Feminist Perspectives on the Body

First published Mon Jun 28, 2010; substantive revision Thu Sep 11, 2014

In terms of the history of western philosophy, the philosophy of embodiment is relatively recent. For much of this history the body has been conceptualised as simply one biological object among others, part of a biological nature, which our rational faculties set us apart from, as well as an instrument to be directed, and a possible source of disruption to be controlled. Problematically for feminists, the opposition between mind and body has also been correlated with an opposition between male and female, with the female regarded as enmeshed in her bodily existence in a way that makes attainment of rationality questionable. “Women are somehow more biological, more corporeal, and more natural than men” (Grosz 1994 14). Such enmeshment in corporeality was also attributed to colonised bodies and those attributed to the lower classes (McClintock 1995, Alcoff 2006, 103). Challenging such assumptions required feminists to confront corporeality in order to elucidate and confront constructions of sexed difference.

In developing philosophical frameworks for making sense of sexed difference feminist philosophers have provided accounts of the relationship between subjectivity, corporeality and identity which are also applicable to other aspects of our corporeal existence. Feminist theorists are therefore currently in active conversation with critical race theorists (Alcoff, Ahmed, Gilman, Gooding-Williams), theorists of (dis)ability (Inahara, Garland Thompson, Thomas, Wendell), and theorists concerned with aging, health and illness (Inahara, Mairs, Toombs). Their concerns have also required an engagement with the philosophy of biology, as naturalising accounts of embodiment have been resisted, while the distinctive materiality of our embodied situations in the world has nonetheless been respected (Birke, Bleier, Fausto-Sterling, Grosz, Haraway, Tuana).

1. Historical Background

It is unsurprising that early western feminists should have regarded embodiment with suspicion, choosing instead to stress the rational powers of the female mind; for as Francois Poullain de la Barre famously claimed in 1673, “the mind has no sex.” For some early feminists this meant enthusiastically endorsing a dualism between mind and body, with bodily features regarded as contingent characteristics of the self, and the potentially rational minds as its core. For them, as indeed for later feminists, it was essential to break any suggested deterministic link between corporeal characteristics, mental faculties and social role. Reason, they mostly claimed, was a universal human capacity independent of corporeal differences (Wollstonecraft, Mill and Taylor Mill). There were additional reasons for early feminists such as Wollstonecraft in the 18th century and Harriet Taylor Mill in the 19th, to regard their bodies with suspicion. In the context in which they lived as middle class women, their bodies were commodities to be preened and maintained, to enable them to entice men into matrimony so that they would have the material means to live. Women's attention to their bodies therefore took the form of producing them as objects for others' appraisal, and the dangers which Wollstonecraft saw in this have been echoed in feminist work up to the present day. Wollstonecraft's 1792 text, A Vindication of the Rights of Woman, provides, as Bordo (1993) notes, a clear example of the disciplining of the female body as we, post- Foucault, would now describe it. “To preserve personal beauty, woman's glory! The limbs and faculties are cramped with worse than Chinese bands, and the sedentary life which they are condemned to live, whilst boys frolic in the open air, weakens the muscles … artificial notions of beauty, and false descriptions of sensibility have been early entangled with her motives of action” (Wollstonecraft 1988, 55). The body was also a source of vulnerability. John Stuart Mill and Harriet Taylor Mill were preoccupied with the way their susceptibility to illness interrupted their ability to produce philosophical work and cast the shadow of early death over their life plans. Moreover any celebration of the body as source of sensual pleasure was constrained by a risk of pregnancy.

The body also came to prominence in 19th century feminism in Britain through the campaign led by Josephine Butler against the Contagious Diseases Act (Jordan 2001). This act permitted women to be forcibly examined for venereal disease. Butler extended ideas of individual rights, prominent within liberal political philosophy, to rights over one's body. The campaign of inspection was viewed as a particularly outrageous violation of such rights and the women viewed as victims of male and medical appropriation of their bodies. Here we find the beginnings of arguments picked up later in campaigns against rape and sexual violence, as well as in campaigns for access to birth control and abortion and in the feminist health movement, all of which stressed women's rights to control what happens to their bodies. This absence of control found its most extreme example in the case of the bodies of slave women, where the body became literally the property of another, disciplined in a way that bore a marked contrast to that articulated by Wollstonecraft. “Her back and her muscle … pressed into field labour where she was forced to … work like men. Her hands were demanded to nurse and nurture the white man and his family … Her vagina used for his sexual pleasure … the womb … the place of capital investment … the resulting child the … surplus worth money on the slave market” (Omolade 354).

In the nineteenth and early twentieth century the campaign for women's suffrage dominated feminist activity in the west. The Seneca Falls Convention Statement does not mention the body, but Sojourner Truth's famous speech to the Ohio Women's convention drew attention to the body as a marker of race and class differences within the feminist movement. “I have as much muscle as any man, and can do as much work as any man. I have ploughed, and planted, and gathered into barns, and no man could head me! And a'n't I a woman? I could work as much and eat as much as a man—when I could get it—and bear de lash a well! And ain't I a woman?” (Truth 1851) Moreover in the writings of Elizabeth Cady Stanton we find a recognition of the way bodily markers are used to perpetuate both racial and sexual oppression. “The prejudice against color, of which we hear so much, is no stronger than that against sex. It is produced by the same cause, and manifested very much in the same way. The negro's skin and the woman's sex are both prima facie evidence that they were intended to be in subjection to the white Saxon man” (Stanton 1860/1881, 681).

Following the first world war and the granting of suffrage, women continued to campaign on issues of sexual equality, and control over their bodies. The issue of reproduction came to the fore in political philosophies of the right and left. On the political right, following the loss of life in the war, motherhood became a concern of the state and a public duty. Moreover increasing concerns with eugenics and racial purity led to a desire to control the reproduction of certain groups within society. At the same time, within feminist circles, the Abortion Reform Association was formed and echoed both earlier and later feminist demands for the right of every woman to decide what should happen to her body. But an implicit dualism remained. The body was seen as something owned by, and thereby separate from, the self, something over which the self had rights.

