Optimality-Theoretic and Game-Theoretic Approaches to Implicature

First published Fri Dec 1, 2006; substantive revision Mon Nov 9, 2015

Linguistic pragmatics studies the context-dependent use and interpretation of expressions. Perhaps the most important notion in pragmatics is Grice's (1967) conversational implicature. It is based on the insight that by means of general principles of rational cooperative behavior we can communicate more with the use of a sentence than the conventional semantic meaning associated with it. Grice has argued, for instance, that the exclusive interpretation of ‘or’—according to which we infer from ‘John or Mary came’ that John and Mary didn't come both—is not due to the semantic meaning of ‘or’ but should be accounted for by a theory of conversational implicature. In this particular example,—a typical example of a so-called Quantity implicature—the hearer's implication is taken to follow from the fact that the speaker could have used a contrasting, and informatively stronger expression, but chose not to. Other implicatures may follow from what the hearer thinks that the speaker takes to be normal states of affairs, i.e., stereotypical interpretations. For both types of implicatures, the hearer's (pragmatic) interpretation of an expression involves what he takes to be the speaker's reason for using this expression. But obviously, this speaker's reason must involve assumptions about the hearer's reasoning as well.

In this entry we will discuss formal accounts of conversational implicatures that explicitly take into account the interactive reasoning of speaker and hearer (e.g., what speaker and hearer believe about each other, the relevant aspects of the context of utterance etc.) and that aim to reductively explain conversational implicature as the result of goal-oriented, economically optimized language use.

1. Bidirectional Optimality Theory

1.1 Bidirectional OT and Quantity implicatures

Optimality Theory (OT) is a linguistic theory which assumes that linguistic choices are governed by competition between a set of candidates, or alternatives. In standard OT (Prince & Smolensky, 1993) the optimal candidate is the one that satisfies best a set of violable constraints. After its success in phonology, OT has also been used in syntax, semantics and pragmatics. The original idea of optimality-theoretic semantics was to model interpretation by taking the candidates to be the alternative interpretations that the hearer could assign to a given expression, with constraints describing general preferences over expression-interpretation pairs. Blutner (1998, 2000) extended this original version by taking also alternative expressions, or forms, into account that the speaker could have used, but did not. The reference to alternative expressions/forms is standard in pragmatics to account for Quantity implicatures. Optimization should thus be thought of from two directions: that of the hearer, and that of the speaker. What is optimal, according to Blutner's Bidirectional-OT (Bi-OT), is not just interpretations with respect to forms, but rather form-interpretation pairs. In terms of a ‘better than’ relation ‘>’ between form-interpretation pairs, the pair ⟨f,i⟩ is said to be (strongly) optimal iff it satisfies the following two conditions:

  • ¬∃i′ : ⟨f,i′⟩ > ⟨f,i
  • ¬∃f′ : ⟨f′,i⟩ > ⟨f,i

The first condition requires that i is an optimal interpretation of form f. In Bi-OT this condition is thought of as optimization from the hearer's point of view. Blutner proposed that ⟨f,i′⟩ > ⟨f,i⟩ iff i′ is a more likely, or stereotypical, interpretation of f than i is: P(i′ | ⟦ f ⟧) > P(i | ⟦ f  ⟧) (where ⟦ f ⟧ denotes the semantic meaning of f, and P(B | A) the conditional probability of B given A, defined as P(AB)/P(A)). The second condition is taken to involve speaker's optimization: for ⟨f,i⟩ to be optimal for the speaker, it has to be the case that she cannot use a more optimal form f ′ to express i. ⟨f ′,i⟩ > ⟨f,i⟩ iff either (i) P(i | ⟦f ′⟧) > P(i | ⟦ f ⟧), or (ii) P(i | f ′⟧) = P(i | ⟦ f ⟧) and f ′ is a less complex form to express i than f is.

