Philosophy of Immunology

First published Thu Dec 22, 2016

Immunology comprises a multifaceted research agenda that has developed around the clinical challenges of host defense, transplantation, autoimmunity, tumor immunology, and allergy. The physiological processes mediating these clinical problems designate the immune system, which, in turn, is understood in terms of establishing and maintaining organismal identity. While immunology as a science has been defined as the “science of self/nonself discrimination” (Golub and Green 1991), from a philosophical point of view, immunology is the science concerned with those mechanisms defining the identity of the organism. This more expansive definition allows for conceiving immune processes in their broadest biological context, namely, in addition to defensive and restorative processes, the immune system also may be understood as engaged in information processing and cognition; active exchange with the environment to allow for benign intercourse; and tolerance for symbiotic relationships constitutive of an organism conceived as a complex holobiont. Thus two general orientations vie for dominance: (1) the traditional biomedical concern with host defense emphasizes the insularity of the organism and immunity in service to its protection; and (2) immunity in its full ecological context—internal and external—mediates the organism’s dynamic identity in dialectical exchange with its environment. In either case, cognition—its models, metaphors, and organization—serves as the central issue pertinent to philosophical considerations of biological identity, individuality, organism, and agency.

1. Introduction

Immunology, from its earliest inception, has been concerned with biological identity—its establishment and maintenance. Three key characteristics—individuality, immunity, and identification—together have defined immune identity, and as one notion changes meaning, so do the others. Individuality undergirded the science from its inception, for the defense against pathogens was framed by an attacked patient (individual) pitted against alien others, the invaders. In this scenario, distinct borders confer individuality, and immunity is the response to the violation of those boundaries. Thus from the perspective of infectious diseases, the individual is “self-contained”. This construction satisfies both clinical evidence and the evolutionary history of immune responses to pathogens. Certain microorganisms are recognized as pathological and are identified by immune mechanisms that initiate defensive responses (Frank 2002). This is the setting of immunity in which self/nonself discrimination dominates immune theory, which is based on an understanding of biological identity, namely an entity, the self, requires defense.

However, immunity extends well beyond the protective motif to include mediation of exchange processes with the environment, where active tolerance allows nutritional assimilation and cooperative symbiotic relationships. To emphasize the flexibility of borders and the dynamic changes in the immune repertoire as a result of life-long immune encounters, Grignolio and colleagues have described the immune identity profile as “fluid” (Grignolio et al. 2014). Emphasizing the organism’s plasticity highlights how life experience alters the immune response to environmental challenges and opportunities. With this ecologically informed understanding of biological identity, the idea of immunity widens beyond defense of an insular individual, to include the mediation of the organism’s inter-active economy and dependence on the environment. This includes the internal environment as well, inasmuch as the microbiome, established through immune tolerance, has increasingly focused attention on the prevalence of symbiosis and the biology characterized by cooperative relationships of various sorts (Eberl 2010; Bilate and LaFaille 2012), and with that shift, the idea of immunity is also broadened. With this expanded theoretical framework, the understanding of “organism” moves from an autonomous entity to a complex consortium, a “holobiont” (the multicellular eukaryote plus its colonies of persistent symbionts). And accordingly, the concept of an “individual” has radically been altered (Chiu and Gilbert 2015; Gilbert and Tauber 2016). Going from the almost exclusive focus on aggressive immune responses to the study of the balance of reactivities on an immune activation gradient has altered the basic notions of immunity. Supplementing a defensive state, immunity in its full ecological context may now be regarded as an on-going process of establishing and maintaining organismal identity, which requires a collection of physiological processes with protean functions.

Originally, the defensive character of immunity designated antibody as “antitoxin” and antigen as the distinguishing characteristic of a pathogen, or, more generally, a dangerous substance. In this protective scenario, “autoimmunity” was misdirected immunity to host constituents and “allergy” resulted from a deranged identification of an innocuous substance as immunogenic. However, immune surveillance (e.g., against malignancies) was appreciated as an important immune function, as was the scavenging of effete, damaged, or dead cells by immune processes similar to those directed at pathogens under the rubric of maintaining the body’s anatomic integrity (Metchnikoff 1905). This discriminatory scenario assumed new complexity when so-called “natural antibodies” were discovered (Avrameas 1991; Varela et al. 1991). These were found to mark normal body components much like an outline of the body conceived as an “immune homunculus” (I. Cohen 1992a; Madi et al. 2009), a representative of the normal autoimmune housekeeping and sentinel activities that monitor the organism and assure its integrity. With this widened conception of immunity, autoimmunity (traditionally associated with the rejection response targeting normal components) is replaced with a beneficial self-regulatory function. And with this expanded understanding, immune activities are arrayed on a functional gradient, where various kinds of reactions are governed by different criteria of immune identification.

On this general view, the immune system’s identification processes are understood as determined not by recognition of toxicity per se, but by the context of the encounter in which the potential danger is recognized. The classification of friend or foe is determined by multiple factors that together create the setting for the immune response (Matzinger 1994). So in terms of understanding the nature of the immunity, this contextual orientation challenges the earlier conception of immune specificity as arising from some simple mechanical lock and key matching between selected antibodies binding to noxious antigens, to one characterized by a collective response of diverse elements that together determine the extent of the immune response (Daëron 2014). Thus a spectrum of reactive profiles determines the character of immunity.

In short, the philosophical challenge of defining immune identity is framed by differing orientations, namely, autonomous individuality versus collective ensemble. Which version chosen then leads to strikingly different answers to immunology’s key questions: 1) What is immunity? 2) What are the defining characteristics of individuality as determined immunologically? 3) What are the epistemological standing of immune selfhood and the rhetorical uses of agency in its various forms (literal, metaphoric, and idiomatic)? 4) How has the cognitive metaphor framed immune processes as an information processing system? and 5) How might biological causation of the immune system studied as a whole be modeled? Each of these issues directly pertains to philosophical considerations about the character of the organism, the relationships of parts to the whole, principles of biological organization and regulation, the construction of the cognitive metaphor, and the ability of models to capture complex organic functions. The literature addressing these issues is legion, but in regards to the study of immunology little philosophical comment has been made. Here, an outline is offered to help guide further considerations.

2. Immune Selfhood

The first medical use of the term “immunity” (originally a legal designation conferring exemption and distinction) appears in 1775, when Van Sweiten, a Dutch physician, used “immunitas” to describe the effects induced by an early attempt at variolization (Moulin 1991: 24). But the concept was not developed until the mid-19th century, when Claude Bernard (1813–1878) set the theoretical stage for the autonomous organism. In contradistinction to an animal in humoral balance with a pervasive environment, Bernard postulated the primacy of the organism’s essential independence. He thus furnished biology with a new concept of the animal. While interchange with the environment was a necessary requirement for life, Bernard emphasized how boundaries provided the crucial metabolic limits required for normal physiological function (Bernard [1878] 1974). With his concept of the milieu interieur, the body was envisioned as a demarcated, inter-dependent yet autonomous entity (“corporeal atomism” [E. Cohen 2001: 190]). He thereby establishing the theoretical grounding that became the sine qua non for the development of the animal-based models for infectious diseases, genetics, neurosciences, and immunology in all of its various guises.

Bernard introduced a revolutionary approach to the study of the organism, and immunology became one of its defining sciences, indeed, immunity was alien to the older humoral view. By radically changing the inside/outside topology so that the organism’s interior becomes the determining context of function, Bernard effectively isolated the organism from its environment, and joined a complex cultural movement of redefining the body more generally. This conceptual development was closely tied to those discoveries leading to the elucidation of the bacterial etiology of infectious diseases, which draws together twin disciplines—microbiology, the study of the offenders, and immunology, the examination of host defense. Thus, in this pathological context, immunology began as the study of how an animal reacts to pathogenic injury and defends itself against the deleterious effects from such microbial insult. This is the typical historical account of immunology as a clinical science, a tool of medicine, and as such it focuses almost exclusively on the role of immunity as the mechanism of defense of the infected (Silverstein 2009). The paradigmatic host is the patient, an infected “self”, which is the critical element for the power of this view. Indeed, the clinical orientation, which assumes an autonomous entity—an insular host requiring defense—set the conceptual orientation of the science and subsequent clinical conditions were adapted to this self-other dichotomous theoretical structure.

