Analytic Feminism

First published Thu Apr 29, 2004; substantive revision Tue Apr 24, 2012

Analytic feminists are philosophers who believe that both philosophy and feminism are well served by using some of the concepts, theories, and methods of analytic philosophy modified by feminist values and insights. By using ‘analytic feminist’ to characterize their style of feminist philosophizing, these philosophers acknowledge their dual feminist and analytic roots and their intention to participate in the ongoing conversations within both traditions. In addition, the use of ‘analytic feminist’ attempts to rebut two frequently made presumptions: that feminist philosophy is entirely postmodern and that analytic philosophy is irredeemably male-biased.[1] Thus by naming themselves analytic feminists, these philosophers affirm the existence and political value of their work.

Readers with a strong desire to “cut to the chase” may jump to the fourth section, on characteristics of analytic feminism. The first three sections explain the relationships between analytic feminists and the various traditions they share, so are helpful in setting the context for analytic feminism.

1. The tradition analytic feminists share with other analytic philosophers

Contemporary analytic philosophers, feminist and nonfeminist, can be characterized roughly as follows: they consider (some of) Frege, Russell, Moore, Wittgenstein, and the Logical Positivists to be their intellectual ancestors; they tend to prize explicit argumentation and the literal, precise, and clear use of language; they often value the roles of philosophy of language, epistemology, and logic; and they typically view their stock of philosophical concepts, methods, and assumptions to be a) consistent with their Modern European heritage, and b) in contrast with methods originating in twentieth-century continental Europe, most recently those having names beginning with ‘post’: poststructuralism and postmodernism broadly conceived.

Of course, each strand of mid-twentieth-century, “classic” analytic philosophy has changed greatly. Many central dogmas have been undermined, and nonfeminists and feminists alike have “naturalized,” “socialized,” and otherwise modulated the earlier, more abstract and highly normative enterprises and doctrines. However, regardless of the extent of the evolution of “analytic philosophy,” the degree to which methodological boundaries are blurred today, and the fruitfulness of intersections among methods, a number of feminist and nonfeminist philosophers continue to think of themselves in the historical trajectory of analytic philosophy and find the tradition valuable. They claim the term ‘analytic philosopher’ for themselves, even if some others might find the term ‘post-analytic’ more appropriate.[2]

2. What analytic feminists share with other feminist philosophers

One way to encapsulate the agreement in positions and values among feminist philosophers, regardless of their methodological inclinations, is to say that for feminist philosophers, both philosophy and gender matter—both are important to the lives of human beings. Feminists recognize that philosophy and philosophers are part of the wider set of institutions of culture in which human beings live, understand themselves, and, only sometimes, flourish. Among the many functions of philosophy are the following: to help us to understand ourselves and our relations to each other, to our communities, and to the state; to appreciate the extent to which we are counted as knowers and moral agents; to uncover the assumptions and methods of various bodies of knowledge, and so on. These kinds of philosophical insights—ones that concern our methods, assumptions, theories, and concepts—can contribute to the oppression of human beings as well as to their liberation (see, for example, Langton 2000 and Vogler 1995). Given the current imbalances of power and privilege with which people live, philosophy has social effects when it “leaves everything as it is.” When feminist philosophers say that traditional philosophy is already political, they are calling attention to these social effects. Feminists seek philosophy that can generically be called “engaged,” that is, philosophy that is potentially useful to empower human beings rather than contribute to the perpetuation of a status quo in which people are subordinated by gender, race/ethnicity, class, sexual orientation, and so on. This is not to say, of course, that feminist philosophers all agree over the appropriate ways to work this out, but they do agree that philosophy can influence lives and should influence them for the better.

A second area of agreement among feminist philosophers is that gender has effects not only on our lives, but also on philosophy itself. Feminists criticize the misogyny of philosophers and the overt and covert sexism, androcentrism, and related forms of male bias in philosophy. For example, philosophers have through the centuries made a variety of false and demeaning claims about “the nature of woman”; they have defined central concepts such as reason in ways that excluded women of their cultures; they have made allegedly universal claims about human nature, desire, or motivation that were, in fact, claims more likely to be true of men of their social class; and they have believed methods and positions to be “value-neutral” and “objective” that were instead promoting the interests of only the privileged groups. Once again, while feminist philosophers agree on the existence of such kinds of male bias, they differ over the best ways to criticize it, the extent to which various philosophical approaches can be reconstructed for feminist use, and so on. Some examples from analytic philosophy will be discussed in the fifth section below, on feminist criticism of analytic philosophy, and in the sixth section, on analytic feminists' responses to critiques.