2. The Second Sex

It was, however, with the publication of The Second Sex by Simone De Beauvoir that feminist theorising about the relation between the body and the self took center stage. Along with other phenomenologists, particularly Merleau-Ponty, and, of course Sartre, Beauvoir recognizes that “to be present in the world implies strictly that there exists a body which is at once a material thing in the world and a point of view towards the world” (Beauvoir 39). What is central to her account is that such bodily existence and the point of view it provided, is lived differently for men and women. Beauvoir's attitude to embodiment has been the subject of much controversy for later feminists. Nonetheless her account still provides the starting point for contemporary work on the relation between bodies and selves, and it has recently been revisited as providing a complex and non reductive account of the intertwining of the material and the cultural in the formation of our embodied selves. (See the entry on Simone de Beauvoir, Gatens 2003, Kruks 2010.)

2.1 The data of biology

In the first chapter of The Second Sex Beauvoir reviews the data of biology. But she does so with a warning. Such data are not to be thought of as determining individual characteristics or social life. With that warning she goes on to describe what are claimed as biological characteristics of the female qua animal or organism which, in addition to differences in reproductive role, includes claims that woman is weaker than man, she has less muscular strength, … can lift less heavy weights” (66). She rehearses these ‘facts’ while also declaring that “in themselves [such facts] have no significance” (66). This is because “it is only in a human perspective that we can compare the female and the male of the human species” and from this human perspective “the physiological facts … take on meaning, this meaning … dependent on a whole context” (66). So, for example, in relation to “the burden imposed on women by her reproductive function … society alone is the arbiter” (67).

Such remarks have led to Beauvoir being regarded as an originator of the sex/gender dichotomy, which became pivotal to feminist theorising in the 1970's. (See the entry on feminist perspectives on sex and gender.) Standardly sex was seen as fixed by biology, and gender, as the social meanings attached to such biology, seen as historically and socially variable, and open to change. It is in this context that Beauvoir's famous claim that “One is not born, but rather becomes, a woman” (295) is consistently quoted. Nonetheless Beauvoir's own position does not map onto this sex /gender distinction in a straightforward way.(Gatens 2003, Sandford 1999) For her the data of biology, offered as facts, lack the fixity which later accounts sometimes took for granted. She shows herself aware of the way in which cultural myths and metaphors influence the telling of the biological story, even as she herself offers it to us. In pointing out the ideological influence on the descriptions of the active sperm and the passive egg (44) she anticipates the work of later writers such as Emily Martin (Martin 1987). Moreover she shows herself consistently aware of the possibilities which the biological data leave open to us, stressing alternatives to heterosexual reproduction throughout the biological realm, the incidence of hermaphrodism in human and other animals, and drawing attention in the animal kingdom to cases where care of the eggs and the young is done by both male and female animals. The consequence is that not even the biology of sexual difference is determined. “It is only through existence that the facts are manifest … and nothing requires that this body have this or that particular structure … the perpetuation of the species does not necessitate sexual differentiation … [while] it remains true that both a mind without a body and an immortal man are strictly inconceivable … we can imagine a parthenogenetic or hermaphroditic society” (390, my emphasis). On the other hand, the meanings and significance which we attach to our materiality do not float free of that materiality. The way the body is lived by us has to accommodate the data which biology variably tries to capture, facts of reproduction, menstruation, menopause… Moreover, for Beauvoir it was essential to recognise, here and now, differences between male and female bodies “for, the body being the instrument of our grasp on the world, the world is bound to seem a very different thing when apprehended in one manner or another” (65).

2.2 Living the female body

In later chapters Beauvoir provides a phenomenology of the body as lived throughout the different stages of a woman's life. Here she is explicitly offering her narrative as an account of lived experience, the body in situation. In childhood the young girl's body is experienced in a different way from that of the young boy. He is encouraged to climb trees and play rough games. She is encouraged to treat her whole person as a doll, “a passive object … an inert given object” (306), and learns the need to please others. Here is the beginning of the way in which women live their bodies as objects for another's gaze, something which has its origin not in anatomy but in “education and surroundings” (307). The consequence of living a body as an object of another's gaze is an inhibited intentionality, her spontaneous movements inhibited, “the exuberance of life … restrained” (323) “lack of physical power” leading to a “general timidity” (355). Beauvoir's account of the way in which women live their bodies in such an objectified way, internalising the gaze of the other and producing their bodies as objects for others, has been one of her most important contributions to a phenomenology of female embodiment, and anticipated and influenced the work of later feminists such as Bartky and Marion Young, (see below).

As the girl enters puberty Beauvoir describes the way in which her body becomes to her a source of horror and shame. “This new growth in her armpits transforms her into a kind of animal or algae” (333), her menstrual blood a source of disgust. These negative descriptions are continued for sexual initiation, marriage, and motherhood. Her phenomenology of the maternal body has been especially controversial. “ensnared by nature the pregnant women is plant and animal … an incubator, a conscious and free individual who has become life's passive instrument … not so much mothers… as fertile organisms, like fowls with high egg production” (513). These accounts have been a source of criticism, particularly when later feminists sought to celebrate the female body as a source of pleasure, fertility, and empowerment (see below). However it is important to recognise that what she was offering was a descriptive phenomenology of female bodies as lived in specific situations. As she explicitly says “if the biological condition of women does constitute a handicap, it is because of her general situation … It is in a total situation which leaves her few outlets that her peculiarities take on their importance” (356–7). It is this situation which her writings hoped to highlight and change.

3. Sexual Difference

The descriptions which Beauvoir offers us of the female body as lived, are in marked contrast to the valorisation of that body which we find in the writings of sexual difference theorists “What is at stake in the debate … is the positive project of turning difference into a strength, of affirming its positivity” (Braidotti 1994, 187). Engagement with female embodiment, the goal of which is to give positive accounts of it, are found in two very different strands of feminist thought: Anglo American radical feminism (particularly in the late 1970's and 80's) and psychoanalytic feminism drawing on the work of Freud and Lacan.

