while undermining the ability of those nations to become democratically well-ordered. Certainly the right response to recognizing this wrong is to have the WTO cease that unjust behavior. It is hard to see why we would need the more robust norm of distributive equality to understand the wrongness of the WTO's behavior.

4. The New Cosmopolitanism and Beyond

As the above discussion demonstrates, much work in global justice begins with interpretations of—and arguments about—Rawlsian principles. Some recent work, however, has sought to break the Rawlsian spell, by demonstrating the plausibility of principles and theories not foundationally linked to Rawlsian arguments. This work includes many recent philosophical theories which—while undoubtedly influenced by Rawls—are less concerned with applying Rawlsian methods directly to global institutions (see also Miller 2010; Brock 2009; Altman and Wellman 2009). We will here examine only two important recent contributions to this project. The first, which we might call pure egalitarianism, argues that egalitarianism applies among persons considered as human; no institutional framework is needed to give rise to strong duties of distributive justice. The second, associated with Thomas Pogge, argues that the global institutional structure we see today is not merely unjust, but actively violating the negative rights of the global poor. We will consider these arguments in turn.

4.1 Pure egalitarianism

The dispute between left and right institutionalism has centered on how to interpret the institutions found at the global level; both sides in the debate agreed that the nature of these institutions is of primary importance in establishing whether or not egalitarian duties hold globally. Some recent theorists, however, have challenged this assumption. On this vision, what is relevant from the standpoint of justice is only whether or not a particular agent is, in fact, a recognizably human agent—not whether that agent stands in a particular relationship as regards other humans. Simon Caney is a chief exponent of this theoretical perspective, and defends it as follows:

Consider a world with two separate systems of interaction that have no contact but are aware of each other and suppose that one of them is prosperous whereas the other is extremely impoverished. Compare, now, two individuals—one from the prosperous system and one from the impoverished system—who are identical in their abilities and needs. The member of the prosperous system receives more. But it is difficult to see why—concentrating on any possible and reasonable criteria for entitlement—this is fair. Ex hypothesi, she is not more hard-working or more gifted or more needy. In all respects they are identical (bar one, namely that one is lucky to live in the prosperous society and one is not) and yet an institutionalist approach confers on one many more benefits. Moreover, it does so wholly arbitrarily because there is no ground on which the member of the prosperous society can claim to be entitled to more. (Caney 2005, 111; see also Tan 2004)

This form of egalitarianism has some undisputed attractions. It keeps the moral attention focused on human persons, which is—we might agree—right where it ought to be. It is compatible, moreover, with a variety of different theories of what might be the appropriate metric with which to demonstrate our egalitarian respect; Caney argues that a global principle of equality of opportunity is likely superior to one based upon resources (Caney 2003). It is compatible, moreover, with the institutions we have developed being relevant from the standpoint of justice, insofar as they help or hinder efforts to live up to the demands of global equality. It insists, in the end, only that such institutions are at most helpful tools, rather than foundational forms of human relationship that give rise to distinct moral duties.

The problem with this form of egalitarianism, however, is that comparatively few of us are prepared to take distributive equality as a foundational value; most of us believe that distributive equality is relevant only within certain relational contexts, as a way of guaranteeing that individuals are not dominated or marginalized within those relationships (Anderson 1999). To say that equality is itself a value independently of these considerations comes perilously close to making envy a core part of liberal equality. Return once again to the example of Atlantis. Imagine that the world were made fully just, according to whatever conception of justice you require, and that the island of Atlantis them rose into that just world; imagine further that every Atlantean were possessed of a small quantity of diamonds, which made them significantly more wealthy than the average person. Would the Atlanteans have the duty, simply in virtue of common humanity, to redistribute their diamonds, so as to ensure equality? The answer, for a pure egalitarian, must be yes; this answer, however, seems to say that what was a just world has now become unjust, simply because we are made aware of others doing better for themselves than we are (Blake 2012). This particular vision of egalitarianism depends upon an ideal of quality that many people—including both right and left Rawlsians—have regarded as deeply problematic.