The kinds of male-biased claims just mentioned have negative consequences not only for women, but also for philosophy. Feminist philosophers argue that on many levels—from individual concepts such as reason or autonomy to entire fields such as philosophy of mind—philosophy has been distorted or limited by the absence of feminist influence. The remedy for these distortions and limitations is not to substitute “female bias” for “male bias,” but to understand the variety of roles that gender plays in the construction of philosophy. Feminists believe that even as philosophers pursue their traditional goals, the likelihood of progress toward them is increased by heeding feminists' more inclusive and self-reflexive approach.

It is important to be clear that feminist philosophers maintain that gender is only one facet of a complex nexus of mutually influencing axes of oppression and privilege that structure society and the social identities of human beings; other facets include race/ethnicity, social class, sexual orientation, disability, and so on. Although gender is only one facet, it is nevertheless an important one with a wide variety of implications for the way we should do philosophy. As feminists continue to critique other philosophers as well as reconstruct philosophy that is not male-biased, most share some points in common. Let's briefly note a few of the points of agreement before moving on to the disagreements that are discussed in the fifth section below, on feminist criticism of analytic philosophy, and in the sixth section, on analytic feminists' responses to critiques.

  • Since many traditional philosophers believe that their own theories or methods have universal applicability, feminist philosophers find it appropriate to hold these philosophers' feet to the fire. Feminists explain that part of what it means for a moral theory or an epistemology to be universal is that it must be usable by a full range of human beings, not just by members of a dominant social group. For example, a moral theory should allow for moral agency for any person regardless of his or her social status. An epistemological theory should be able to analyze a full range of cognitive situations of a wide variety of human beings. A good philosophical theory or method would systematically disadvantage neither men nor women from any social group; it would not treat irrelevant social factors as meaningful. For example, it would disparage no one's experiences, no one's authority as a knower, and no one's goals as a moral or political agent. Such an approach postulates neither the “sameness” of everyone nor the existence of “group differences.” Instead, it asks that philosophers attend to the full range of human beings, including their wide variety of experiences, interests and situations, when purporting to construct “universally applicable” theories.

  • It is dangerous to stop paying attention to gender too soon. Even if a feminist philosopher has a long-term goal of minimizing the importance of gender, there is a risk of leaving too much unanalyzed if one leaps immediately from male-biased philosophy to gender-neutral philosophy. Attention to the influence of gender implies a recognition that philosophy is embedded in social structures and practices, so feminist philosophers tend to use “naturalized” or “socialized” methods to explain the “located” or “situated” character of the subject who does philosophy as well as the objects of philosophical reflection. Of course, the details here vary widely among feminists.

  • Philosophy must be normative at the same time it includes a naturalized or socialized component. Feminist philosophers, like many nonfeminist philosophers, struggle to maintain the level of normativity that they require in order to serve their philosophical and political goals. Again, details will vary concerning what level or kind of normativity is necessary.

Although we return later to controversial aspects of these points, feminist consensus is that although philosophy is a discipline that purports to be about and for all humanity, it has not been. Philosophers have not appreciated the extent to which their theories and methods have underwritten and perpetuated cultures that have prevented the flourishing of at least half of their populations. Philosophy that reflects a feminist sensibility would take account of the relevance of philosophy to the lives of human beings and promote the flourishing of every person. At the same time it would help philosophy to more nearly approximate its own ideals.

3. Various ways to characterize differences among feminist philosophers

Although an essay on analytic feminism focuses our attention on differences among philosophical methods that feminists favor, these distinctions were not salient in the early days of contemporary feminist philosophy. Even during the 1980s and 1990s when methodological differences came under more scrutiny, the question of whether a feminist philosopher finds more valuable resources in analytic philosophy or in pragmatism, poststructuralism, existentialism, Marxism, critical theory, or hermeneutics was of more concern to certain academic feminist philosophers than it was to the wider feminist scholarly or political communities. In fact, academic feminist philosophers in many parts of the world report taking less note of feminists' methodological distinctions than do feminist philosophers in North America.[3] Today, although many feminist philosophers' mainstream philosophical education still often focuses on one philosophical method or tradition, one can find “analytic feminists” discussing Beauvoir, Foucault, or Butler without hesitation. It is fair to say that because of feminist philosophers' political values and desire to communicate with other feminists, they are more motivated to search for methodological cross-fertilization than are many nonfeminist philosophers. (See the entries on intersections between pragmatist and Continental feminism and intersections between analytic and Continental feminism.)