Bi-OT accounts for classical Quantity implicatures. A convenient (though controversial) example is the ‘exactly’-interpretation of number terms. Let us assume, for the sake of example, that number terms semantically have an ‘at least’-meaning.[1] Still, we want to account for the intuition that the sentence “Three children came to the party” is normally interpreted as saying that exactly three children came to the party. One way to do this is to assume that the alternative expressions that the speaker could use are of the form “(At least) n children came to the party”, while the alternative interpretations for the hearer are of type in meaning that “Exactly n children came to the party”.[2] If we assume, again for the sake of example, that all relevant interpretations are considered equally likely and that it is already commonly assumed that some children came, but not more than four, the strongly optimal form-interpretation pairs can be read off the following table:

P(i | ⟦ f ⟧) i1 i2 i3 i4
‘one’ ⇒¼ ¼ ¼ ¼
‘two’ 0 13 13 13
‘three’ 0 0 ⇒½ ½
‘four’ 0 0 0 ⇒1

In this table the entry P(i3 | ⟦‘two’⟧) = 13 because P(i3 | {i2,i3,i4}) = 13. Notice that according to this reasoning ‘two’ is interpreted as ‘exactly 2’ (as indicated by an arrow) because (i) P(i2 | ⟦‘two’⟧) = 13 is higher than P(i2 | ⟦‘n’⟧) for any alternative expression ‘n’, and (ii) all other interpretations compatible with the semantic meaning of the numeral expression are blocked: there is, for instance, another expression for which i4 is a better interpretation, i.e., an interpretation with a higher conditional probability.

With numeral terms, the semantic meanings of the alternative expressions give rise to a linear order. This turns out to be crucial for the Bi-OT analysis, if we continue to take the interpretations as specific as we have done so far. Consider the following alternative answers to the question “Who came to the party?”:

  1. John came to the party.
  2. John or Bill came to the party.

Suppose that John and Bill are the only relevant persons and that it is presupposed that somebody came to the party. In that case the table that illustrates bidirectional optimality reasoning looks as follows (where ix is the interpretation that only x came):

P(i | ⟦ f ⟧) ij ib ijb
‘John’ ⇒½ 0 ½
‘Bill’ 0 ⇒½ ½
‘John and Bill’ 0 0 ⇒ 1
‘John or Bill’ 13 13 13

This table correctly predicts that (1) is interpreted as saying that only John came. But now consider the disjunction (2). Intuitively, this answer should be interpreted as saying that either only John, or only Bill came. It is easy to see, however, that this is predicted only if ‘John came’ and ‘Bill came’ are not taken to be alternative forms. Bi-OT predicts that in case also ‘John came’ and ‘Bill came’ are taken to be alternatives, the disjunction is uninterpretable, because the specific interpretations ij, ib, and ijb all can be expressed better by other forms. In general, one can see that in case the semantic meanings of the alternative expressions are not linearly, but only partially ordered, the derivation of Quantity implicatures sketched above gives rise to partially wrong predictions.

As it turns out, this problem for Bi-OT seems larger than it really is. Intuitively, an answer like (2) suggests that the speaker has incomplete information (she doesn't know who of John or Bill came). But the interpretations that we considered so far are world states that do not encode different amounts of speaker knowledge. So, to take this into account in Bi-OT (or in any other analysis of Quantity implicatures) we should allow for alternative interpretations that represent different knowledge states of the speaker. Aloni (2007) gives a Bi-OT account of ignorance implicatures (inferences, like the above, that the speaker lacks certain bits of possibly relevant information), alongside indifference implicatures (that the speaker does not consider bits of information relevant enough to convey). Moreover, it can be shown that, as far as ignorance implicatures are concerned, the predictions of Bi-OT line up with the pragmatic interpretation function called ‘Grice’ in various (joint) papers of Schulz and Van Rooij (e.g. Schulz & Van Rooij, 2006). In these papers it is claimed that Grice implements the Gricean maxim of Quality and the first maxim of Quantity, and it is shown that in terms of it (together with an additional assumption of competence) we can account for many conversational implicatures, including the ones of (1) and (2).