2.1 Self and nonself

That pathogens must be combatted—neutralized or killed—defined a biology of competition in the war of survival. And in this scenario three implicit ideas organized the nascent science: Immunity was constituted by the requirement of protecting an autonomous individual. Each of these features—protection, autonomy, and individuality—thus served as the foundations of what would become in due course a fully developed theory of immunity based on self/nonself discrimination. Note, the “self/nonself model” is not a model in the usual sense, but rather serves as a guiding framework or a basic presupposition of the science that begins with this differentiation of identity. (For a topology and analysis of different kinds of immunity models developed and used in the more common sense see Baetu 2014.) Accordingly, “the self” orders immune phenomena and serves as shorthand to represent immune silence or non-reactivity. In other words, virtually all models of immune function build in the basic premise of self/nonself discrimination.

The explicit differentiation of self/nonself evolved during the 1940s when transplantation biology became a focus of intense interest as a result of attempts to transplant skin to severely burned patients (Silverstein 2009). Shortly following those studies, research on autoimmunity offered a window into immune function that heretofore had not been fully appreciated. With these developments, Frank Macfarlane Burnet (1899–1985) hypothesized a model of immune regulation that would eventually define contemporary immunology. He argued that during embryonic development “self” elements were identified and once recognized, the “self-recognizers” are purged from the immune library. The expunged thus leaves a “hole” in the reactive profile of the immune system corresponding to host constituents, or as soon popularized, “the immune self” (Burnet and Fenner 1949; Tauber 1994).

In terms of practical utility, the self/nonself motif has dominated immunology for the past half century. Indeed, the implicit presence of the self formalized in the self/nonself distinction (amplified by Burnet’s later formulation in the “clonal selection theory” (CST; Burnet 1959) has justly been acknowledged as immunology’s governing paradigm (Golub and Green 1991) and has been consistently defended by those committed to the self/nonself discrimination as the basis of immune function (e.g., Cohn 2015). However, the original guiding features of an autonomous, insular entity have lost their exclusive hold on framing the discipline: Protection represents only a particular aspect of immunity; autonomy of the organism has been challenged by an ecological orientation emphasizing symbiotic relationships; and the notion of individual, in the guise of “the immune self”, has been deconstructed as a result of the failure to define such an entity from within the science itself. With immunology’s earliest precepts challenged, expanded meanings of immunity have emerged. The defense-derived definition of immunity not only has proven too restrictive, even superficial to deeper meanings, but such a formulation also distorts significant dimensions of immunity. In short, the idea of immunity has evolved, and consequently the ontology of immune identity has shifted.

2.2 Defining the self

Because of immunology’s eclectic contributions to pathology, clinical medicine, and basic biology, it cannot unite under a single experimental banner. Rather, it is (and from its inception has been) characterized by multiple, even competing research agendas, each requiring a different methodological apparatus to order its experimental program. Yet the discipline is organized by an underlying concept of an identified and protected self. In whichever domain immunity is studied—from basic science to clinical syndromes—“the immune self” is either implicitly or explicitly invoked and thus serves as a powerful idiom to organize diverse research findings in different research traditions. Because the “self” possesses operational value by attending to various functions (i.e., different communities of scientists use different understandings of agency), the topography of the self’s employment then becomes a map of a field divided by different scientific traditions, methodologies, and goals directed by different experimental and conceptual models.

Clearly the self’s appearance in immunology served as a readily understood shorthand reference to personal identity and the efforts to substantiate that extrapolation on its own terms guided the discipline for the latter half of the twentieth century (for historical case studies see Löwy 1991). Indeed, the autonomous construction of immune selfhood resonates with Western cultural ideals and in turn supports them by melding laboratory findings with various extrapolated or borrowed philosophical, political and psychological meanings of human agency (Tauber 1994, 2016). So while firm definition of the immune self has remained elusive, this epistemological ambiguity and flexible polysemy has proven effective in sustaining the term’s powerful heuristic value as an idiom with many uses and meanings (Crist and Tauber 1999). Its versatility and pragmatic utility has effectively integrated clinical immune phenomena by highlighting the essential similarity or interconnectedness of diverse immune-mediated processes in response to various clinical challenges. Thus nutrition, allergy, infection, autoimmune disease, various phenomena of tolerance, natural (pregnancy) or experimentally created chimeras (transplantation), and autoimmunity all become conceived as a network of interlinked or interrelated functions. As these topics mirror and play off one another under the rubric of selfhood, immunologists have a ready means by which to represent states or processes, which arise in the various interactions between body and environment, at different stages of evolution and development. However, despite the wide range of meanings and uses, immune selfhood carries an implicit understanding connoting individuality and insularity, whose philosophical significance will be considered in turn below.

Several meanings of immune selfhood are in current use: the “organismal self”—a functional (colloquial) category immunologists typically employ; the “immunological self”—the more carefully crafted definition that serves as an ontological construction which draws from molecular definitions and builds upon a theory of tolerance (i.e., the absence of reactivity so constituents of the self are ignored); and the “immune self”—a metaphysical formulation of the system-as-a-whole (Ulvestad 2007: 88 ff.). There are at least half a dozen different conceptions of what constitutes the immune self: (1) everything encoded by the genome; (2) everything under the skin including/excluding immune “privileged” sites; (3) the set of peptides complexed with T-lymphocyte antigen-presenting complexes of which various sub-sets vie for inclusion; (4) cell surface and soluble molecules of B-lymphocytes; (5) a set of bodily proteins that exist above a certain concentration; (6) the immune network itself, variously conceived (Matzinger 1994: 993). While these versions may be situated along a continuum between a severe genetic reductionism and complex organismal constructions, each shares an unsettled relationship to a dichotomous model of self and other.

In consideration of the ambiguity of criteria for establishing selfhood, historically concepts of immune identity have evolved through at least three distinct articulations (each drawing upon different philosophical and lexical understandings of biological identity), and each has had profound influence on how findings are interpreted and how such understanding effectively organizes research agendas.

a) Early immunology was based on the implicit autonomous identity of the organism, namely, an insular organism exists and must be defended. Within the immunochemical tradition the emergence of that identity is not pertinent to the delineation of immune mechanisms, and to the extent that molecular biologists study immune factors and their genetics, the issue of immune identity escapes concern—theoretical or practical. For such investigations, the organism is “given”. Accordingly, the evoked immune response results from discrimination between the (given) organism (self) and its other (nonself), which in turn builds on Bernard’s conception of a homeostatic, balanced interior that depends on the insularity of the organism. Any insult to such stability results in processes to restore the original steady state as in Bernard’s understanding of metabolic homeostasis. And, indeed, early immunologists assumed the key characteristics of the Bernardian formulation: the organism is autonomous with secure borders that confer the integrity of its physiological functions. Immunity fits into this orientation inasmuch as it was originally conceived as a means of dealing with a disruptive state (infection) and immunity restores balance. In this scenario, immunity serves to protect that autonomy.

Burnet’s CST model follows Bernard. Burnet offered an explanation of how the self develops and retains its identity throughout life. And identity, to the extent this category is considered, is stable and serves as the platform upon which immune functions are played. This paradigm effectively captures a vast array of stimulated immune responses that begin with non-self-recognizing lymphocytes responding to antigen challenge and, once “selected”, this group expands to mount the immune reaction to insult. This CST formulation stands as the prototype of immune selfhood and has extensive experimental support (Podolsky and Tauber 1997).

b) A second formulation of immunity originates at the end of the 19th century, with the proposal offered by Élie Metchnikoff (1845–1916) that organismal identity is a dynamic construct mediated by immune surveillance. As an embryologist, his theory originally placed immunity in a developmental context, where phagocytic cells were observed to mediate what is allowed to attain maturity (e.g., phagocytes “ate” the tadpole’s tail). In the adult, the same physiological process determines what is excluded in an on-going negotiation between “friend” and “foe” (Metchnikoff 1905; Tauber 1994), whose dynamics of rejection and tolerance portray immune identity as a product of a complex balance between different arms of the immune apparatus (Eberl 2016). By employing temporal, evolutionary, and environmental dimensions, a model of immunity shifts from a static understanding of immune selfhood to one that accounts for biological changes occurring with age and differing contexts related to nutrition and geography. Such temporal and geographical dimensions continuously reshape the antigenicity of physical entities (molecules, cells, bacteria, viruses), create new targets that are either tolerated or rejected, and challenge the status of unexpected self epitopes produced by proteasome splicing (Grignolio et al. 2014) Not surprisingly, a recent examination of twins has shown that the vast predominance of immune variation results from non-heritable influences, and thus the immune profile of healthy individuals is largely the product of particular responses to environmental challenges (Brodin et al. 2015).