The categories of feminist philosophies/theories most widely known outside academic philosophy since the 1970s are those developed by Alison Jaggar based on political values, goals, and assumptions. Jaggar distinguishes liberal, radical, classical Marxist, and socialist feminism. Each kind of feminism identifies the principal sources of women's oppression and encompasses an epistemology and a theory of human nature as well as political theory and strategies for social change (1983).[4] It is very important to note that some women of color have objected to the widespread and hegemonic use of these categories (see Sandoval 1991, 2000). In addition, because the categories are based in political theories, it is not surprising that they function better in social/political theorizing both in and outside of philosophy than for philosophers doing metaphysics, philosophy of science, aesthetics, and so on.

Sandra Harding developed a different widely used set of categories of feminist philosophies in the context of philosophy of science and epistemology (1986). Harding distinguishes feminist empiricists (practicing natural and social scientists who tended to rely on logical positivist theories), feminist standpoint theorists who drew from Marxist epistemology, and feminist postmodernists. Although Harding is distinguishing feminists by philosophical methodology, it is important to be clear that her category of “feminist empiricist” captures a trend among pathbreaking women scientists who aimed to hold scientific practice to alleged standards of scientific objectivity and neutrality; however, the assumptions behind this trend are not what philosophers today have in mind when speaking of empiricism. Thus Harding's feminist empiricist scientists differ in many important ways from the analytic feminist philosophers who tend to be post-Wittgensteinian-Quinean-Davidsonian empiricists. See, for example, Longino (1990, 2002), Nelson (1990), Solomon (2001), Lloyd (2008), and essays collected in Scheman and O'Connor (2002), Nelson and Nelson (2003), Clough (2003), Superson and Brennan (2005), Grasswick (2011), and Crasnow and Superson (2012).

As we will see in more detail below, analytic feminists are among those who argue that they are not captured by either Jaggar's or Harding's widely acknowledged sets of categories. The analytic feminists who distinguish their method from their political values and assumptions would reject, for example, a necessary connection between being either an analytic philosopher or an empiricist and being a liberal.[5] Additionally, those who claim the label ‘empiricist’ would point out that contemporary philosophical feminist empiricism is not subject to all the objections that Harding raises against feminist empiricist scientists.

4. Characteristics of analytic feminism

Although there had been feminist philosophers using analytic methods since the late 1960s, as feminist philosophy developed in the areas of epistemology, philosophy of science, and metaphysics there were clusters of controversies over the compatibility of feminist politics with a preference for analytic philosophical methods. Panels at American Philosophical Association meetings and discussions at the Society for Women in Philosophy generated essays that explored these matters. See, for example, issues of The APA Newsletter on Feminism and Philosophy (Tuana 1992, Meyers and Antony 1993).

The term ‘analytic feminist’ came into use in the early 1990s in North America. Virginia Klenk proposed a Society for Analytical Feminism in 1991 and was its first president; Ann Cudd characterized analytic feminism on the organization's website (see Cudd 1996) and in a special issue of Hypatia on Analytic Feminism (Cudd and Klenk 1995). Cudd notes that there is at best a family resemblance among analytic feminists. Among the characteristics she cites are the following:

Analytic feminism holds that the best way to counter sexism and androcentrism is through forming a clear conception of and pursuing truth, logical consistency, objectivity, rationality, justice, and the good while recognizing that these notions have often been perverted by androcentrism throughout the history of philosophy…. Analytic feminism holds that many traditional philosophical notions are not only normatively compelling, but also in some ways empowering and liberating for women. While postmodern feminism rejects the universality of truth, justice and objectivity and the univocality of “women,” analytic feminism defends these notions (Cudd 1996, 20).

As we flesh out the family resemblances among analytic feminists it is important to remember that these resemblances include not only substantive positions, but also styles of presentation and other practices. Further, as we have already noted in the first section, on the tradition analytic feminists share with other analytic philosophers, and the second section, on what analytic feminists share with other feminist philosophers, analytic feminists share resemblances with others in their even larger “family” that includes both non-analytic feminists and nonfeminist analytic philosophers. A large and diverse family indeed!