1.2 A Bi-OT analysis of Horn's division

Bi-OT can also account for Horn's division of pragmatic labor or M-implicatures, as they are alternatively sometimes called after Levinson (2000)—according to which an (un)marked expression (morphologically complex and less lexicalized) typically gets an (un)marked interpretation—which Horn (1984) claimed to follow from the interaction between both Gricean submaxims of Quantity, and the maxims of Relation and Manner. To illustrate, consider the following well-known example:

  1. John killed the sheriff.
  2. John caused the sheriff to die.

We typically interpret the unmarked (3) as meaning stereotypical killing (on purpose), while the marked (4) suggests that John killed the sheriff in a more indirect way, maybe unintentionally. Blutner (1998, 2000) shows that this can be accounted for in Bi-OT. Take ist to be the more plausible interpretation where John killed the sheriff in the stereotypical way, while i¬st is the interpretation where John caused the sheriff's death in an unusual way. Because (3) is less complex than (4), and ist is the more stereotypical interpretation compatible with the semantic meaning of (3), it is predicted that (3) is interpreted as ist. Thus, in terms of his notion of strong optimality, i.e., optimality for both speaker and hearer, Blutner can account for the intuition that sentences typically get the most plausible, or stereotypical, interpretation. In terms of this notion of optimality, however, Blutner is not able yet to explain how the more complex form (4) can have an interpretation at all, in particular, why it will be interpreted as non-stereotypical killing. The reason is that on the assumption that (4) has the same semantic meaning as (3), the stereotypical interpretation would be hearer-optimal not only for (3), but also for (4).

To account for the intuition that (4) is interpreted in a non-stereotypical way, Blutner (2000) introduces a weaker notion of optimality that also takes into account a notion of blocking: one form's pragmatically assigned meaning can take away, so to speak, that meaning from another, less favorable form. In the present case, the stereotypical interpretation is intuitively blocked for the cumbersome form (4) by the cheaper alternative expression (3). Formally, a form-interpretation pair ⟨f,i⟩ is weakly optimal[3] iff there is neither a strongly optimal ⟨f,i′⟩ such that ⟨f,i′⟩ > ⟨f,i⟩ nor a strongly optimal ⟨f ′,i⟩ such that ⟨f ′,i⟩ > ⟨f,i⟩. All form-interpretation pairs that are strongly optimal are also weakly optimal. However, a pair that is not strongly optimal like ⟨(4),i¬st⟩ can still be weakly optimal: since neither ⟨(4),ist⟩ nor ⟨(3),i¬st⟩ is strongly optimal, there is no objection for ⟨(4),i¬st⟩ to be a (weakly) optimal pair. As a result, the marked (4) will get the on-stereotypical interpretation. In general, application of the above definition of weak optimality can be difficult, but Jäger (2002) gives a concise algorithm for computing weakly optimal form-interpretation pairs.

2. Implicatures and Game Theory

2.1 Signaling games

David Lewis (1969) introduced signaling games to explain how messages can be used to communicate something, although these messages do not have a pre-existing meaning. In pragmatics we want to do something similar: explain what is actually communicated by an expression whose actual interpretation is underspecified by its conventional semantic meaning. It is therefore a natural idea to base pragmatics on Lewisian signaling games.

A signaling game is a game of asymmetric information between a sender s and a receiver r. The sender observes the state t that s and r are in, while the receiver has to perform an action. Sender s can try to influence the action taken by r by sending a message. T is the set of states, F the set of forms, or messages. We assume that the messages already have a semantic meaning, given by the semantic interpretation function ⟦·⟧ which assigns to each form a subset of T. The sender will send a message/form in each state, a sender strategy S is thus a function from T to F. The receiver will perform an action after hearing a message with a particular semantic meaning, but for present purposes we can think of actions simply as interpretations. A receiver strategy R is then a function that maps a message to an interpretation, i.e., a subset of T. A utility function for speaker and hearer represents what interlocutors care about, and so the utility function models what speaker and hearer consider to be relevant information (implementing Grice's Maxim of Relevance). For simplicity, we assume that the utility functions of s and r (Us and Ur) are the same (implementing Grice's cooperative principle), and that they depend on (i) the actual state t, (ii) the receiver's interpretation, i, of the message f sent by s in t according to their respective strategies R and S, i.e., i = R(S(t)), and (iii) (in section 2.3) the form f = S(t) used by the sender. We assume that Nature picks the state according to some (commonly known) probability distribution P over T. With respect to this probability function, we can determine the expected, or average, utility of each sender-receiver strategy combination ⟨S,R⟩ for player e ∈ {s,r} as follows:

EUe(S,R) = tT P(t) × Ue(t,S(t),R(S(t))).