3.1 Radical Feminism

Despite Shulamith Firestone's (1970/1979) early visions of liberating women from reproductive tasks, within most Anglo-American radical feminism, both female sexuality and the female capacity to give birth are seen as grounds for affirming both the power and the value of the female body. Female sexuality is celebrated for its power and its supposed capacity to escape from structures of dominance and submission, (Lorde 1984, Rich 1980). Women's maternal bodies are seen as a source of positive values to set against male norms, stressing care and inter-subjectivity, as opposed to autonomy and duty (O'Brien 1981, Rich 1979, Ruddick 1989). Women's engagement with the reproductive process is also regarded as anchoring both anti-militarism and a respect for the natural world, which puts them at the forefront of ecological movements (Griffin 1978). These approaches are very significant for giving women's bodies a positive value which induces pride rather than shame. However, such approaches also suffer from the dangers of homogenising what are very variable experiences both of sexuality and maternity. As Jean Grimshaw points out, for women childbearing has been seen “both as the source of … greatest joy and as the root of their worst suffering” (1986, 73). Claims celebrating female embodiment therefore need to heed Beauvoir's insistence that the experience of embodiment is a product of situation. Susan Bordo, however, suggests that we might read some of these texts in a different way. Rather than claiming to be a description of all women's experiences of sexuality and maternity, they should be viewed as a “life enhancing fictions … providing access to visions of utopian change” (Bordo 1993, 230). If we interpret these writings in this way then they come closer to the projects of re-imagining the feminine found in psychoanalytic sexual difference theorists, all of whom owe a debt to the writings of Luce Irigaray.

3.2 This Sex Which is Not One

In the work of Luce Irigaray we find a sustained critique of both philosophy and psychoanalysis, for their masculinism. She points out that in these bodies of work man is presented as the universal norm, and sexual difference is not recognised, or it is recognised in such a way that woman is conceptualised as the ‘maternal-feminine,’ which has been left behind in the move to abstract thought. Such a critique insists on the recognition of sexual difference and the difference that female corporeality can make to the shape which thought can take. She makes here what may seem like a rather startling claim; namely that the morphology of the body is reflected in the morphology of certain thought processes. So, for example, western rationality is marked by principles of identity, non-contradiction, binarism, atomism and determinate individuation. She sees this as “the one of form, of the individual, of the (male) sex organ.” In contrast “the contact of at least two (lips) keeps woman in touch with herself,” (1985b, 79), and suggests an ambiguity of individuation, a fluidity and mobility, a rejection of stable forms.

Such claims have been interpreted by some as suggesting that Irigaray is a biological essentialist, that she sees the biology of male and female bodies as yielding (potentially) different patterns of thought, and that she is insisting that the thinking and writing which is expressive of women's bodies should be made visible. As such she is seen as a proponent of ecriture feminine, a movement to produce writing reflective of female embodiment. In contrast to such a reading however, is Irigaray's own insistence on the impossibility of returning to a body outside of its representation within culture. This makes evident that the bodily features which she invokes in her writings are not brute materialities, but, (as is perhaps made clearest in Margaret Whitford's Luce Irigaray, Philosophy in the Feminine), bodies as they feature in the interconnected symbolic and imaginary of western culture. The symbolic here is a public system of meaning and language, what, for Lacan, allows us to become subjects; for it assigns us our social positionality and tells us what is proper for male and female bodies. For Lacan this social order of meaning is one to which we are condemned if we are to become subjects and agents in the world. The concept of the imaginary, as it is used by Irigaray, echoes the Freudian notion of unconscious phantasy, in which our relations to objects and others is governed by emotion and passion (affect) rather than by considerations of truth or falsity. It also references the Lacanian imaginary, the domain of affective identification with illusory ideals, which yields our sense of our bodies as bounded materialities. Although in Lacan the symbolic and the imaginary are presented as different moments in the formation of subjectivity, for Irigaray they are interconnected. The symbolic structures the imaginary and is itself haunted by imaginary associations (Whitford 1991, chapter 3).

When Irigaray refers to male and female bodily characteristics she is, according to Whitford, capturing the way she finds these features both represented and imagined, that is, affectively experienced, in the personal and social domain. Male bodies are those that have form or identity, power and authority. Female bodies are defective male bodies, marked by lack, the lack which forms the necessary and negative opposite to the plenitude of masculinity; meanings matched with imaginary associations in which female bodies are experienced as chaotic, formless and threatening. In contrast to Lacan, Irigaray challenges the inevitability of such imaginary and symbolic forms. She argues for the need to reconstruct an inter-connected imaginary and symbolic of the female body which is livable and positive for women. Whitford suggests this is not an essentialist task of providing an accurate description of women's bodies as they really are. It is a creative one in which the female body is lovingly re-imagined and rearticulated to enable women to both feel and think differently about their embodied form. Irigaray replaces the image of female sex organs as a lack or a hole, with one in which women's genitals are seen as “two lips touching … Her sexuality, always at least double, goes even further; it is plural … the pleasure of the vaginal caress does not have to be substituted for that of the clitoral caress. They each contribute irreplaceably to women's pleasure” (Irigaray 1997, 252). Irigaray's attention to the imaginary body is, however, informed by a respect for a materiality, a nature, which although open to multiple modes of disclosure, offers us two kinds of sexed bodies, to which our imaginary significations remain answerable.

Irigaray herself considers how philosophical and psychoanalytic thinking would be different if we took a re-imagined female or maternal body as its starting point instead of the male body imagined in phallic terms. Such work has been continued in the writings of, for example, Christine Battersby (1998) and Adriana Cavarero (1995). Battersby explores “what happens to the notion of identity if we treat the embodied female as the norm for models of the self” (38). Natality challenges a fixed conception of identity, makes evident that self and non-self are not in opposition, and that identity “erupts from the flesh” (39). For Cavarero the lack of attention paid to the fact that we are born from woman has given western metaphysics a preoccupation with death rather than birth. But the re-imaginings which such writers suggest to us remain firmly within the constraints of sexual difference.

3.3 Criticisms of Sexual Difference

Sexual difference theorists, whether working from a radical feminist tradition or from a psychoanalytic feminist tradition, insist on the specificity of female embodiment, a horizon which becomes invisible when the male is taken as the norm of the human. For many of these theorists sexual difference is fundamental and immutable. Rosi Braidotti claims “being a women is always already there as the ontological precondition for my existential becoming a subject” (1994, 187).