Doctrines. Although Cudd lists a few traditional concepts that analytic feminists want to retain, she makes clear that this is no manifesto. Many who consider themselves feminists in the analytic tradition hold that there are no doctrines required of analytic feminists; indeed, there is even a spirit of contrarianism about such matters. For example, some analytic feminists might well deny Cudd's claim above about the univocality of ‘women.’ Nevertheless, analytic feminists share something that we might call a core desire rather than a core doctrine, namely, the desire to retain enough of the central normative concepts of the modern European tradition to support the kind of normativity required by both feminist politics and philosophy. For example, they believe that feminist politics requires that claims about oppression or denial of rights be true or false and able to be justified and that philosophy requires much the same thing.

This “core desire” finds its expression, for example, in the ways analytic feminists use some of what we might call the “core concepts” that Cudd mentions above: truth, logical consistency, objectivity, rationality and justice. Although, as noted in the first section, on the tradition analytic feminists share with other analytic philosophers, analytic feminists agree with other feminist philosophers that important facets of these concepts are male-biased, analytic feminists defend the concepts in ways that other feminists do not. At the same time analytic feminists disagree among themselves about a number of matters, for example, what kinds of accounts of truth or objectivity should prevail or whether scientific realism or anti-realism is a better strategy. We will spell out some of these details later as we discuss analytic feminists' defense of analytic philosophy in the sixth section, on analytic feminists' responses to critiques.

Bridge building. Analytic feminists' use of these core concepts and their references to the work of traditional analytic philosophers allow them to converse with and build bridges among different groups of scholars, for example, traditional analytic philosophers, other feminist philosophers, and, in some cases, scientists or scholars in social studies of science. This is sometimes an explicit goal of their work, but is more often implied. Two analytic feminists philosophers of science for whom this is an explicit goal are Lynn Hankinson Nelson and Helen Longino. Nelson sees her work in feminist empiricism that builds upon Quine as a way to engage philosophers of science, scientists and feminists in constructive conversation (Nelson 1990 and subsequent essays, e.g., 1996). Longino, in The Fate of Knowledge (2002) takes bold steps to dissolve the rational-social dichotomy by untangling the assumptions made by social and cultural studies of science scholars, historians and philosophers of science, and scientists. Interestingly, Longino's 2002 book is not cast in “feminist” terms, but builds on her overtly feminist work from the 1980s and 1990s and is informed by three decades of conversations of feminist philosophy.

Analytic feminists' styles of writing also have implications for bridge building. As noted in the second section, on what analytic feminists share with other feminist philosophers, analytic feminists value explicit argumentation and clear, literal, and precise uses of language. So this work “looks like philosophy” to nonfeminist analytic philosophers and makes them feel somewhat comfortable entering a feminist conversation. At the same time, feminist philosophers from various philosophical traditions often engage with each other's work outside their own “preferred method” because of feminists' shared values. Thus non-analytic feminists who might find an analytic writing style tediously overqualified or otherwise confining still engage—along with nonfeminist analytic philosophers—in fruitful bridge-building conversations. Editors of analytic feminist anthologies and special issues of journals often have explicit bridge-building intentions that rest both on authors' style and content.[6] See, for example, Antony and Witt (1993/2002), Cudd and Klenk (1995), Haslanger (1995a), Fricker and Hornsby (2000), Superson and Brennan (2005), and Crasnow and Superson (2012).

Style and aggression. Although arguing explicitly is not to be equated with arguing aggressively or in an adversarial manner, analytic feminists have addressed the issue of stylistic aggressiveness. We must distinguish two related issues on this subject: first, an aggressive manner of arguing in general, and second, Janice Moulton's critique of the “adversary method” as a paradigm in philosophy—and specifically in analytic philosophy (1983). Moulton's point is not simply that the socially constructed belief that aggression is an unladylike/unfeminine characteristic puts women at a disadvantage (indeed, in a double bind) in careers such as philosophy that equate aggression with competence. She also focuses on the ways in which the use of the adversary method as a paradigm of philosophy limits and distorts the work of philosophers.

Moulton uses ‘the adversary method’ to refer to the view of philosophy in which the philosopher's task is to develop general claims, produce counterexamples to each other's general claims, and use only deductive reasoning (1983, 152–153). If this is the paradigm of philosophy rather than simply one strategy among many, then the discipline excludes many fruitful kinds of exploration and development, distorts the history of philosophy, and (because it works best in well-defined areas, even isolated arguments) greatly narrows the scope of philosophical concerns. Moulton also sees integrated into this paradigm several ideals of which she is critical, for example, “value-free” reasoning and objectivity. Interestingly, she does not draw illustrations from the obvious examples in analytic philosophy such as Edmund Gettier's analysis of ‘S knows that p’ and the decades of responses to it. Instead she uses an early feminist essay, Judith Thomson's “A Defense of Abortion” (1971), to show ways in which important facets of a substantive issue can be set aside because of restrictions imposed by the adversary method.