A signaling game is then a (simplified, abstract) model of a single utterance and its interpretation, which includes some of the arguably most relevant features of a context for pragmatic reasoning: an asymmetry of information (speaker knows the world state, hearer does not), a notion of utterance alternatives (in the set of messages/forms) with associated semantic meaning, and a flexible representation of what counts of relevant information (via utility functions). If this is not enough, e.g., if we want the listener to have partial information not shared by the speaker as well (such as when the speaker is uncertain about what is really relevant for the listener), that can easily be accommodated into a more complex game model, but we refrain from going more complex here. The strategies of sender and receiver encode particular ways of using and interpreting language. The notion of expected utility evaluates how good ways of using and interpreting language are (in the given context). Game-theoretic explanations of pragmatic phenomena aim to single out those sender-receiver strategy pairs that correspond to empirically attested behavior as optimal and/or rational solution of the game problem.

The standard solution concept of game theory is Nash equilibrium. A Nash equilibrium of a signaling game is a pair of strategies ⟨S*,R*⟩ which has the property that neither the sender nor the receiver could increase his or her expected utility by unilateral deviation. Thus, S* is a best response to R* and R* is a best response to S*. There are plenty of refinements of Nash equilibrium in the game-theoretic literature. Moreover, there are alternatives to equilibrium analyses, the two most prominent of which are: (i) explicit formalizations of agents' reasoning processes, such as is done in epistemic game theory (e.g., Perea 2012), and (ii) variants of evolutionary game theory (e.g., Sandholm 2010) that study the dynamic changes in agents' behavioral disposition under gradual optimization procedures, such as by imitation or learning from parents. These issues are relevant for applications to linguistic pragmatics as well, as we will demonstrate presently with the example of M-implicatures/Horn's division of pragmatic labor.

2.2 A game-theoretic explanation of Horn's division

We would like to account for the meaning difference between (3) and (4), as before in the context of Bi-OT. Suppose we have 2 states, tst and t¬st, and 2 messages, fu and fm. As before, the semantic meaning of both messages is {tst,t¬st}, but tst is more stereotypical, or probable, than t¬st: P(tst) > P(t¬st). We decompose the sender's utility function into a benefit and a cost function, Us(t,f,i) = Bs(t,i) − C(f), where i is an interpretation. We adopt the following benefit function: Bs(t,i) = 1 if i = t, and Bs(t,i) = 0 otherwise. The cost of the unmarked message fu is lower than the cost of the marked message fm. We can assume without loss of generality that C(fu) = 0 < C(fm). We also assume that it is always better to have successful communication with a costly message than unsuccessful communication with a cheap message, which means that C(fm), though greater than C(fu), must remain reasonably small. The sender and receiver strategies are as before. The combination of sender and receiver strategies that gives rise to the bijective mapping {⟨tst,fu⟩, ⟨t¬st,fm⟩} is a Nash equilibrium of this game. And this equilibrium encodes Horn's division of pragmatic labor: the unmarked (and lighter) message fu expresses the stereotypical interpretation tst, while the non-stereotypical state t¬st is expressed by the marked and costlier message fm. Unfortunately, also the mapping {⟨tst,fm⟩, ⟨t¬st,fu⟩} —where the lighter message denotes the non-stereotypical situation—is a Nash equilibrium of the game, which means that on the present implementation the standard solution concept of game theory cannot yet single out the desired outcome.