Elizabeth Grosz insists on “the irreducible specificity of women's bodies, the bodies of all women, independent of class, race and history” (Grosz 1994, 207). For both these theorists class and race are mutable, and identities are woven on to a sexual categorisation which takes priority. The fundamental nature and inevitability of sexual difference is anchored, for Grosz, in bodily processes of reproduction, though she accepts that the ways these are experienced are not universal. Latterly she anchors a binary sexual difference in an engagement with a revised Darwinianism (Grosz 2010). Such biological materialities do not yield sexual identities nor determine the way in which women experience their bodies, for these will be historically and socially variable. They are, however, the condition which makes such sexed identities possible. One consequence of such a view for Grosz, is that it rules out the possibility of transsexual repositioning. “There will always remain a kind of outsidedness or alienness of the experience and lived reality of each sex for the other. Men, contrary to the fantasy of the transsexual, can never, even with surgical intervention, feel or experience what it is like to be, to live, as women” (Grosz 1994, 207).

Both the foundational status and the inevitability of sexual difference became a key point of contention between sexual difference theorists and the post-structuralist theorists influenced by Foucault and Derrida. Such poststructuralist approaches found their most systematic exposition in the work of Judith Butler (1990, see discussion below). Butler and others also pointed out that the attack, made by Irigaray, on the imaginary of the female body found in the writings of philosophers and psychoanalysts, is an attack on a specific, western tradition, which is not universal. Butler argues “the failure to acknowledge the specific cultural operations of gender oppression is itself a kind of epistemological imperialism. The effort to include ‘Other’ cultures as variegated amplifications of a global phallogocentrism … risks … colonising under the sign of the same those differences that might otherwise call that totalising concept into question” (1990, 13). Spivak also warns of a process by which Western women can re-invent themselves as universal woman. (1987, 150). These latter charges signal a care that needs to be addressed both in articulating bodily imaginaries and reinventing them. For these processes need to undertaken in a way that recognises the way such imaginaries are co-constituted with other dimensions of social identity, and vary at different times and places.( McClintock 1995)

4. The Productivity of Discourse; Performativity and Processes of Materialisation

Feminist writers from Wollstonecraft onwards have drawn attention to the way in which dominant discourses in society prescribe norms in relation to which subjects regulate their own bodies and those of others. “Our bodies are trained, shaped and impressed with the prevailing historical forms of … masculinity and femininity” (Bordo 1993, 91). By regimes of dieting, makeup, exercise, dress, and cosmetic surgery, women, and increasingly men, try to sculpt their bodies into shapes which reflect the dominant societal norms. Such disciplinary practices attach not only to the production of appropriately gendered bodies, but to other aspects of bodily identity subject to social normalization. Hair straightening, blue tinted contact lenses, surgical reconstruction of noses and lips, are practices in which the material shapes of our bodies are disciplined to correspond to a social ideal, reflecting the privileged position which certain kinds of, usually, white, always able, bodies occupy.

This became a major theme in 1970's feminist writing. Andrea Dworkin writes “In our culture not one part of a women's body is left untouched, unaltered …From head to toe, every feature of a woman's face, every section of her body, is subject to modification” (1974, 113–4). From the 1990's, feminist attention to the power relations working through such disciplinary practices has made extensive use of the work of Foucault (Foucault 1979, Bartky 1990, Bordo 1993). Foucaultian insights regarding disciplinary practices of the body are applied to the disciplining of the gendered, and most insistently the female, body. Such accounts stress the way in which women actively discipline their own bodies not only to avoid social punishments, but also to derive certain kinds of pleasure. Power works, here, not through physical coercion, but through individuals policing their own bodies into compliance with social norms. There are two key features of such accounts. One stresses the way in which the material shape of bodies is modified by such practices. The second that such modifications are a consequence of such bodies carrying social meanings, signaling within specific contexts, sexual desirability, or availability, or respectability, or participation in social groupings. With attention to the work of Foucault and other poststructuralist writers, also came the recognition that practices of bodily modification could have multiple meanings, with disagreements over responses to cosmetics, fashion and cosmetic surgery (Davis 1997). It was against this background that Bordo (1993) developed her complex and influential reading of the anorexic body: “female slenderness … has a wide range of sometimes contradictory meanings … suggesting powerlessness … in one context, autonomy and freedom in the next” (26).

4.1 Performativity

In the work of Judith Butler (1990, 1993, 2004), the subjection of our bodies to such normalizing practices becomes not only a way in which already male and female bodies seek to approximate an ideal, but the very process whereby sexed and gendered subjects come into existence at all. Femininity and masculinity become, broadly, bodily styles which our bodies incorporate to yield a gendered subjectivity. Butler's performative account of gendered subjectivity has dominated feminist theory from the beginning of the 1990's. It was an account which became widely discussed with the appearance of Gender Trouble and has been developed in much of her work since. Butler rejects the view that gender differences, with their accompanying presumptions of heterosexuality, have their origin in biological or natural differences. She explores, instead, how such a ‘naturalising trick’ is pulled off; asking by what means a unity of biological sex, gendered identification, and heterosexuality comes to appear natural. Butler, like Foucault, views discourses as productive of the identities they appear to be describing. When a baby is born and the midwife says “it's a girl” she is not reporting an already determinate state of affairs, but taking part in a practice which constitutes that state of affairs. The effect of repetition of acts of this kind is to make it appear that there are two distinct natures, male and female.

These gendered performances are ones which we act out ourselves and which others act out in relation to us. They are acted out in accordance with social scripts prescribing ideals which are unrealizable, but which none the less provide the framework for our activities. These dominant ideals reinforce the power of certain groups; e.g., men and heterosexuals, over others. These others, women, homosexuals, transsexual people, those with differently abled bodies or differently shaped bodies to the dominant ideal, are treated socially as outsiders, ‘the abject,’ and subject to social punishments.