I know of no feminist who has argued in print against Moulton's specific argument, although some have made further distinctions (for example, Govier 1999 and Rooney 2010). Nevertheless, some analytic feminists have pointed to the value of arguing aggressively in general. For example, Louise Antony values the gender transgression and feelings of empowerment and freedom that can stem from a woman's using an aggressive analytic style of writing and argument (Antony 2003, see also Baber 1993). More recent treatments of aggressive or adversarial styles have arisen in discussions of the persistently low number of women in philosophy, compared with other humanistic disciplines (see, for example, Burrow 2010, Rooney 2010, and Beebee 2014). However, this issue is not one that finds analytic feminists (or any others) in unanimity. It has been an undercurrent of discussions in meetings of the Society for Women in Philosophy over the decades. Some feminists prefer to eschew aggressiveness at the same time that they retain clear, rational support for their positions. Underlying the disagreement over style is an important shared goal: to remain respectful of the other person while disagreeing. Feminist philosophers find this to be especially important, but peculiarly elusive, when they are disagreeing among themselves. The parameters of respectful disagreement have engendered interesting debate.[7]

Reconstructing philosophy. We noted in the second section, on what analytic feminists share with other feminist philosophers, that feminist philosophers with a variety of methodological and political backgrounds would agree that if a philosopher claims universal applicability for a theory or method, it must be usable by both women and men from a variety of social situations. Many analytic feminists use a similar approach to the construction of feminist philosophy. They tend to be wary of creating specialized fields/types of philosophy that are relevant only to (some or all) women or feminists, for example, feminine ethics, gynocentric ethics, or lesbian ethics (for a variety of positions in feminine and feminist ethics see Feminist Ethics. Analytic feminists tend to propose that feminist ethics or feminist metaphysics would instead establish new criteria of adequacy for ethics or metaphysics. The authors in The Cambridge Companion to Feminism in Philosophy provide excellent examples of this approach (Fricker and Hornsby 2000). In fact, the volume's editors, Miranda Fricker and Jennifer Hornsby, aim to include feminist philosophy in the mainstream of the discipline (2000, 4–5). This approach can be spelled out in terms similar to some used in Section 2: An adequate philosophical theory, method or concept is one that “works” for women as well as men. “Works” is very inclusive here: it cannot be enmeshed in a philosophical system that has oppressive consequences large or small; its theories and concepts must reflect and be applicable to the full range of experiences, interests, and situations of all sorts of women and men. Note that this view requires no commitment to claims about feminist standpoints, nor does it treat women as a uniform class of any kind. It is obvious that experiences vary according to a number of different axes—not only along the commonly cited axes of social class, sexual orientation, race/ethnicity and gender—but also in terms of individual variation as well as other general factors. This approach leaves open many substantive questions about the long-term interests of different individuals and groups. It also permits one to point out the importance of having a variety of perspectives without maintaining that there is something “essential” about these perspectives.

As analytic feminism has become an increasingly developed field, its practitioners have expanded the range of resources upon which they draw as they reconstruct philosophy. For example, some analytic feminists, alongside other feminists and philosophers of race, have argued that traditional philosophy and feminist philosophy alike need to reflect the complexities of “intersectional” analyses of gender, race/ethnicity, sexuality, disability, class, and so on (for example, Bailey 2010, Garry 2012). They draw on feminist critical race theory, queer theory, and disability studies to enrich their understanding of the ways in which various axes of oppression and privilege intermesh.

Reconstructing philosophy can also require acknowledging that privilege plays a role in the construction of epistemic ignorance and epistemic injustice. For example, Miranda Fricker (2007) and Kristie Dotson (2011) as well as authors in Tuana and Sullivan (2006) and in Sullivan and Tuana (2007) call to our attention both the depth with which privilege has been constructed and the ways its tentacles reach into multiple facets of our lives.

5. Feminist criticism of analytic philosophy

Although all feminist philosophers agree that traditional philosophy, including analytic philosophy, has been male-biased in various respects, the disagreements between analytic feminists and other feminist philosophers become more apparent as they discuss critiques of analytic philosophy. In many ways “classic” analytic philosophy seems almost a paradigm case of “male-biased philosophy”—a kind of philosophy least hospitable to feminist values. Among the features that feminists have criticized are that it is committed to pure objectivity and value-neutrality, and uses an unlocated, disembodied, disinterested, autonomous individual reasoner, knower, and agent. Having stated it this boldly, let us look briefly at several feminist arguments that have themselves become “classic” critiques of particular facets of analytic philosophy. Then in Section 6 we will turn to the responses of analytic feminists to try to understand why they nevertheless find valuable resources in the analytic tradition.