This is were considerations of equilibrium refinements and/or alternative solution concepts come in. For example, Parikh (1991, 2001) argues that we should use an equilibrium refinement. He observes that, of the two equilibria mentioned above, the first one Pareto-dominates the second, and that for this reason the former should be preferred. Van Rooij (2004) suggests that because Horn's division of pragmatic labor involves not only language use but also language organization, one should look at signaling games from an evolutionary point of view, and make use of those variants of evolutionary game theory that explain the emergence of Pareto-optimal solutions. As a third alternative, following some ideas of De Jaegher (2008), van Rooij (2008) proposes that one could also make use of forward induction (a particular game-theoretic way of reasoning about surprising moves of the opponent) to single out the desired equilibrium. As an example of an approach that draws on detailed modelling of the epistemic states of interlocutors, Franke (2014a) suggests that we should distinguish cases of M-implicature that involve rather clear ad hoc reasoning, such as (5) and (6), from cases with a possibly more grammaticalized contrast, such as between (3) and (4).

  1. Mrs T sang ‘Home Sweet Home’.
  2. Mrs T produces a series of sounds roughly corresponding to the score of ‘Home Sweet Home’.

Franke suggests that the game model for reasoning about (5) and (6) should contain an element of asymmetry of alternatives: whereas it is reasonable (for a speaker to expect that) a listener would consider (5) to be an alternative utterance when hearing (6), it is quite implausible that (a speaker believes that) a listener will consider (6) a potential alternative utterance when hearing (5). This asymmetry of alternatives translates into different beliefs that the listener will have about the context after different messages. The speaker can anticipate this, and a listener who has actually observed (6) can reason about his own counterfactual context representation that he would have had if the speaker had said (5) instead. Franke shows that, when paired with this asymmetry in context representation, a simple model of iterated best response reasoning, to which we turn next, gives the desired result as well.

2.3 Quantity implicatures and iterated reasoning

Unlike the case of M-implicatures, many Quantity implicatures hinge on the fact that alternative expressions differ with respect to logical strength: the inference from ‘three’ to the pragmatically strengthed ‘exactly three’-reading, that we sketched in Section 1.1, draws on the fact that the alternative expression ‘four’ is semantically stronger, i.e., ‘four’ semantically entails ‘three’, but not the other way around, under the assumed ‘at least’-semantics. In order to bring considerations of semantic strength to bear on game-theoretic pragmatics, we must assign conventional meaning some role in either the game model or the solution concept. In the following, we look at two similar, but distinct possibilities of treating semantic meaning in approaches that spell out pragmatic reasoning as chains of (higher-order) reasoning about interlocutors' rationality.

A straightforward and efficient way of bringing semantic meaning into game-theoretic pragmatics is to simply restrict the set of viable strategies of sender and receiver in a signaling game to those strategies that conform to conventional meaning: a sender can only select forms that are true of the actual state, and the receiver can only select interpretations which are in the denotation of an observed message. This may seem crude and excludes cases of non-literal language use, lying, cheating and error from the start, but it may serve to rationalize common patterns of pragmatic reasoning among cooperative, information-seeking interlocutors. Based on such a restriction to truth-obedient strategies, it has been shown independently by Pavan (2013) and Rothschild (2013) that there is an established non-equilibrium solution concept that nicely rationalizes Quantity implicatures, namely iterated admissibility, also known as iterated elimination of weakly dominated strategies. Without going into detail, the general idea of this solution concept is to start with the whole set of viable strategies (all conforming to semantic meaning) and then to iteratively eliminate all strategies X for which there is no cautious belief about which of the opponent's remaining strategies the opponent will likely play that would make X a rational thing to do. (A cautious belief is one that does not exclude any opponent strategy that has not been eliminated so far.) The set of strategies that survive repeated iterations of elimination are then compatible with (a particular kind of) common belief in rationality. In sum, iterated admissibility is an eliminative approach: starting from the set of all (truth-abiding) strategies, some strategies are weeded out at every step until we remain with a stable set of strategies from which nothing can be eliminated anymore.