Assuming this theoretical perspective, given the dynamics of the multiple factors that comprise the character of the immune response, immunity is an on-going developmental process, where borders fluctuate and identity evolves. Accordingly, the immune system directs the traffic of potentially beneficial against noxious encounters on a reactive spectrum of tolerance and rejection (Ayres and Schneider 2011; Bilate and LaFaille 2012). That spectrum forms a continuum of immune reactivities that shift in time and space. This conception of dynamic identity, constituting an “immunological biography”, captures the organism’s interactive ecology over time and that history determines an ever-changing identity (Grignolio et al. 2014). Individuality then abdicates any static definition and, correspondingly, as useful as the self idiom has proven, one cannot point to “the self”, an entity and say, “the immune system defends the self”. Instead, immunity is the process in which identity is established.

c) The third iteration of immune identity radically deconstructs the “immune self”. Despite the ubiquity of the selfhood idiom in contemporary immunology, an important alternative theory of immune organization omits the self from immune theory, altogether. Niels Jerne (1911–1994) presented a model of immunity that dispensed with self/nonself discrimination as the modus operandi of immune functions (Jerne 1974). His hypothesis portrayed antibodies or T-cell receptors interlocked to form steady-state linkages, which, as a self-referential system was “closed”, i.e., the network “sees” only its own constituents and thus perceives only what it might know—itself. With the introduction of antigen, the network’s structure is interrupted and only restored by the elimination of the disordering antigen. Thus established patterns of the interlocking lattice work provide the system’s basic organization, and “antigen” signifies a substance that disrupts that order. Immune activation then is not based on self/nonself distinctions, but rather by the context of antigen presentation. In other words, the antigen does not carry its meaning as some intrinsic property, but rather the context of its introduction determines the immune response. Jerne’s network theory thereby shifted the understanding of immune cognition from the perspective of an agent processing information (an inherent property of the immune self construction) to an alternate understanding of perception without agency. This formulation may be referred to as the absent self, whereby the network theory completes the self’s deconstruction in immune theorizing, for the subject-object structure of knowing has been replaced with a model of cognition occurring directly within the system itself. Simply, Jerne removed the homunculus at the core of immunology’s epistemology (Tauber 2013). Indeed, self/nonself has no meaning in this formulation, because the truly foreign is not recognized at all.

A similar Jernian construct has found its most recent articulation in the “continuity theory” proposed by Thomas Pradeu and Edgardo Carosella (Pradeu and Carosella 2006a,b; Pradeu 2010, 2012; Pradeu, Jaeger, and Vivier 2013). (The formulation described in terms of activation is better called, the “discontinuity theory” of immune regulation [Pradeu and Vivier 2016].) Following Jerne (albeit without the trappings of the idiotypic formulation), the continuity thesis similarly holds that activation is determined by the degree integrated elements shift their relative positions as a result of introducing disruptive antigen (Pradeu 2012: 131–132). In other words, an introduced exogenous element initiates an activation cascade that results in altering the “connectivity” of the system as a whole (Stewart and Varela 1989; Stewart, Varela, and Coutinho 1989; Coutinho 1991). The respective notions of “pattern” and “context” both utilize the “lattice” metaphor, inasmuch as each depiction draws upon the basic idea of disturbing a self-regulated, ordered, interlocking architecture. Although the components and organization of each theory differ in important respects, both the contemporary proposal and the earlier idiotypic network share a similar conceptual view of the immune system’s regulation, where only an interruption of its own connections would signal a response. Note, selfhood plays no role in this schema, for regulation is determined solely within the dynamics of the system itself.

When the immune system is regarded from the “connected” perspective, integrated states are quiescent and disrupted ones, induced by “foreign” elements, generate immune activation. Such properties are thus determined by a self-regulated system controlled by a group phenomenon of interactions among several components comprising a vast interactive system of antigen-presenting cells, effector T and B cells, regulatory T cells and a diverse soup of molecular signals (Kim, Levy, and Lee 2009; Kidd et al. 2014). So, the functional difference that determines recognition of the foreign results from an aggregate of quantitative affinity differences, the context in which the antigen is seen, and the degree of interruption in network dynamics induced by such an immunogen. Accordingly, the overall function of the immune system may be defined as maintenance of molecular (antigenic) homeostasis (Poletaev, Stepanyuk, and Gershwin 2008). On this general view, a systems-wide collective response—not the discriminatory power of individual lymphocytes—determines identity and immune specificity.

A second challenge to defining immune identity looms, one that originates with Metchnikoff’s dynamic developmental understanding of immunity: According to CST, immune selfhood is based on that which is ignored—an apparent lacuna (or silence)—established by purging reactive lymphocyte clones. However, immune silence does not qualify as sufficient to designate immune identity, for “natural” autoimmunity functions as an active mechanism of tolerance that includes not only surveillance of normal host components, but also facilitates the myriad symbiotic relationships constituting the holobiont (discussed below). From a stimulus-response perspective, such activities qualify as immune silence, when in fact they represent an active on-going surveillance characterized by immune mediation (Dale and Moran 2006; Eberl 2010; Hooper, Littman, and Macpherson 2012; Root-Bernstein 2016). On this view, immunity not only serves as a noun designating a particular defensive state, but it also functions as a verb in terms of capturing the perpetual processes directed at establishing the identity of the organism within the context of its environment. So, while the immune system has largely been defined as those cells and mediators comprising the immune response to pathogens, in fact immune processes have diverse roles in the body’s ceaseless economy of internal cellular turnover, maintaining stable symbiotic relationships, and mediating external benign exchanges with the environment. Accordingly, “self” serves as both an artifice (when construed as an entity) and a useful idiom that has proven of great practical utility (Crist and Tauber 1999). In this last iteration, since organismal identity is not a given, nor attained in anything approaching some final form, selfhood is posed as immunology’s core problematic.

In conclusion, while the selfhood paradigm is well ensconced (e.g., Howes 2008b; Hoffman 2012; Cohn 2015), the definition of “the immune self” remains unsettled and critics have questioned its standing and argued that its continued use obscures immune theory (e.g., Matzinger 1994; Tauber 2000; Pradeu 2012). The latter position argues that the “self” might be better regarded as only a metaphor for a “figure” outlined by the immune system’s silence, i.e., its non-reactivity. That figure is inconstant and modified upon certain conditions and, as discussed below, other formulations of immunity displace the insular notions of selfhood for different understandings of immune identity. In any case, such criticism has not, and will not dislodge this cardinal organizing principle from immunology. Simply, considering the self’s wide use in different clinical and research traditions (provided by the relaxed and varied meanings associated with its use), the self/nonself distinction is expected to continue to organize the discipline as its governing construct despite the challenges posed by conceptualizing and modeling active tolerance (Bilate and LaFaille 2012). But the issue of immune identity has wider implications for philosophy of biology inasmuch as the problematic status of immune selfhood leads to questions concerning the ontological standing of organism and individuality.

3. Whither Individuality?

In immunology, the self is loosely used interchangeably with individual, so given the problematic status of immune selfhood, what is an individual? Commonly, an individual is regarded as possessing anatomic borders, harmonious balance characterized by communication between its parts, division of labor for the benefit of the whole, and a system of hierarchical dominance and control. And such an individual reproduces as a unit to replicate itself. However, symbiosis challenges this well-entrenched definition of the individual, not only because physiological autonomy has been sacrificed, but anatomic borders have lost clear definition and development becomes intertwined among several phylogenetically defined entities. Complexes of organisms in fact constitute presumed individuals and thus defy any singular definition of organismal identity as independent agents (Chow et al. 2010; Gilbert, Sapp, and Tauber 2012).