The performances by means of which our bodies become gendered vary in different contexts, and can change over time. Constituting myself as a caring mother, my performance would differ from that of a sexy pop star. Moreover these practices are not independent of those which produce other aspects of our identity. Butler has stressed the way in which gendered performances incorporate a presumptive heterosexuality; but they also are co-constituted with class, ‘race’ and cultural positioning as well as age and a variety of forms of abilities and disabilities. In bodily acts manifesting gendered positionality, other social positions are carried along, in such a way that it is not possible to disentangle a strand of gender which is universally present.

If gender becomes a matter of bodily style and performance, as this model suggests, then there is no necessary link between gender and any particular bodily shape. The alignment between anatomical shape and gendered performance is itself just a norm. Furthermore this norm, along with others governing gendered performance, is open to destabilisation and change. For Butler homosexual practices are one way of destabilising the normative links of gender and heterosexuality. Various kinds of transgendered performances, in a parallel way, challenge the link of anatomical shape and gender. The trans community, problematised by sexual difference theory, therefore comes to occupy a central position for Butler. They are pivotal to the process of ‘queering’ by means of which gender binaries, established by normalising practices, are to be undermined and unraveled. Such destabilisation, which is Butler's goal, is, however, not easy to undertake and its effects are unpredictable. Its possibility, for her, is a consequence of iterability, a feature of the meaning of discursive acts. Following Derrida, Butler accepts that whenever we use a term or perform an act we are engaged in a practice of citation: our usage echoes imagined past and possible future uses, in a way that does not produce stability of meaning. “The action of gender requires a performance that is repeated” (1990, 140) but these repetitions “are never simply replicas of the same” (1993, 226). This openness of terms is central to Butler's understanding and the politics which accompanies her account. If we repeat performances in different contexts then meanings can emerge which subvert dominant ones. So, for example, the television documentary, Pregnant Man by Elizabeth Mcdonald (2008), featuring a pregnant man who is referred to as a man and presented as a regular guy, works to undermine our binaries. What remains problematic about this, however, is that the effect of performance is unpredictable. Drag, for example, can support or dislodge gendered stereotypes and we cannot always sort out which any instance will produce. In this way leaving change to the workings of iterability has been argued to make possibilities for reflective agency problematic (McNay 2000).

4.2 Materialisation

At first glance Butler's account may seem to reinforce the distinction between sex and gender; sex given with biology, dictated by nature and gender a product of discursive formation. But her view is much more radical than this. Sex differences are not simply given. For biology itself does not escape discursive formation. The divisions of bodies into just two sexes is itself, for Butler, driven by a set of heterosexual gendered norms. It is not dictated by a nature taken to lie outside of those norms. Here Butler's work gains support from writings of feminist biologists. Anne Fausto Sterling points out the range of inter-sex bodies that are forced into a binary classificatory system (1992, 2000). Nelly Oudshoorn (1994), in a genealogy of the emergence of the theory of sex hormones, shows how a model of binary sex differences prevailed, in a context in which dualistic notions of male and female could have been abandoned.

For some, however, such a performative account of the formation of both sexed and gendered bodies, fails to capture how the materiality of the body enters into our sense of self. In the preface to Bodies that Matter Butler reports a common response to her work: “What about the materiality of the body, Judy? … an effort … to recall me to a bodily life that could not be theorised away … for surely bodies live and eat; eat and sleep; feel pain and pleasure; endure illness and violence; and these facts … cannot be dismissed as mere construction” (1993 ix). Butler answers such questions by giving an account of the materiality of the body in terms of a process of materialisation. Here she is “calling into question the model of construction whereby the social unilaterally acts on the natural and invests it … with … meaning” (1993, 4). Instead she offers us a picture in which what we count as the material, as nature, as the given, is not something to which we have unmediated access. It is itself a product of particular modes of conceptualising, modes which do not escape the workings of power. “Sex posited as prior to construction will, by virtue of being posited, become the effect of that very positing” (1993, 5). She concurs with the position of Gayatri Spivak: “If one thinks of the body as such, there is no possible outline of the body as such. There are thinkings of the systematicity of the body, there are value codings of the body. The body, as such, cannot be thought, and I certainly cannot approach it” (Spivak 1989).

For Butler, we have to think of matter in terms of “a process of materialisation that stabilises over time to produce the effect of boundary, fixity … we call matter” (1993, 9). We cannot, then, ask questions about what limits are set by something outside of what we conceptualise. We can, however, explore the possibilities of conceptualising otherwise. This does not mean that there is nothing outside of discourse. Butler makes clear that the body exceeds any attempt to capture it in discourse. It is just such excessiveness which allows the possibility of alternative formations of it, for the body outruns any of the ways we might have of thinking about it. But we cannot approach the extra-discursive except by exploring discursive possibilities.

4.3 New Materialisms

However, for some writers, Butler's account of the body fails to accommodate its weightiness, the limits which it might set to modes of conceptualisation, even though we cannot legislate in advance what those limits might be. Although few would think we have unmediated access to materiality, including the materiality of our bodies, some think the focus on discourse has been at the expense of the material, as Hekman (2008: 86) puts it.Thus, although the aim was to understand the real in discursive terms, there has been instead a privileging of the discursive. Even where Butler (1993) has attempted to think together the material and the discursive, her account has been criticised, for not allowing the body ‘more of a drag on signification’ (Alsop et al 2002, Jagger 2008). ‘Butler's account’ suggests Colebrook, ‘conflates the being of a thing with the mode in which it is known‘ (Colebrook 2000: 78). Such a ‘flight from the material’ according to Alaimo and Hekman, has foreclosed attention to ‘lived material bodies and evolving corporeal practices’ (2008: 3). To correct such a deficit, in the framework of what is termed the new materialism, what is stressed instead is that, although ‘language structures how we apprehend the ontological, it doesn't constitute it’ (p.98). The insight of the new materialist discussions has been to ensure that matter, the material, is accorded an active role in this relation.