In some respects it is hard to disentangle feminist philosophers' critiques of analytic philosophy from their broader critiques of Western philosophy because sometimes their critique of analytic philosophy is supported by their critiques of either its antecedents in modern thought or its sister scientific disciplines. For example, when Alison Jaggar criticized abstract individualism and other concepts of modern liberal political theory her critique was also relevant to the disinterested, detached investigator prized by the logical positivists. Jaggar faults liberalism for (a) its normative dualism that arises when the mental capacity for rationality is “what is especially valuable about human beings” (1983, 40), (b) abstract individualism—“the assumption that the essential human characteristics are properties of individuals and are given independently of any particular social context” (1983, 42), and (c) its assumption that rationality is instrumental, value-neutral, and detached. Jaggar did not claim that her critique applied to analytic philosophy beyond positivism, but notes that neopositivist values are held in normative theories even in the late twentieth century. She is thinking, for example, of political or moral theorists' characterization of objectivity as impartiality and lack of bias (1983, 357).

Among Sandra Harding's analyses of the discourses upon which feminists draw, the most relevant to analytic philosophy is her account of empiricism as practiced by natural and social scientists. Although Harding is speaking about scientists rather than philosophers, her critique of the limitations of the empiricist view—especially its assumed account of “value-free” objectivity—is also applicable to philosophers who utilize this concept of objectivity. Harding advocates that feminists retain a notion of objectivity that incorporates appropriate values (her “strong objectivity”) and criticizes the empiricists' alleged “value-free” objectivity by the use of the arguments below.

  1. It perpetuates the values of the researchers, and is, in differing ways, both too narrow and too broad. It is too narrow because it can detect only values that differ between researchers and “competent” critics, and too broad because it purports to eliminate all social values, when it may well be that some values benefit science while others undermine it (Harding 1991, 143–4).
  2. It is politically and morally regressive; for example, it constructs science in a way that permits scientists to be “fast guns for hire” rather than individuals who attend to the moral and political values that support and are implied by their actions. (Harding 1991, 158–9)
  3. It is linked to other implausible views. Examples include, first, that only false beliefs have social causes while true beliefs have natural ones, and, second, that the ideal agent “must create and constantly police the borders of a gulf, a no-man's-land, between himself as the subject and the object of his research, knowledge, or action” in order to be “a self whose mind would perfectly reflect the world” (1991, 158). Harding utilizes Nancy Hartsock's term “abstract masculinity” for this last idea (Harding 1991, 158).

Other feminist philosophers, for example, Nancy Holland, utilize the overlapping critiques of Harding and Jaggar, particularly that of abstract individualism, and take them to be telling of Anglo-American philosophy in general. Holland takes Locke and Hume as well as contemporary analytic philosophers to exemplify Anglo-American philosophy (1990). Holland focuses on the metaphysical assumptions of empiricism that exclude women from philosophy. She writes that contemporary analytic philosophy, “by remaining within the Empiricist tradition, inherits not only the problems of that tradition, but also a self-definition that identifies it as necessarily men's philosophy….[Men's] philosophy defines itself throughout its history in such a way as to exclude what our culture defines as women's experience from what is considered to be properly philosophical” (1990, 3).

Jane Duran is both a practitioner and a critic of analytic philosophy. Although she values the rigor of analytic philosophy and wants to incorporate it into feminist epistemology, she sees analytic epistemology (“pure epistemology”) as a recent incarnation of “a masculinist, androcentric tradition that yields a hypernormative, idealized, and stylistically aggressive mode of thought” (1990, 8). Duran's criticism here runs along the lines of the philosophers just discussed. She appeals not only to Harding, but also to Evelyn Fox Keller (1985), Susan Bordo (1987), and Janice Moulton's (1983) critique of the adversary paradigm discussed above in Section 4. Duran's examples of traits that have been seen as androcentric include, “analysis in terms of logically necessary and sufficient conditions, lack of allusion to descriptively adequate models, the importance of counterexampling, putative universalization of the conditions, and so forth” (1990, 44).