Accordingly, animals cannot be considered individuals by anatomical, or physiological criteria, because a diversity of symbionts is both present and functional in completing metabolic pathways and serving other physiological functions. Similarly, recent studies have shown that animal development is incomplete without symbionts, which also constitute a second mode of genetic inheritance, providing selectable genetic variation for natural selection. And most pertinent to this discussion, the immune system also develops, in part, in dialogue with symbionts, and thereby functions as a mechanism for integrating microbes into the animal-cell community. Recognizing the holobiont as a critically important unit of anatomy, development, physiology, immunology, and evolution, opens new investigative avenues and conceptually challenges the ways in which the biological sub-disciplines have heretofore characterized living entities. The implications of this general orientation for immunology hardly can be over-emphasized. Indeed, in many ways, the standing of the “immune self” amplifies, and potentially helps elucidate, the complexities of designating what, indeed, is an individual (see the entry on the biological notion of individual).

The definition of organism, also persists as a problem for philosophers of biology. Because of markedly different relationships of components, “the organism” possesses no ready reference beyond a consensus designation of “the largest unit of near-unanimous design” with unanimity understood in terms of cooperation (Queller and Strassman 2009, quoted by Godfrey-Smith 2013: 26). But how are boundaries drawn when referring to an ant colony, aspen ramet, slime mold, or Volvox? Or for that matter, an animal like homo sapiens, which is composed of multiple genomes living in a symbiotic commune? Such organisms are constituted by multispecies units that blur separations based on distinct physiology, development, and immunology, not to speak of demarcating the evolutionary unit of selection. And the issue becomes further complicated when we consider that some Darwinian individuals are not organisms (e.g., viruses) and some organisms are not Darwinian individuals (e.g., sterile social insects, mules, and certain symbiont collectives such as the squid-Vibrio symbiosis [McFall-Ngai et al. 2012]; Godfrey-Smith 2013: 28–9). Indeed, when symbiotic relationships are considered, individuality as a governing precept for understanding organismic function, development, or evolution requires highly specified definitional constraints or perhaps even its abandonment as a ruling principle in biology (Gilbert and Tauber 2016).

The evidence for the centrality of symbiosis in understanding immune function challenges the prevailing mind-set with a growing body of evidence that a conception of some core identity cannot serve as the model of organismic biology. On this view, a key tenet of current biology has been challenged, for when a science directed at understanding symbiotic relationships replaces an essentialist conception of individuality, immunology re-directs itself as well. Discerning how the immune system develops and functions within an ecological, symbiotic-conceived framework leads to models of immunity in directions that transcend the self/nonself, subject/object dichotomies that have heretofore characterized the science.

Despite the problems associated with establishing defined organismic borders, Pradeu has argued that the principle of inclusion defines a basis for establishing individuation (Pradeu 2010, 2012, 2013). He tracks this criterion phylogenetically from the very earliest prokaryotic unicellulars (through an RNA interference mechanism) to the aggregates of superorganisms (e.g., social insects), where defensive mechanisms have been described at both the single insect and colony-level (Pradeu 2013: 90–1). Accordingly, the immune system defines the organism and the term “individuality” serves simply to identify discernible elements that may be counted (e.g., mitochondria, cells, an organism). However, others assert that the criteria of boundaries hardly suffice for defining an organism, which itself has been recognized as fraught with ambiguity (for reasons that differ from the problem of designating the immune self). In the case of immune identity, the temporal seesaw of autoimmunity and tolerance preclude static functional borders; substances breathed or eaten from the environment are ignored; pregnancy as an archetypal chimera defies easy parameters of individualization (Hunt 1996; Howes 2007, 2008a; Martin 2010, 2011); and the fallibility of anatomic and even genetic criteria of selfness are well known (e.g., chimeric transplants; Starzl and Demetris 1995, 1998). Add the symbiotic relationships so prevalent in multi-cellular organisms, which require immune blindness to remain stable, suggests that the entire question of what is included as belonging to the organism and what is not leaves the “principle of inclusion” with indefinite criteria.

In sum, accepting a loose definition of individuality may suffice for pragmatic use, but the holobiont challenges demarcation criteria and autonomy defined by functional independence. From the immunological vantage, adjudicating the composition and balance of the consortia is a dynamic process in which dialectical relationships determine what is “self” as immune identity adapts to an ever-changing environment. So despite the powerful heuristic appeal of individuality defined by immune criteria, in the end, indistinct categories persist. Simply, lexical plasticity is integral to the life sciences. Or put another way, the commitment to a biology built on individuality offers a high philosophical threshold to overcome.

4. Eco-immunology

The original conceptualization of an immune self was based on notions of insular agency and correspondingly ignored the role immunity played in permitting benign, cooperative relationships characteristic of an organism’s ecological interactions. On this view, again derived from the host-pathogen model and the immune specificity required to discern friend from foe, immunity became the mechanism by which a self, conceived as having definitive borders, defends itself. That agenda required defining the components of immunity and their regulation as a self-contained system (Moulin 1989, 1991, 2001). Accordingly, in this formulation the self as a distinct, circumscribed entity could not have been more divorced from its environment.

However, when the organism is understood within its full ecological context, borders remain guarded, but demarcations are not rigid, neither in time nor functions; traffic is allowed, for beneficial exchanges. So when assuming a fuller ecological context, cooperation and benign relationships also must be accounted for. Accordingly, the immune system, through active tolerance of “foreign” substances and microorganisms, maintains its role as a gatekeeper, but now in service to the metabolism, development, and, ultimately, the evolution of the holobiont (Gilbert, Bosch, and Ledón-Rettig 2015). The domination of an insular view of the organism requiring vigilant protection must be weighed against this dynamic conception of communal interactions.

With an ecological orientation, reassessments of 1) autoimmunity and tolerance (immunology’s own domain), 2) the pervasive presence of symbiosis as constitutive elements of the organism, and 3) the ecological precept that entities “are what they are because of the environment in which they are found” have challenged fundamental conceptions of individuality (Birch and Cobb 1981: 94). Accordingly, immunology’s conceptual horizon has been broadened into a new field, eco-immunology, which examines the organism-environment construct in its full complexity (Demas and Nelson 2011; Brock, Murdock, and Martin 2014; Viney and Riley 2014). Beginning in the 1990s, efforts to describe the natural variation in immune functions were undertaken to assess the cost/benefit ratios of mounting immune responses to parasites, e.g., parasite-mediated selection and population dynamics (Sheldon and Verhulst 1996). From this perspective, immunity became a measure of virulence not solely in terms of parasite eradication but in regards to trade-offs that sought an adjusted equilibrium between host organism and infection.

The micro-organismal infiltration of the host is more complex than a straightforward disease-causing phenomenon. The boundaries between interpenetrating organisms are pliable, and thus the lines between parasitism, tolerance, and symbiosis are variable and fluid, both intra- and inter-individually. This ecological view of organisms intertwined in “the entangled bank” (Darwin [1859] 1964: 489) was intimately linked with Burnet’s immunological conception of selfhood. “Equilibrium” between organisms, became cast in his immunological thought as a matter of “immune tolerance”. Indeed, the first use of the concept of tolerance is synonymous with the idea of “a virtual equilibrium” in which both host and parasite “survive indefinitely” (Burnet 1940: 23). However, because immunology developed in the context of defensive functions, the concept of biological balance was obscured by the dominant concerns generated by the threat of pathogens. Despite Burnet’s recognition that immunity mediates the “delicate unstable balance” of interacting and interdependent organisms (1940: 11), the biomedical model of “seek-and-destroy” so dominated immunology that the larger ecological context of infection represents a small portion of the literature, and the specific ways in which the immune system tolerates, or even fosters cooperative relationships is smaller yet.