For Elizabeth Grosz, there is “an elision of the question of nature and of matter in Butler's work. Mattering becomes more important than matter! Being ‘important,’ having significance, having a place, mattering, is more important than matter, substance or materiality” (Ausch, Doane, and Perez 2000). In Grosz's own work such materiality is conceived of in terms of ‘active forces.’ The body is involved in a process of active ‘becoming’ which outruns any account which might be offered of it within culture. In the same interview she claims ‘Nature is … is openness, resource, productivity.’ Here the body is not simply a materiality which outruns any attempt to conceptualise it; it is actively involved in processes of change and transformation. Grosz's recent work (2005, 2008), exploring biology and its relationship to culture, shows an increasing interest in unraveling the nature/culture opposition by a stress on “the virtualities, the potentialities, within biological existence that enable cultural, social, and historical forces to work with and transform that existence” (2008, 24). Returning to the work of Darwin, she sees in his work “the genesis of the new from the play of repetition and difference within the old” (2008, 28). However her adoption of a form of Darwinianism has itself been criticised for privileging a biological account of matter (Jagger 2014, Lennon 2012).

What needs addressing according to Barad is ‘the entanglement of matter and meaning’, Barad (2003, 2007), the inter-implication of the discursive and the material in which no priority is given to either side. Barad explores this entanglement with particular reference to the work of physicist Niels Bohr. Viewing matter as an active ‘agent’ ensures that matter and meaning are mutually articulated. Importantly however, although the empirical world of matter takes an active part this does not involve according it some sort of immediate givenness, or a straight-forwardly determining role. In her approach Barad is following in the footsteps of Donna Haraway. In 1985, prior to Butler's Gender Trouble, Donna Haraway had published her “Cyborg Manifesto” (reprinted Haraway 1991). Haraway's project had some overlap with that later articulated by Butler. She wished to overcome the binary between nature and culture, replacing the two terms with nature/culture, in which different elements cannot be disentangled. She was also concerned to draw attention to the complex factors which go into constituting what is to count as nature for us. Most crucially she was concerned to undermine the supposed naturalness of certain binaries; insisting on a breaching of boundaries between human and animal and between animal and machine. So came her invocation of the cyborg: a creature “simultaneously animal and machine” populating a world “ambiguously natural and crafted” (1991 149). In pointing to the cyborg as the figure which captures our ‘bodily reality’, Haraway is resisting any appeal to a pure nature which is supposed to constitute our bodily being. There is no clear boundary between what is natural and what is constructed. In Haraway's picture, however, the body, along with the rest of the natural world, has what she calls “a trickster quality that resists categories and projects of all kinds” (1997, 128). In this and her later work (Haraway 2003, 2004), her account of the quirkiness and agency which, in Butler, is primarily discussed as a feature of discursive practices, is as much a feature of nature. Nature is viewed as an agent, actively contributing to the indivisible nature/culture with which we are faced. “We must find another relationship to nature besides reification, possession, appropriation and nostalgia” (2008, 158). This other relation is to view nature as “a partner in the potent conversation” (158) in which we attempt to constitute it. What is so notable about her work is the careful respect shown to the concreteness of bodily existence and to the biological narratives, alongside narratives of historical and cultural kinds.

A concern with the weightiness of the body has also been found in feminist theorists of (dis)ability. A well rehearsed binary between material impairment and social disability, (echoing the sex/gender distinction), has been replaced in some writings with an articulation of bodily (dis)abilities as an intertwined nature/culture of the kind articulated above. These writings provide accounts of the way the body intrudes into our daily life with a heaviness all of its own, while remaining experienced in cultural terms. Nancy Mairs describes living with multiple sclerosis “haunted by … a mean spirited ghost … which trips you when you are watching where you are going, knocks glassware out of your hand, squeezes the urine out of your body before you reach the bathroom and weighs your body with a weariness no amount of rest can relieve … my body … is a crippled body … doubly other … by the standards of physical desirability erected for everybody in our world” (Mairs 1990/1997, 298–9). Here, although Mairs makes clear that any experience of the body is mediated by cultural representations of it, she also stresses the constraints on such representations made by the body itself. (See Gonzalez-Arnal, Jagger and Lennon (eds.) 2012, for papers highlighting the distinctiveness of different modes of embodiment and the vulnerability of the body to pain and assault; all within cultural articulation. Also see the entry on feminist perspectives on disability).

An insistence on the importance of the materiality of the body also comes from the work of many transsexual theorists. For Butler, in Gender Trouble the trans-community serves to make evident the constructedness of all gender identities, and helps promote the destabilisation of gender binaries and the normative mappings of gendered behaviour and bodily morphologies. For many trans people such destabilisation provides a framework which can make sense of and legitimate their own fluid gendered positionality. What Butler's account seems less able to accommodate, however, are transsexual people who seek bodily modification. Prosser (1998) suggests that those with such a desire for sexed embodiment, can only be seen in Butler's framework as misled by a naturalism about sexed identity. They have failed to grasp that gendered realness is simply a matter of performance. Yet, Prosser argues, this does not accommodate the experiences of those who feel that their corporeality fails to express the sexed positionality they wish to claim. Butler accommodates the need for a changed bodily shape to enable the social recognition which she claims is necessary to “make life livable” (Butler 2004). Nonetheless in this discussion there is force to Prosser's objection that in Butler's account insufficient attention has been paid to subjective experiences of embodiment in constituting a sense of self. Moreover other trans theorists (Lane 2009) confront what they see as an anti-biologism within gender theory, which makes illicit a concern, found among many transsexual people, to explore the complex interpellation of biological and cultural factors in the aetiology of their subjectivity. (See entry feminist perspectives on trans issues)

5. A Return to Phenomenology

A return to an interest in feminist phenomenology, in the footsteps of de Beauvoir, started with the work of Sandra Bartky and Iris Marion Young in the late 1970's, but became widespread only in the 1990s. At the centre of phenomenological accounts of embodiment is the lived experience of the body. For such writers embodiment is our mode of being-in-the-world (Young, 2005, 9). The notion of experience is treated with great suspicion in the poststructuralist framework within which Butler is primarily positioned. The suspicion is a consequence of empiricist uses of the term, in which experience is tied to a ‘myth of the given’ whereby body and world are offered to us in an unmediated way. The experiences to which phenomenological writers draw attention are not however of such a pure kind. For they are experiences of bodies in situations, in which it is impossible to disentangle so called ‘natural’ and ‘social’ elements. For as Merleau-Ponty points out, “everything is both manufactured and natural in man, as it were, in the sense that there is not a word, not a form of behaviour which does not owe something to purely biological being—and which at the same time does not elude the simplicity of animal life” (1962, 189). Here there is an entanglement of nature/culture, matter and meaning, which parallels that insisted on by Haraway and Barad discussed above. But the phenomenological accounts foreground lived experience of the body in a way that is often absent from, what are now termed, the new materialist writings (although it is foregrounded in the writings of the trans theorists discussed above, many of whom employ phenomenological resources).