Naomi Scheman refers to herself as an “analytic philosopher semi-manqué”—one who has left the analytic neighborhood of her philosophical training. She has made several kinds of arguments that bear on the adequacy of analytic philosophy: the impact of individualism in philosophy of mind, the nature of the self, and the nature of the normative philosophical subject (see her papers collected in 1993). For example, Scheman argues that it is the ideology of liberal individualism rather than sound argument that underlies the widespread belief that psychological objects such as “emotions, beliefs, intentions, virtues, and vices” are properties of individuals (1993, 37). In fact, part of Alison Jaggar's argument against abstract individualism relies on Scheman's conceptual point that questions of identifying and interpreting psychological states must be answered in a social context, not in abstraction from it. Scheman acknowledges her debt to Wittgenstein in making this point, but goes beyond his views by arguing that women's experiences and psychosexual development do not bear out this kind of individualistic assumption.

In other essays Scheman argues that the philosophical “we”—the subject who has philosophical problems—is a normative subject, one that bears the markings of various kinds of privilege. Her examples of normative subjects are the ideally rational scientist or the citizen of a liberal state (1993, 7). In this way she shifts her argument away from the experiences and developmental differences between actual men and women (or between white people/people of color, or other actual differences of privilege/marginality) in order to focus on the connection between privilege and normativity. If one were to take a Freudian-tinted view that philosophical problems are “intellectual sublimations of the neuroses of privilege,” then their resolution would come, à la Wittgenstein, through changes in our forms of life.[8]

Lorraine Code is among those who have criticized analytic philosophy for use of a moral-epistemic individual who is “abstract, ‘generalized,’ and disengaged” and a tradition that is more concerned with what an ideal agent or knower would do than with a real one (1995, xi). Code uses the example of an “S knows that p” epistemology to focus one of her most widely known critiques. The knowing subject S, in what Code hyphenates as the “positivist-empiricist” epistemology, is an individual—a detached, neutral, interchangeable spectator whose knowledge is most reliable when his or her sensory observations occur in ideal conditions, not real, everyday ones. Code argues that “S knows that p” models of knowledge work only in a prescribed area; indeed, they favor a narrow kind of scientific knowledge. A more adequate characterization of knowing must be applicable to a broad range of examples in the lives of real people. In order to do so, it cannot use the interchangeable subject, S, but must include subjective features of S such as the person's identity, interests or circumstances. For without these features we cannot explain complex, relational knowing, for example, knowing a person. In addition, an adequate account of knowledge should uncover ways in which political interests are used to determine who is allowed to be a standard knower, that is, an S (Code 1991, 1995, 1998). This is only one of Code's early lines of argument against analytic philosophy. In Section 7 we will discuss arguments that point to the limitations of naturalized epistemology in the analytic style as well.

As we close our discussion of some of the important classic feminist critiques of analytic philosophy, recall that another criticism was discussed in Section 4: Janice Moulton's critique of the adversary method as a paradigm of philosophy. Although use of the adversary method need not be limited to analytic philosophers, Moulton's critique was developed during a period in which aggressively argued analytic philosophy dominated Anglo-American philosophical discourse. Her critique is clearly applicable to widespread practices in analytic philosophy.

6. Analytic feminists' responses to critiques

The most frequent kinds of responses by analytic feminists to feminist critiques of analytic philosophy are variations of the following arguments and claims:

  1. Feminist critiques may have been legitimate for some kinds of analytic philosophy, especially logical positivism, but because analytic philosophy has changed, the objections do not hold for most contemporary work. The analytic feminist then develops a strand of analytic philosophy that is not subject to a particular kind of objection, for example, that knowers are unlocated.
  2. There were errors of interpretation in feminists' critiques, for example, concerning the extent to which analytic philosophy incorporated empiricism. After correction, analytic philosophy will not be vulnerable to this particular kind of criticism.
  3. Critics have gone too far in undermining fields of philosophy such as metaphysics and central concepts such as rationality. Such fields and concepts are needed both on philosophical and feminist grounds.

All three kinds of responses allow analytic feminists to engage in activities on which they thrive—disentangling strands of argument from each other, making distinctions among concepts, searching for kernels of truth among points with which they disagree, and so on.

Response (1). Regardless of the precise characterization of contemporary analytic philosophy, it clearly cannot to be equated with logical positivism. So to the degree that feminist critiques focus on logical positivism rather than current analytic work, they will likely be off the mark. As analytic feminists respond to other feminists' critiques, they try to decipher which strands of analytic philosophy might be most useful and the degree to which old assumptions and concepts that are male-biased still linger. Although some feminists have defended facets of the work of Neurath (Okrulik 2004) and Carnap (Yap 2010) as useful for feminism, most analytic feminists find resources in philosophers who themselves reject central dogmas and methods of classical analytic philosophy, e.g., Wittgenstein, J.L. Austin, Quine, Davidson, and others.