4.2 Poverty and Causation

The pure egalitarian impulse begins with the idea that we have duties of justice towards one another that do not depend upon shared institutions. Thomas Pogge's recent work, in contrast, argues that institutions are morally central—but in a manner somewhat unlike that argued for by the left Rawlsians. (Pogge was, of course, an early advocate of left institutionalism, but his more recent work does not depend upon left institutionalism being true.) Pogge's recent work (see, especially, 2002) has argued that the institutions we have built in the world are, in fact, directly violating the rights of the poor. We can start our analysis here by noting the starkness of Pogge's conclusion: global poverty represents, for Pogge, not just an unmet humanitarian obligation, but an ongoing human evil, perhaps the greatest one in history. Pogge's argument insists that international poverty and underdevelopment—and the death and wasted potential this entails—find their causal origin in a set of global institutions created and imposed by the wealthy nations of the world upon the global poor (Pogge 2010a; Pogge 2002). As such, the poverty of the underdeveloped nations is not simply a fact in the world, to be dealt with by comparatively weak moral notions of humanitarian benefit and charity; it is, instead, a violation of the rights of the poor. It is not simply a violation of their legitimate expectations; they might expect to be helped, for instance, and we are not merely refraining from doing that. It is a violation of their negative rights to be free from harm. The poorer inhabitants of the world have rights that are being violated, on a massive scale, by the wealthy states. One significant mechanism for this violation is the ascription of the resource and borrowing privilege to any organization able to take effective political control of a territorial jurisdiction. A group does not have to truly represent the interests of a place's inhabitants, on the rules set up by international law, in order to sell that jurisdiction's resources. So long as an agent is able to effectively control and repress the inhabitants, it has the ability to speak in their name in international treaty-making—regardless of how badly it treats these inhabitants. The result, for Pogge, is that the institutions of global society have set up incentives by which undemocratic regimes are rewarded and encouraged in the underdeveloped countries, and in which resources predictably flow from these countries to those already blessed with wealth. The shared history of colonial rule, moreover, has led to the radical underdevelopment experienced by many former colonies, with the result that these colonies are likely to be exceptionally vulnerable to the decisions and acts of agents within former colonial powers. Global institutions are, in the end, developed and maintained to benefit the wealthier nations that set these institutions up, and whose participation is necessary for their survival as institutions. They serve only to impose a set of property rules upon the poorer nations that guarantee their continued poverty and underdevelopment.

Pogge's analysis is powerful, and includes a number of valuable positive suggestions about how we might begin to rectify these defects—including revisions in how pharmaceutical research is incentivized, and mechanisms for a global tax on resource use (Pogge 1994 and 2011). For the moment, though, we may examine only the major critical responses to which Pogge's argument has been subjected. Most of Pogge's critics agree with his contention that international poverty is unjust, in addition to being a violation of humanitarian duties. These critics, though, have frequently questioned whether or not Pogge has made his case that this poverty is causally ascribable to the international institutional set—and that simple revisions in this set could dramatically decrease global poverty.

The first form of critique begins with an objection to Pogge's idea that global institutions cause international poverty. The worry with this idea begins with concerns about the idea that the notion of a cause can be, without certain controversial assumptions, be easily ascribed to anything as complex as the global institutional set. In particular, for an institution to be said to have caused a result, there must be a comprehensible baseline of expectations to which the existing result might be compared. Alan Patten and Mathias Risse have each provided a version of this critique. Patten argues that Pogge illegitimately smuggles in a moralized baseline of expectations, in which the inhabitants of the poorer nations obtain the resources and rights they would have under ideal justice; this baseline is what the poor deserve, argues Patten, but it is a stretch to say that the wealthy nations cause the poverty of the poor when they fail to bring about ideal justice (Patten 2005). Mathias Risse offers an even more pointed criticism, pointing out that the usual baseline for causation to be ascribed to an interaction is the expectations that would hold in the absence of such interaction (Risse 2005). Risse points out that the statistical baseline for most of humanity throughout history has been radical poverty and misery. On this analysis, the interaction between the poor and the rich might be taken to have increased the wealth of the poor, rather than caused their poverty. This is compatible, of course, with the existence of duties of justice as regards the benefits of industrialization and globalization; the poor may have become slightly better off, but the wealthy have undoubtedly gotten much, much richer, and we might develop theories that condemn this gap. Pogge's contention that global poverty is caused by the wealthy societies of the world, though, seems—to Risse and Patten—simply incorrect.