When immunity is placed within an ecological framework, i.e., assuming optimal balanced relationships, differentiation of the organism is displaced by integration and coordination that serve as organizing principles (Ulvestad 2007; Swiatczak 2014). In other words, balance becomes a regulative principle, and symbiosis offers the cardinal case study of balance as a governing principle of immunity. Established symbiosis entails a stabilized tolerant state, inasmuch as the organism must limit its immune response to allow installation (Råberg, Graham, and Read 2009). If successful symbiosis represents tolerance in its most benign operation, then the extension of immune balance to more hazardous relationships provides the other end of the mutualism spectrum. In viewing immunity from this vantage, new concepts about host-pathogen interactions have recently emerged that subordinate pathogen destruction for a modulated response that prevents otherwise unchecked deleterious side-effects of an over-aggressive immune reaction (Vale, Fenton, and Brown 2014). When organisms become infected, virulence is minimized either by eliminating pathogens directly (resistance) or reducing the damage caused by their growth (tolerance). The notion of establishing “tolerance” to infection (as opposed to resistance or avoidance) foregoes pathogen elimination for accommodation that limits immune-mediated damage and thus controls the negative impact of an infection (Medzhitov, Schneider, and Soares 2012). In some cases hosts are able to achieve healthy balance with pathogens despite harboring high infection burdens. In other words, the best state of immunity may be an equilibrium that requires balancing both resistance and tolerance (Ayres and Schneider 2011; Vale, Fenton, and Brown 2014).

In consideration of these findings, immunology, ecologically situated, provides new meanings to identity and individuality, because symbiosis and tolerance more broadly conceived represent stabilized immune adaptation to the complex of diverse living elements that live in a cohesive ecology, both within and external to the traditional borders of the organism. With immunity oriented to defining those relationships, immunology moves from its dominant concern with autonomous individuality to the science of understanding the cooperative assemblies of organisms. On this view, immunology, historically aligned with the clinical sciences, must now also be counted a member of the environmental sciences as well (Tauber 2008, 2017).

Indeed, a general consensus has emerged that immune responses fall into two categories: 1) some microbial immunogens “carry” their meaning as pathological and are perceived as dangerous and thus evoke an immune rejective response; and 2) a class of immunogens that are based not on intrinsic foreignness, but rather on how the immune system sees an “alien” or “domestic” character in terms of the larger context of the body’s economy (Grossman and Paul 2000; Horn et al. 2001). And that context is fully ecological—both defensively and co-operatively interactive. So the atomistic protective model that dominated immunology for over a century now includes accounts of integrative and tolerant interactions. The immune system mediates those as well as aggressive ones, a duality that has pushed the parameters of immunity well beyond the early defensive formulations.

In sum, although the historical development of immunology reflects a deep-seeded conceptual orientation to an individual-based biology developed at the expense of a more comprehensive interactive ecology, the gains and losses of that approach are becoming evident as immunology is directing itself towards placing immune functions within their broader ecological contexts, which requires comprehensive study of both the offensive weaponry of immune attack as well as the silence of immune tolerance required to live in a world of others. Indeed, neither indolent innocence nor persistent aggression captures the activity of the immune system that must function within a changing environment of friend and foe. Defining the off/on status of immune reactivity is not simply a question of identifying the “other”, but involves multiple stages of sensing, adjusting, and configuring immune reactions along a gradient of rejection and acceptance (Grossman 1993). Note, the immune response integrates two steps: first the immune system perceives molecular targets and then “decides” whether to react. Accordingly, “perception” is primary and effector functions (activation or tolerance) follow along a spectrum of responses. Thus immunity may be construed in terms of fundamentally functioning as an information processing faculty, where the immune and nervous systems are regarded analogously in terms of linking (in sequence) mechanisms of perception to derivative actions. From this perspective, immunology’s research agenda is broadened to include fundamental issues facing the cognitive sciences.

5. The Cognitive Paradigm

Conceptually, immunity depends on an identification system to discern the world and given this general requirement, “cognition” has been an embedded characteristic of the immune system. The cognitive metaphor finds a conducive home in immunology inasmuch as common rhetoric portrays the immune system as perceiving and acting. Immunologists explicitly describe macrophages “seeing” antigen; antibodies “recognizing” epitopes; T cell possessing “memory”; and adaptive immunity comprising a “learning” process. Such extentions from human psychology have been widely utilized in evolutionary history (Margulis, Asikainen, and Krumbein 2011), wherein basic categories of human cognition have been extrapolated to animals (Bekoff, Allen, and Burghardt 2002), bacteria (Ben Jacob et al. 2004; Ben Jacob, Shapira, and Tauber 2005), cancer cells (Ben Jacob, Coffee, and Levine 2012) and, in the case examined here, the immune system (I. Cohen 1992a,b). Indeed, the influence of the cognitive metaphor (where intention plays an incipient role) appears throughout immune theory. With the use of perception language like “recognition”, and mind functions such as “memory”, and human qualities such as “tolerance”—each originating in the language used to describe human behavior, qualities, and capacities—immunology incorporates basic cognitive capacities that serve the needs of an agent encountering environmental challenges. Simply, at least metaphorically, the immune system may be conceived as a “mobile brain” that mimics the mental agent, who peers at the world as a Cartesian ego (Fridman 1991).

The origins of conceiving the immune system as cognitive appeared during the emergence of cybernetics in the early 1950s, and by the 1960s both Burnet and Jerne drew analogies of immune functions with learning, memory, information and language to construct immunity as comparable to mental activity (Tauber 1994: 162–67). A more explicit theory of immunity based on immune recognition and processing based upon cognitive parallels between the nervous and immune systems was developed by Irun Cohen (I. Cohen 1992 a, b) and a group centered at the Pasteur Institute in Paris (Coutinho 1991, 1995, 2003; Varela et al. 1988; Varela and Coutinho 1991; Varela, Coutinho, and Stewart 1993; Stewart 1992, 1994a, 1994b; Stewart and Varela 1989; Vaz 2016). From this functional point of view, the immune system serves as an information processing faculty; how to model organizational (and ultimately regulatory) characteristics of such functions depends on how notions of agency are construed in immune theory.

5.1 Configuring immune cognition

The cognitive metaphor fits commonly held epistemological notions of agency in which a subject-object division posits an autonomous knowing entity surveying the world from its own individual perspective. The immune self fulfills the criteria of such a subject with profound effects on how immunity is conceived: 1) the identification of the foreign implicitly requires that something is doing the recognizing; and 2) recognizing is a perceptive event and must rely on a cognitive apparatus, at least in typical descriptions of such phenomena. Thus the cognitive metaphor (by definition derived from a human perspective) builds upon a general Cartesian understanding of agency which, in the setting of immunity, utilizes the modernist epistemological dichotomy of self and nonself. With the implicit presence of agency, the perceived world is known as a transmission, which in contemporary cognitive science and modernist philosophy adopts various modes of re-presentation. Kant is the master architect of this formulation.

Kant’s constructivism and the representationalism it required remained central to those diverse efforts to understand how language hooks onto the world, where

to know is to represent accurately what is outside the mind; so to understand the possibility and nature of knowledge is to understand the way in which the mind is able to construct such representations. (Rorty 1979: 3)

On this view, the most obvious function of representations is to help order and mediate interactions with the world. And, moreover, to achieve a “true” picture of the world, the repertory of knowledge must be stored, or represented, in the mind (see the entry on representational theories of consciousness). The representational mind imposes its own means of processing data, inasmuch as the mental ultimately becomes an interpretive system. Accordingly, sensory data stimulate information processing, which invokes computations, inferential analysis, synthesis, interpretation and ends with storage or application of this mental product for use in guiding behavior. The “cognitivist” program is built upon a causal theory of perception: objects are perceived as sensory data, which then follow a trajectory that ends in a mental percept that corresponds to that object. On these accounts,

cognition is mental representation: the mind is thought to operate by manipulating symbols that represent features of the world or represent the world as being a certain way. (Varela, Thompson, and Rosch 1991: 8; emphasis in original)

This approach characterizes the mind as a computational system operating on language-like representations, which reflects naturalistic commitments drawing from cognitive science, neurology, and psychology, where the cognitivist paradigm has reigned supreme (Chase and Reynolds 2010: 202–10). Immunology, in its use of the cognitive metaphor employs this formulation.