Interest in the phenomenology of embodiment is an attempt to further articulate Freud's claim that “the ego is a bodily ego” (Freud 1923/1962), to capture the way the material contours of the body are experienced as making up the self. There is no assumption here that such contours are experienced independently of social formation, but attention is focused on the way corporeal characteristics surface in our experiences of ourselves and others. Feminist writers such as Bartky, Young, Alcoff, Heinämaa, and Weiss are carrying on the project started by Beauvoir; but a major influence for many of them is also the work of Merleau-Ponty. They put such resources to work to make visible the variable experiences of gendered, raced, classed, differently abled and differently aged bodies, to reflect on the way such experiences, mediated by social positionality, constitute our sense of self.

5.1 Throwing Like a Girl

In a series of essays written early in her career, Iris Marion Young, (reprinted 2005), captured everyday experiences of women's embodiment. Such accounts were not simply descriptive, but were aimed, initially, to make evident the way in which the social norms governing female ‘bodily comportment’ yielded an inhibited intentionality, an interruption in the pre-reflexive engagement with our environment to which Merleau-Ponty had drawn attention in his work (1962). So, for example, in “Throwing Like A Girl” (1977) she points to studies which suggest that girls and boys throw in different ways and that women, when attempting physical tasks, frequently fail to use the physical possibilities of their bodies. Merleau-Ponty and Sartre, when describing our body's intentional engagement in the world in the pursuit of its tasks, stress that we are unaware of our body as a mere object among objects, rather it is the point from which engagement begins and that which is the source of the ‘I can’ which founds our relationship to our environment. Young suggests that the inhibited intentionality characteristic of female embodiment derives from the fact that women often experience their bodies as things/objects, “looked at and acted upon” (2005, 39), as well as the source of capacities. “She often lives her body as a burden, which must be dragged and prodded along, and at the same time protected” (36). For Young, as for Beauvoir, such experiences of embodiment are not a consequence of anatomy, but rather of the situation of women in contemporary society. Alcoff points out that such phenomenological accounts “require a cross-indexing by cultural and ethnic specificity” (Alcoff, 107), but they point to significant ways in which female lived embodiment can be an obstacle to intentional engagement with the world, as Beauvoir had suggested.

Other of Young's essays, for example, “Pregnant Embodiment,” “Breasted Experience” and “Menstrual Meditations,” focus on distinctive aspects of female embodiment that yield distinct ways of being in the world. Here the stress is not only on inhibited intentionality. There is also recognition that such experiences can offer alternative possibilities for embodied engagement that can be positive as well as negative. In her accounts Young stresses that it is such everyday ordinary experiences of embodiment, variable as they are, that constitute women's sense of their identity as women. Young develops this insight in a discussion of Toril Moi's suggestion that we should replace categories of both sex and gender with the category of the lived body. Moi (1999) suggests that the category of the lived body can capture the way material features of our bodies play a role in our subjective sense of self, without giving a reductionist, biological account of such embodiment. For the body as lived is always a body in a situation, a body always subjected to culture. Moreover, attention to the lived body does not necessarily require a binary account of sexual difference. Nonetheless, as Lennon (2006) points out, it can make sense of transsexual desire for corporeal transformation. For experiences of material features of the body are foundational to our sense of our sexed identity.

5.2 Visible Identities

In the work of Linda Alcoff, (2005), a phenomenological account is employed to give an account of those identity categories which are anchored in material bodily features, what she terms visible identities. Alcoff is offering an account which integrates social identity categories with people's experiences of the bodies of themselves and others. Focussing primarily on raced and gendered identities, she makes clear the way in which bodily features, (colour, hair, nose, breasts, genitals) are invested with a significance which becomes a part of our immediate perceptual experience of them. “Both race and sex … are most definitely physical, marked on and through the body, lived as a material experience, visible as surface phenomena and determinant of economic and political status” (102). Because of the material reality of the features and the immediacy of our perceptual response, the meanings attached to such features become naturalised. The fact that they are the product of learned modes of perception is not evident to us, for such perceptual practices have become habitual and are resistant to change. She points out how “race and gender consciousness produce habitual bodily mannerisms that feel natural and become unconscious after long use” (108).

The significance, therefore, of certain bodily shapes, informs our sense of our own body and of the bodies of others. The sense of our own body reflects, as was articulated by Sartre, Fanon, and Beauvoir, the way it is perceived by others. The very shape of the body carries its position in patterns of social interaction. In a striking example regarding raced physiognomies, Alcoff (189) quotes from Richard Rodriguez's book Days of Obligation: “I used to stare at the Indian in the mirror. The wide nostrils … the thick lips … Such a long face—such a long nose—sculpted by indifferent, blunt thumbs, and of such common clay. No one in my family had a face as dark or as Indian as mine. My face could not portray the ambition I brought to it” (my emphasis).Ambition is something expressible in a body of a different kind, and the face he looks at points to a positioning at odds with what he desires. Although Alcoff restricts her analysis to race and sex, it is clear that it also has relevance to other bodily identities. The body in the wheelchair has similar difficulty expressing physical prowess that Rodriguez's has of expressing ambition.

Despite the polarising and often damaging consequences of the perceptual practices which Alcoff draws our attention to, she remains optimistic about the possibilities for change, though stressing the difficulties of even bringing these practices into view. Such changes require that people are brought to view their own bodies and the bodies of others in a different way: “perceptual practices are dynamic even when congealed into habit … people are capable of change” (189).