Joshua Cohen offers a more wide-reaching version of these concerns. He, too, begins with the difficulty of saying that the poverty of the global poor is caused by the wealth of the global rich (Cohen 2011). He challenges, that is, the extent to which the global institutions imposed by the wealthy are actually causally responsible. His analysis, though, draws more on modern development economics, and notes that modern theorists have identified various factors that might determine why some countries are poor and some are rich: they include the institutions described by Pogge, but they also include such endogenous factors as geography, resource allocation, and political culture (Easterly 2006). The precise weighting and power of these various factors is, of course, a matter of tremendous disagreement and controversy, and much of the field of development economics is devoted to developing more complete and powerful analyses of how the relative wealth and poverty of nations is to be explained. This is a difficulty for Pogge, argues Cohen, since his analysis of poverty includes only two possibilities: either the poor nations of the world are responsible for their own poverty, which is implausible, or the rich nations of the world are responsible for that poverty. Cohen's conclusion is that Pogge has not adequately come to terms with the empirical complexity of how poverty is to be explained, and that as a result his conclusions about international culpability for poverty are simply unmotivated.

The debate between Pogge and his critics, of course, continues (see Pogge 2010b); Pogge is able to offer rejoinders to many of the objections discussed here. In particular, Pogge has emphasized recently that the baseline with which his analysis proceeds is one of a reasonable alternative set of arrangements that would not generate this massive human rights deficit. It is important to recognize, though, that much of this debate turns on a mixture of empirical social science and political philosophy. This is, we believe, likely to be a territory in which an increasing amount of work on global justice will have to be situated in the years to come. We can therefore turn to our last section, concerned with future directions for research.

5. Future directions

It is rarely a smart move to make predictions within philosophy. Nevertheless, it is perhaps appropriate to offer a few views about what we are likely to see in future work about global justice. The first, following on our discussion of Pogge's work, is an increased engagement by philosophers with empirical evidence and empirical methods. Apart from the pure egalitarians, political philosophers all make assumptions about the nature and powers of global institutions; these assumptions can be grounded—or refuted—by engagement with international lawyers, development economists, and the like. To some extent, this engagement is already happening (Pogge and Reddy 2010; Hassoun and Subramanian 2012). More of this engagement is, we believe, both likely and likely to be beneficial.

The second trend we would identify is that there is increasingly likely a need for political philosophy dealing with specific global phenomena. Much of what we have dealt with here has looked only at the macro-level phenomenon of global inequality. A full analysis of global justice will also look at specific forms of human institution and agency that are likely to be relevant from the standpoint of justice. We have already mentioned, if only in passing, the issues of immigration, fairness in trade, and feminism. We would conclude here by mentioning some other areas of inquiry that might become increasingly important. Allan Buchanan and Thomas Pogge have both produced recent work on global incentives for pharmaceutical research (Buchanan 2009; Pogge 2009). Lea Ypi has written on the issue of global debt relief (Ypi 2009). Stephen Gardiner and Simon Caney have written on the relationship of global climate change and global inequality (Gardiner 2004, Caney 2008 and 2009). Increasingly, we believe that these sorts of analyses are likely to proliferate, and philosophers come to terms not just with the fact of inequality, but with the plurality of different reasons for—and solutions to—that inequality. Political philosophy has only recently turned its attention to questions of global justice; it is our hope that this attention will deepen in years to come, as we gain more understanding of the nature and causes of global underdevelopment and inequality.


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