In the self/nonself scenario, the perception of an antigen’s meaning is determined by its reactivity with a suitable antibody or lymphocyte, which triggers an immune response after suitable processing. And as in representational theories of the mind, where word representations capture the state of the world, so too does antibody transmit meaning by which its binding (“recognition”) accounts for how the antigen is “known”. The antibody in this sense is “mediating” the antigen’s meaning to the system. In Burnet’s original iteration of the self-other dichotomy, the cognitive event fulfilled the basic requirement of an informational code: If an antibody recognized an antigen, that antigen was, by definition, “other” and thus slated for elimination. In other words, the antigen is a code that carries its meaning—otherness, nonself, foreign. Because the representational schema was devised with an underlying commitment to a subject-object epistemology, Burnet’s theory implicitly assumes a notion of agency, an entity that receives the representations, processes them, and responds appropriately. The philosophy embedded in immune cognition is analogous to language, where “pass the salt” now means, “kill the antigen”. And with such a subject-object epistemological structure, the world is re-presented to the cognitive faculty. Simply, representations in such a model serve as the code of perception and thus become the métier of information processing.

This construction, having dominated cognitive science and contemporary psychology, supports notions of immune agency conceived as an entity, a metaphorical extension of a “thinking thing”. And adopting this view of cognitive operations, places agency in a circular logic that re-enforces the operations of the sovereign self as an organizing principle. Indeed, conceptions of agency and representationalism reinforce each other in supporting the “immune self” as a theoretical construct, the meeting point of philosophy, the cognitive sciences, and immunology.

In contrast, Jerne’s network theory emphasized that neither the antigen or its antibody could be construed as a representation. On that view, the antigen is not re-presenting anything but rather presents itself directly to the antibody or T-cell receptor (TCR). Accordingly, the TCR or antibody are not representations of the antigen, but rather serve to transform the recognized molecule into information that an immunogen (“nonself” substance) has arrived. The recognition event does not require a second order re-presentation; the binding confers a direct “meaning” (“intrusion”), which is then derived through the immune “grammar” that has been developed to “learn” how to respond to the foreign. Note, agency, as such, is eclipsed in this presentational scenario, and if adopted, immunology’s agent-based conceptual foundation shifts.

According to the network model, three steps comprise cognition: 1) the antigen is a substance from the “outside” and its “form”—its information—is transferred in the recognition event into an immune form through its binding to antibody or TCR; 2) the “meaning” is then attained in the second phase of the cognitive event, namely, the significance of an antigen derives from the degree in which it disrupts the resting connectivity of the network; and 3) in this schema, cognition is not of something; perception is entirely within the system itself; the agent has disappeared, and with that vacancy, representations are discarded. After all, what requires a re-presentation? In a system without agency, what heretofore was referred to as activation resulting from a subject-object cognitive event now refers to increased dynamic activity, which is due to the disruption of the network’s equilibrium. Immune “knowledge” shifts from a signifier/signified relationship to one in which meaning is firmly lodged within the system itself (Tauber 2013).

In sum, this “presentational” formulation (inspired by J.J. Gibson’s theory of perception, 1979) models cognition without representations and attendant notions of agency dependent on processing them (for various formulations of this enactivist view, see Shapiro 2011). Matched molecular entities interact directly with immune receptors and a cascade of biochemical sequences result. There is no agent-world divide; the system simply is, for direct perception dispenses with the recursive, self-reflective persona, who sits in a Cartesian Theater to observe the world (Dennett 1991). And if a representational system is relinquished, the subject-object epistemology dominating current immune theory is radically reconfigured, for the presentational cognition discounts immune selfhood. Indeed, adaptive problem solving, signaling, and communication in the context of functional collective behavior need no reliance on agency at all (Orosz 2001; Shanks and Pyles 2011). Drawing an analogy from colony behaviors of insects (Bonabeau 2001; Gordon 2001) and bacteria (Ben Jacob, Becker, Shapira, and Levine 2004; Ben Jacob, Shapira, and Tauber 2005), the immune system may be conceived without centralized control or directives by simply following its embedded rules of regulation. If a subject-object modality of cognition is replaced with an agent-less understanding of perception, then immunity may be regarded strictly in terms of its own processes in the absence of a humuncular witness. Accordingly, individualized agency would disappear as an organizing principle of the discipline.

5.2 Intentionality

Cognition carries a heavy philosophical load, which has aptly been described as a metaphorical construction. The cognitive metaphor most directly grows from how mental behavior is characterized, which includes the “intentional stance” (Dennett 1981) and teleological explanations that conform to widely held ideas about the purpose of complex phenomena (see the entry on teleological notions in biology). As explained by Robert Wilson,

The cognitive metaphor is operative whenever psychological terms are used to describe actions or behaviors of nonpsychological agents [viz. nervous and immune systems/functions], or to explain actions or behaviors not caused by psychological states [e.g., ant workers “sacrificing” for a queen]…and it is manifest in talk of cell migration, neural memories, molecular signaling, preferential developmental pathways, the goal of maximizing gene replication, and of biochemical systems as seeking equilibria. The cognitive metaphor is ubiquitous in the life sciences. (Wilson 2005: 75; emphasis added)

Wilson goes on to argue that the pervasive cognitive metaphor magnifies agency, i.e., the role of independent actors, both self-contained and self-directed, which seems to satisfy criteria for their autonomy. He explains,

we literally have psychological states and by treating nonminded biological agents as if they had such states we assimilate them to ourselves,

which he calls the “crystallization thesis” (2005: 76). He argues that this metaphorical extension is an important aspect of shifting “merely living things to full-blown organisms”, which in turn is a key way biology is conceived (2005: 76). After all, having a stable conception of the organism is crucial in establishing the boundaries of studies and unifying research programs. Accordingly, the cognitive metaphor is an important instrument in that conceptual enterprise.

Nelson Vaz argues that to understand a “living thing”—in this case the immune system as a cognizing faculty of the organism—immunologists assign agency as they comprehend physiological functions (Vaz 2011). This is an effective way to model behavior in terms that fulfill entrenched ideas of agency and reflect the ready application of human life experience onto the biological phenomena. And with this insight, philosophers have tools to critically explore the character of agency in immunology. Indeed, the ready acceptance of immune selfhood reveals the implicit notion of agency embedded in the conceptual infrastructure of the science. So while the chemical approach defined immunology through the mid-twentieth century, the intentional idiom of selfhood remained in the foundations of immunology’s theory.

This issue of using intentional language in immunology has generated debate among philosophers. Melander argues that while intentional idioms are used in immunology, in fact this does not mean that scientists are, in fact, attributing intentional states to immune phenomena. Rather by emphasizing the behavioral aspects of immunity, the intentional idiom has utilitarian value. This use is acceptable because of the ready analogy of

immunological processes and patterns [with] familiar human activities. Because of this possibility, redefined intentional idioms are highly convenient, for instance, when one needs to give a short and “intuitive” characterization of intricate immunological processes whose exact description would be too long and complex, and when one needs to pick out and describe some immunological process of which one so far knows only the “gross behavior”. (Melander 1993: 239)

In other words, Melander maintains that the intentional idiom is a convenient shorthand for highly specific descriptions, and just as the immune self has practical idiomatic value, so does the extension of such agency through its constitutive intentional characterizations. Matthen and Levy (1984) are less sanguine and argue that such extrapolations guide scientific assessment by offering a particular framework in which to place immune data, because such intentional assignments actually reflect an ordering mechanism for phenomena otherwise difficult to characterize. Whether the teleology embedded in the intentional proposition remains inescapable is another question. However, at the very least we may conclude that the language of contemporary immunology fortifies formulations of agency with the use of cognitive terms that are employed to describe the means by which purported intentions are carried forth.

5.3 The neuro-immune system

As discussed, at the most fundamental level, the immune system is an information-processing faculty that deals with molecular inputs. Whereas sight perceives radiation, hearing processes vibrations in a fluid medium, and mechanical pressure triggers direct neural responses, immunity, like taste and smell, relies on the molecular alignment of substance and receptor that characterizes “recognition”. Such inputs, whether nervous or immune, then cascade into an integrated system of functionally supportive elements whose rules determine whether actions are initiated, or not.