5.3 Bodily Image and Bodily Imaginaries

Alcoff, in drawing attention to the salience which particular bodily features have in our experiencing of our own bodies and the bodies of others, links her work to that of other theorists who explore this relation with reference to the notions of both ‘body image’ and ‘bodily imaginaries.’ Gail Weiss (1999) begins her exploration of body images with the work of Merleau-Ponty (1962) and Paul Schilder (1950). For Merleau-Ponty our body image or body schema is the awareness we have of the shape or form of our body: “my posture in the inter-sensory world, a form” (Weiss, 10). Such an awareness is not as of an objective anatomical body, but the body in the face of its tasks, a body in which some aspects stand out and others are invisible. It is by means of such body schemas that we are able to act intentionally in the world, and though they most commonly operate at a pre-reflective level, they constitute our sense of ourselves as corporeal beings.

In the work of Paul Schilder the multiple nature of such body images and their dynamic nature is stressed. For Schilder the phenomenological account is interwoven with a psychoanalytic one. Our corporeal or postural schema is formed, in part, by the emotional and imaginative significance which is given to parts of the body by our personal relations with others, and by the significance attached to corporeal features in the social domain: “the touches of others, the interest others take in the different parts of our body, will be of enormous importance in the postural model of the body” (Weiss, 16). This, together with the importance of bodily sensations, ensures that our body image is formed by the way the body is experienced and emotionally invested rather than cognitively represented. A danger with the concept of body image is that it can suggest something like an inner map or picture which we have of our bodies, a mental representation of the body and therefore separate from it. In the use which Weiss adapts from the phenomenologists she discusses, it is, however, more accurate to think of our body images as modes of experiencing our body, enabling or inhibiting our operation in the world. Weiss berates Merleau-Ponty and Paul Schilder for ignoring the way in which sexed difference, race, class (and, she could have added, ability) are woven into such body images; a criticism also voiced by Irigaray and Grosz.

Attention to body image/corporeal schemas opens the way for a crucial feminist move in relation to such phenomenological accounts: to suggest that it is such bodily schemas which serve to constitute us subjectively and socially as sexed, raced, (dis)abled, culturally and nationally positioned. (This is in line with Moi's suggestion that it is the lived body, rather than sex or gender which is the anchorage of sexed subjectivity.) The phenomenological and psychoanalytic accounts are, however, interwoven here. Feminists employing the concept of the bodily imaginary, influenced by the work of Irigaray (discussed above), stress that the awareness we have of our bodies is not a neutral or purely cognitive one. The way we have of experiencing our bodies invests particular contours with emotional and affective salience. Some of our bodily zones and shapes become significant to us, while others are barely noticed (see also Butler 1993, 56). What shape that body is taken to have and the salience of that shape is therefore formed by affect, emotion, and desire, mediated by the relations we have with significant others, and by the images we encounter in a public culture. Moira Gatens (1996), in exploring the notion of bodily imaginaries, draws on the work of Spinoza. For her the imaginary body is “the social and personal significance of the body as ‘lived,’ socially and historically specific in that it is constructed by a shared language … and common institutional practices” (11–12). Sexual difference in such a framework is constituted out of the imaginary investments in different bodily parts. This account of sexual difference later becomes part of a more general concern with differences, conceived of, in a parallel way, as different modes of embodiment.

Gatens and Genevieve Lloyd also draw our attention to the way Spinoza recognised the resilience of the imagination and its resistance to change. “No affect,” he claims, “can be restrained by the true knowledge of good and evil insofar as it is true, but only insofar as it is considered as an affect” (quoted in Lloyd 1998, 162). What he means by this is that we cannot change people's way of experiencing the world simply by offering them contrary facts. We need to offer them alternative pictures which make emotional (imaginative) and not only cognitive sense. This is a crucial issue for all writers who want to provide an account of corporeal identities in terms of affectively laden body images, or bodily imaginaries. Many of the emotional saliencies which are attached, socially or only individually, to specific bodily features are damaging and destructive. There are many damaging imaginaries of women's bodies, gay bodies, black bodies, or those imagined as disabled. It therefore seems imperative that such ways of thinking/feeling specific corporeal features can be subject to change. The matter becomes more complex once we also recognise that the affective salience which our bodies bear may not be available to reflective scrutiny, but nonetheless reveals itself in the habitual perceptual practices to which Alcoff drew our attention.

Despite seeing the difficulty that effecting changes in the imaginary shape that bodies, and other parts of our world, can take for us, Spinoza did think such change was possible. Lloyd and Gatens point out that “he sees these organised patterns of affect and image as changeable through challenging the appropriateness of the images at their core … whereby we can learn to replace misleading and debilitating illusions” (1999, 26), We can see this process at work in the rewriting of the female body offered by Irigaray, and in the re-imagining of the black body which we find in writers such as bell hooks, where the skin of the man lying next to her, “soot black like my grand-daddy's skin” can return her to “a world where we had a history … a world where … something wonderful might be a ripe tomato, found as we walked through the rows of Daddy Jerry's garden” (1990, 33; see also Tate 2009). Feminist theorists of the body, working with the notion of the bodily imaginary, therefore see creative acts directed at alterations in our mode of perceiving bodies, as central to the process of political and social transformation (Lennon 2004).


Feminist theorists of embodiment have made a central contribution to philosophy of embodiment and ensured, along with critical race theorists and theorists of (dis)ability, that attention to the body plays a central role in social and political thought. The theories which emerge are not simply of gendered embodiment. They provide a general account of the relations between bodies and selves. Consequently the philosophy of embodiment extends outside the social and political sphere to engage with debates in philosophy of mind/body, where attention to embodiment has extended beyond a simple reductionist picture of the relation between mind and brain, to consider an embodied self, embedded within an environment. The formation of embodied subjectivity as constitutive of the self, to which feminists have paid such careful attention, and the persisting interrogation of the appropriate way of understanding biological and social embodiment, has links with these debates. What, however, is stressed within the feminist literature is the range of philosophical theories which are required to make sense of the embodied self. Naturalising frameworks need supplementing with phenomenological, poststructuralist and psychoanalytic ones, in just way the feminist theorists have exemplified, if embodied subjectivity is to become intelligible.


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