An alternative to restricting attention to only truthful strategies is to use semantic meaning to constrain the starting point of pragmatic reasoning. Approaches that do so are the optimal assertions approach (Benz 2006, Benz & van Rooij 2007), iterated best response models (e.g., Franke 2009, 2011, Jäger 2014), and related probabilistic models (e.g., Frank & Goodman 2012, Goodman & Stuhlmüller 2013, Franke & Jäger 2014). The general idea that unifies these approaches can be traced directly to Grice, in particular the notion that speaker's should maximize the amount of relevant information contained in their utterances. Since information contained in an utterance is standardly taken to be semantic information (as opposed to pragmatically restricted or modulated meaning), a simple way of implementing Gricean speakers is to assume that they choose utterances by considering how a literal interpreter would react to each alternative. Pragmatic listeners then react optimally based on the belief that the speaker is Gricean in the above sense. In other words, these approaches define a reasoning scheme of higher-order rational reasoning: starting with a (non-rational, dummy) literal interpreter, a Gricean speaker acts (approximately) rationally based on literal interpretation, while a Gricean listener interpret (approximately) rationally based on the behavior of a Gricean speaker. Some contributions allow for higher-order iterations of best responses, others do not; some contributions also look at reasoning sequences that start with literal senders; some contributions assume that agents are strictly rational, others allow for probabilistic approximations to classical rational choice (see Franke & Jäger 2014 for overview and comparison).

A crucial difference between iterated best response approaches and the previously mentioned approach based on iterated admissibility is that the former does not shrink a set of strategies but allows for a different set of best responses at each step. This also makes it so that (some) iterated best response approaches can deal with pragmatic reasoning in cases where interlocutors' preferences are not aligned, i.e., where the Gricean assumption of cooperativity does not hold, or where there are additional incentives to deviate from semantic meaning (for more about game models for reasoning in non-cooperative contexts, see, e.g., Franke, de Jager & van Rooij 2012, de Jaegher & van Rooij 2014). Another difference between iterated best response models and iterated admissibility is that the latter do not by itself account for Horn's division of pragmatic labor (see Franke 2014b and Pavan 2014 for discussion).

To illustrate how iterated best response reasoning works in a simple (cooperative) case, let us look briefly at numerical expressions again. Take a signaling game with 4 states, or worlds, W = {w1, w2, w3, w4} where the indices give the exact/maximal number of children that came to our party, and four messages F = {‘one’,‘two’,‘three’, ‘four’}, as shorthand for ‘n children came to our party’. On a neo-Gricean ‘at least’-interpretation of numerals, the meanings of the numeral expressions form an implication chain: ⟦‘four’⟧ ⊂ ⟦‘three’⟧ ⊂ ⟦‘two’⟧ ⊂ ⟦‘one’⟧, because, for instance, ⟦‘three’⟧ = {w3, w4}. A literal interpreter, who is otherwise oblivious to contextual factors, would respond to every message by choosing any true interpretation with equal probability. So, for instance, if the literal interpreter hears ‘three’, he would choose w3 or w4, each with probability ½. But that means that an optimal choice of expression for a speaker who wants to communicate that the actual world is w3 would be ‘three’, because this maximizes the chance that the literal interpreter selects w3. Concretely, if the speaker chooses ‘one’, the chance that the literal listener chooses w3 is ¼; for ‘two’ it's ⅓; for ‘three’ it's ½, and for ‘four’ it's zero, because w3 is not an element of ⟦‘three’⟧. So, a rational Gricean speaker selects ⟦‘three’⟧ in w3 and nowhere else, as is easy to see by a parallel argument for all other states. But that means that a Gricean interpreter who hears ‘three’ will infer that the actual world must be w3.

A particularly promising recent expansion of this pragmatic reasoning scheme is to include probabilistic choice functions to model agents' approximately rational choices, so as to allow for a much more direct link with experimental data (c.f., Franke & Jäger (to appear) for overview). Such probabilistic pragmatic models have been applied to a number of phenomena of interest, including reasoning about referential expressions in context (Frank & Goodman 2012), ignorance implicatures (Goodman & Stuhlmüller 2013), non-literal interpretation of number terms (Kao et al. 2014), or Quantity implicatures in complex sentences (Potts et al. to appear).

3. Conclusion

Bidirectional Optimality Theory and Game Theory are quite natural, and similar, frameworks to formalize Gricean ideas about interactive, goal-oriented pragmatic reasoning in context. Recent developments turn towards epistemic or evolutionary game theory or to probabilistic models for empirical data.


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Robert van Rooij <R.A.M.vanRooij@uva.nl>
Michael Franke <mchfranke@gmail.com>

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