Beyond the functional cognitive analogy, there is abundant evidence that the nervous and immune systems are highly integrated with one another physiologically and anatomically. They share many of the same messenger molecules, have close developmental histories both in phylogeny and ontogeny, and intersect biochemically. Indeed, the so-called “psycho-neuro-endocrine system” has a well-established fourth partner in the immune system (Ader 2006). And beyond these interdependencies, there is a growing appreciation of a strong parallel in how these complex systems might be organized. Increasingly, systems analyses applicable to one discipline are carefully examined for their applicability to the other. On this integrative view, immunity is fairly regarded as mediating part of the information spectrum comprising the organism’s interactions with its environment—both internal and external. Assuming the cognitive perspective, the immune system might be regarded as primarily fulfilling an altogether different function if its resting physiology is measured and its phylogeny carefully examined. On this basis, John Stewart has suggested that the immune system became defensive only after its primordial neuroendocrine communicative capabilities were usurped for “immunity” (Stewart 1992, 1994a). Accordingly, immunology becomes part of a more comprehensive psychoneuroimmunology, which defines immunity functions as an information processing activity coordinated with other cognitive systems.

Explicit shared nervous-immune system organizational characteristics have been proposed (Nataf 2016): For instance, distinct features of a visual object (shape, color, motion) are perceived separately by distinct neuronal populations, whose signals are then integrated by other nervous system networks. Such higher order processing requires assembly of various neuronal tributaries and such integration is characterized by cooperative amalgamation of an ascending assembly of signals. Simply, perception is the outcome of a collective integrative process. Similar organizational principles drive the integrated perception of immune objects in secondary lymphoid organs. In this scheme, an immunogen is “seen” once the various characteristics of its signal properties are integrated: The main categories comprising an immune object include the initial encounter with a suitable receptor, that contextual setting, and the temporal sequence governing the reaction (Pradeu and Vivier 2016). This complex process relies on distinct networks of immunocompetent cells, which collectively integrate in a multitude of lymphoid sites, where the output signals generated during this primary perception step finally form. So analogous to the nervous system, the immune system perceives immune objects by assembling discrete signals, characterized as immunogens, cytokines, chemokines, etc., (obtained as discrete informational elements derived from various cell types), which in an ascending integration generates a multitude of T-cell and B-cell clones that together initiate the immune response. The immunogen thus becomes an antigen (a recognized immune object), one constructed through “clonal cooperation” (Nataf 2016). In this schema, the integrative processes occurring in lymphoid aggregates is the functional equivalent to the brain that employs a hierarchal structure to process information.

6. Modeling the Immune System

Broadly considered, twentieth century immunology largely followed the original investigative concerns of the immunochemists, who employed the reductive strategies dominant in the life sciences of their era. With the biological turn in the mid-twentieth century (Silverstein 2009), more global properties of immunity were appreciated, but the basic schema used to model the various tributaries of the cumulative immune response relied on simply linkages that could not fully capture the dynamics of the immune response. Parsing immunity into prescribed segments has failed to reconstruct immune regulation, so during the past twenty years more holistic approaches have been introduced with varying success.

Immunology has joined efforts already evident in other areas of biology to devise system-wide models that account for the complexity inherent in a broad expanse of immune functions and the accompanying multifactorial causation of these activities. With the development of systems biology, the general issue of immune regulation becomes a central concern, where “complex dynamics giving rise to continual adaptation and learning, memory, pattern recognition and collective global control” assume primacy (Mitchell 2006: 1205). The systems application in immunology potentially falls into three frameworks: 1) the processing of data based on an orthodox clonal selection model that examines portions of the system excited by antigen stimulation; 2) an autonomous modality of immune “internal activity” that portrays the on-going normal physiology of immune processing in the body’s economy; and 3) an ecological formulation that emphasizes the open information flow that the immune system processes and to which it responds. This last modality, the interface of the organism with both “internal” (i.e., holobiont) and “external” environments, places the immune system firmly within the organism’s larger interactive context. How systems biology depicts immune phenomena will thus reflect differing formulations that assume distinct characteristics depending on which of these three constructs is subject to its application.

From a practical standpoint, the sheer mass of data and the sophistication of the analysis of CST qualifies this domain of immunity as the “lowest hanging fruit” for modeling and thus most amenable to study. However, such a depiction captures only a portion of immune activity (i.e., fully activated), which may be idiosyncratic in regards to the physiological immunity of surveillance and cooperative affiliation leading to symbiotic relationships. The second domain of normal immune “housekeeping’—also referred to as “normal physiological” immunity (Metchnikoff 1905), “conservative” (Vaz et al. 2006), or “concinnous” (ordering) reactivity (Tauber 2017)—while crucial for understanding the basic organizational structure and regulation of the immune system has little data with which modelers might work and requires extrapolations from pathological autoimmunity. And when the last category is considered, the ecological, immunologic modelers are beginning to merge efforts with ecologists who have a longer research experience in systems analysis (Wodarz 2014).

The “immunocomputing” of artificial immune systems has drawn on recent developments in computer science, information processing, pattern recognition, language representation and knowledge-based reasoning (e.g., Tarakanov et al. 2003; I. Cohen 2007; I. Cohen and Harel 2007). This medley of approaches reflects the character of systems biology more generally, and while it is premature to suggest which application will be most noteworthy for immune modeling, the first textbook devoted to immunological bioinformatics announced the goal of establishing “an in silico immune system” (Lund et al. 2005: ix), which was followed by a surge of interest and speculation (e.g., Bersini and Carneiro 2006; Flower 2007; Flower and Timmis 2007). Modeling partitions into two distinct strategies: 1) a merological (reductionist) approach that builds the system from its component parts, and 2) a holistic approach that treats the system as a black box and considers only inputs and outputs. Both seek fuller integrative models and reflect a reaction against analytic atomism, but early efforts suggest quite different orienting views of what a system is (see the entry on reductionism in biology).

Although immunologists have long considered the immune system as a system (Moulin 1989, 1991, 2001), that understanding differs on how the system is conceived. The dominant view currently defines the immune system as “a network of cells, tissues, and organs” which encompasses all the mediators, antibody, cytokines and the panoply of factors that have been implicated in immune regulation” – see the link to the National Institute of Allergy and Infectious Diseases in the Other Internet Resources section. (Note the “network” is invoked as a synonym of “system”, but networks have formal properties that are not necessarily ascribed to the immune system, primarily because knowledge of the system’s organization and regulation is not sophisticated enough to draw such formalities.) So how, indeed, might a network be depicted that includes about 20 cell types and myriad molecular factors, some effecting natural immunity and others playing a role in regulating adaptive immunity? The characterization of each element is determined by the particular experimental protocol chosen, which in turn has on occasion introduced an artifact related to the contingency of the factor’s discovery in one context, only to be revealed later as having other, perhaps more important roles in another experimental setting (Gilbert and Sarkar 2000; Dinarello 2010). Despite this high degree of complexity, the system qua system is examined (to the extent it has been characterized) as just this ensemble, whose inner structure and regulatory properties appear as inhibitory and stimulatory activities. And when composed as such a mechanical edifice, the immune system’s re-construction (drawn from piecemeal data derived from diverse elicited reactions) depicts a vast chart of immunity’s constituent elements related to one another branching in linear array.

Alternate approaches reveal more complex relationships when multifold informatics are applied to multiscale biological databases (reviewed in Kidd et al. 2014). Understanding how immune cells and their mediators interact with each other, the surrounding tissue and the microbiome requires comprehensive multi-dimensional modeling to examine global crosstalk between molecular pathways and cell populations. Such relationships are now emerging as a result of applying high-throughput profiling technologies. Quantitative modeling requires an analysis at several levels—comparative genomics and proteomics, co-evolution with pathogens, tissue-specific processes, population dynamics, cell turnover kinetics, and regulation networks. This multi-disciplinary tactic includes bioinformatics, genomics, proteomics, cellular, molecular, and clinical immunology modeling, and ultimately, mathematical descriptions and computer simulations. In terms of model building, the shift from classical mathematical models based on ordinary differential equations to other approaches that rely on stochastic models using simple rules (e.g., Monte Carlo simulations) to describe populations of interacting agents (molecules and cells of the immune system), appear to have more power and suggest advances have been made (Louzoun 2007; Pappalardo et al. 2008; Bauer, Beauchemin, and Perelson 2009; Kim, Levy, and Lee 2009).

Due to novel high-throughput techniques interaction data are quickly accumulating and the databases have already provided new initiatives for modeling and systems analysis. For example, coupling genomic sequencing and mass cytometry permit comprehensive measurement of the immune system across multiple cellular components and time points. Analysis of genome-wide transcriptions exhibits the changes that correlate with different states of the immune system such as the molecular signatures associated with autoimmunity, post-vaccination states, and various phases of infection. Population studies designed to determine the links between genotype and phenotype have uncovered numerous genetic variations that influence functions of the immune system. DNA sequencing technologies have been applied to monitor responses of vaccines, evolution of viral variants to escape immune detection, diagnostics for leukemia, and profiling of T cell and antibody repertoires. With the integration of peptide and protein data from different cell types and tissue sources, combined with cytometric studies and metabolics, an unprecedented number of parameters may now be integrated.

Such measurements have greatly expanded the potential factors to be analyzed and have increased the complexity of the mathematical models required for determining how immune processes operate and relate to various physiological conditions. Despite employing different network models, all of them attempt to map potential connections among intracellular and intercellular components, suggesting new functional roles for specific genes, proteins or metabolites (Kidd et al. 2014). And the interface with experimentalists may well take a new turn as modeling may place an immune mediator in the context of new pathways, molecular interactions and/or even an unanticipated tissue or disease link (Kidd et al. 2014: 122). In short, these technologies are synthesizing vast quantities of data that capture system-wide properties at molecular and cellular resolution, which, when combined with medical histories, medication effects and other clinical laboratory data are beginning to present a picture of immunity with unprecedented resolution and complexity.

Perhaps the most ambitious and coordinated effort at such a systems analysis is the European Union-funded “ImmunoGrid” project, which is designed to develop a natural-scale model of the human immune system (reflecting both the diversity and the relative proportions of the molecules and cells that comprise the immune system) together with the grid infrastructure necessary to apply this model to specific applications in modeling immune reactions. A conservative assessment of this effort has been published (Halling-Brown et al. 2010): Recognizing the daunting complexity of the immune system, the lack of a deep understanding of its function, the lack of reliable data, and the scale of computational resources required to address a high degree of complexity leave the project with an uncertain timetable. Considering the early state of modeling, the authors were circumspect about attaining a fully functional model that will deliver health-care benefits in the form of personalized care solutions and improved disease prevention (Halling-Brown et al. 2010).

The likelihood that quantitatively successful descriptions will emerge from the current efforts at systems-wide analyses is still unsettled (Tauber 2017). Generally, proponents surmise that the remaining hurdles lie at the doorstep of computational complexity, which will eventually be overcome. However, fundamental problems loom: 1) despite the enormous pool of accumulated data, the lack of uniformity and steadfast standards have hampered modeling efforts; 2) it is not clear that the algorithms currently used to model systems are capable of handling the probabilistic character of causation (Kupiec 2009; see the entry on probabilistic causation); 3) the basic under-determination of biological systems that employ redundancy to achieve functional tasks leaves any model with open-ended boundaries and unaccounted inputs; 4) inherent in the eco-immunology program, this boundary question (organism-environment) is compounded by the extraordinary complexity of any system conceived in open intercourse with the environment; and 5) immunology’s disciplinary ecology, namely, the diversity of its sciences (molecular biology, immunochemistry, cell biology, ecology, etc.) joined to the inter-disciplinary character of systems biology introduces another dimension to the modeler’s woes that reflect concerns about systems biology more generally:

Any given molecular network can be modeled in more than one way, and, as it turns out, depending on the modeling strategy and associated assumptions, the same network may or may not be shown to possess certain properties. The absence of a unified theoretical background makes it particularly difficult to elucidate the relationship between the various models of the same physical system. It is not clear, for example, if one model can be treated as a limit case of another, more general type of model, or whether, in some respects or circumstances, the modeled systems can behave as described by both types of models despite contradictory predictions. (Baetu 2014: 6)

These obstacles, perhaps pointing to more intractable impasses, comprise sobering criticisms that originate in a more general epistemological observation: Immunology is comprised of a diversity of models—conceptual (mechanistic, structural, and mathematical) and experimental (surrogate and exemplar models)—that reflect a mosaic of scientific knowledge derived from different methodologies and theoretical concerns. And this mixture underscores the daunting challenge of modeling a science that

is more akin to an interdisciplinary rendezvous point where many theoretical approaches coexist than a thoroughly unified science built on [an] unique theoretical foundation. (Baetu 2014: 6)

And, consequently, an integrated approach remains a distant goal.

Nevertheless, systems-inspired modeling has gained momentum and various tools developed for predicting key molecular aspects of adaptive immunity from protein sequences and genome-wide transcripts have been encouraging. Global assessments have provided accurate predictions of immune responses: In a well-controlled human intervention (influenza vaccination) that assessed multiplexed responses (gene expression, high density analyses of cell populations, and cellular and serological measurements) investigators quantified baseline and response heterogeneity in a cohort of individuals. From this high-density data, they systematically identified correlates, built predictive models of vaccination response quality, and inferred functional connections in the immune system (Tsang et al. 2014). If this approach finds general application and corresponding success in other experimental scenarios, then we might expect that new ideas concerning causation in biological systems will emerge (see the entry on the metaphysics of causation). And from such insights, philosophers of biology will have new tools to explore the architecture of biological organization and the regulatory principles that govern complex functions.

7. Conclusion

Two prominent themes have converged to re-orient contemporary immunology and both have implications for philosophy of biology, particularly in regards to defining the fundamental characteristics of identity, individuality, and agency. First, because the immune self has escaped definitive epistemological definition, immunity’s theoretical structure has two contending orientations. The first is the best established, namely, immune selfhood (variously conceived) determines the basis for immune discrimination and under this banner diverse immune phenomena have been bundled in the self idiom. The practical utility of this construct to describe certain kinds of stimulus-response immune activation remains at the foundation of immune theory. The other view holds that unstimulated immune functions operate with different kinds of tolerant controls that are based on a dynamic construct: Immune responses arise from a complex calculus of environmental (internal and external) factors, historical and developmental history, and evolutionarily derived identifications of “safe” (and thus tolerated) and “dangerous” (and thus attacked) substances. Accordingly, immunity is a collective process that eclipses the self/nonself model (both in terms of collaborating constituents), but also in terms of the contextual presentation of immune perceptions. Immunity then becomes a spectrum of responses along a continuum stretching from the unrecognized to active immune tolerance to various degrees of immune destructive activation. So by the end of the twentieth century the full array of immune activities appeared best characterized not by an on/off switch derived from distinctive self/nonself designations, but rather a rheostat modulating responses along a continuum of acceptance and denial.

Second, following this spectrum of immune responses, the basis of identity has expanded to account for cooperative relationships that are immune mediated. Agents so understood then shift from independent entities to complex co-operative collectives, and, from that position, instead of the focus on autonomy, the conditions for establishing and maintaining mutualist relationships assume priority. So while the self idiom remains firmly entrenched, the notion of individuality is being challenged by another understanding, one conceived in terms of a multi-genomic organism embedded in a complex environment. This ecological framework allows for both competitive and co-operative exchanges without the requirement of firmly demarcating self and other. On this dynamic view, the organism abdicates stable definition or identification. With that shift, the controlling idea of individuality changes with corresponding modifications of immunology’s governing precepts. Indeed, having moved from conceptions of the organism as autonomous (and in the immune formulation, protecting distinct borders) to one dynamically conceived in exchange with internal and external environments, challenges circumscribed notions of identity.

The philosophical consequences of this ecologically informed model of immune identity highlights the need to clarify the ontological standing of individuality, agency, and organism. Without disputing the richness of the original incarnation of the immune self, conceived in insular terms, this useful heuristic is undergoing theoretical transformation as a result of changing scientific considerations in which immune functions are expanding from a view of the organism segregated in its environment to a relational scenario that better accommodates ecological exchange. Immunity operates at the interface of the organism and its environment, and when divisionary boundaries are reconfigured, notions of identity require redress. Here a second interface appears between the science and its philosophy, where clarification of immunology’s key ontological categories joins similar discussions in other areas of philosophy of biology. The dialogue promises a rich harvest for both disciplines.


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