Let's take as examples of argument (1) feminists who believe that useful strands of analytic philosophy will be naturalized in some way. We need to cast a wide, permissive net here for what counts as “naturalized” and to acknowledge some controversies over its relation to analytic philosophy and to feminism. As used here, ‘naturalized philosophy’ includes philosophy that is explicitly informed by, rather than replaced by, empirical information about knowers, agents, and social structures from psychology/cognitive science, sociology, anthropology, and elsewhere. Although most analytic feminists favor “naturalizing” philosophy (with a strong preference for its subcategory of social epistemology (see Feminist Social Epistemology), they are critical of many nonfeminist ways of doing it.[9] For example, the focus in traditional naturalized epistemology on “individual” rather than “social” sciences neglects the “situatedness” of our thinking. A final caveat here: since there is disagreement over the proper scope of both ‘naturalized’ and ‘analytic’, some will object that naturalized philosophy is not a “strand” of analytic philosophy at all. For example, Quine, who might be considered the father of naturalized epistemology, fits squarely into our characterization of analytic philosophy; however, Lynn Hankinson Nelson considers him post-analytic (2003). And, of course, there is no necessary link between naturalized philosophy and analytic philosophy in any case; one need only think of Foucault or Dewey to sever that connection.

Keeping in mind all these caveats and controversies, let's turn to the example of naturalized epistemology to consider what “naturalizing” can do to help feminists overcome difficulties with analytic philosophy. Feminists criticize analytic philosophy for its concepts of a knower (and an agent), for example, that it is an individual who is abstract, idealized, interchangeable, unlocated, disconnected, disembodied, disinterested, etc. The first thing that naturalized epistemology can do is to shift the focus from the abstract or idealized knower to the concrete facets of the person who has beliefs and knowledge. Although this move is not in itself feminist, Jane Duran finds it a positive step toward what she calls “gynocentric,” i.e., woman-centered, epistemology. She believes that naturalized epistemology—by its descriptive character and its concern with the context and details of knowing—is capable of including features valued by feminist standpoint epistemology, for example, the relational aspects of knowing and the grounding that knowledge has in the body and in activities of daily life (1991, 112, 246). Duran is one of the first feminists who explicitly combined feminist standpoint theory with analytically oriented naturalized epistemology, and is an exception to the widespread tendency of analytic feminists to stay clear of gynocentrism.

Of course, one need not agree with the specifics of Duran's analysis to appreciate the importance of naturalized epistemology's descriptive attention to context and concrete details: this descriptive attention allows gender into epistemology as facets of the knower and the context become relevant. One can then debate what kinds of social structures, individual variations, and their interactions are fruitful avenues of exploration.

A second naturalized approach is Louise Antony's argument concerning a different aspect of the knower—neutrality. Antony maintains that naturalized epistemology resolves the “paradox of bias” (how one can consistently critique male bias and at the same time object to the notion of unbiased, neutral, objective, or impartial knowledge). Naturalized epistemology rejects the ideal of neutrality and instead gives us empirical norms by which to differentiate good from bad biases, that is, biases that lead us toward rather than away from truth (1993/2002, 113–116, 134–144).[10] Antony also engages in many other facets of the debate between analytic and non-analytic feminists to which we will return later.

A third strategy, still within the context of a naturalized epistemology/philosophy of science, is to change the relationship between empiricism and the individual. Lynn Hankinson Nelson and Helen Longino are empiricists not in the style of Locke or Hume, but in their positions that evidence comes from the senses, from experience (Nelson 1990, 21; Longino 1990, 215). This is encapsulated by saying that empiricism is a theory of evidence. Using different lines of argument, they both shift the focus from the individual to communities. Nelson argues that communities rather than individuals “‘acquire’ and possess knowledge” (Nelson 1990, 14). She wants to use the resources of Quine as well as feminists to forge an empiricism sufficiently rich and sophisticated to overcome critiques of earlier feminist empiricism offered, for example, by Sandra Harding and to avoid feminist objections to individualism (whether to Jaggar's “abstract individualism” or the other forms discussed above). Nelson maintains that Quine—while remaining an empiricist—had already undermined or abandoned many of the postpositivist characteristics to which Jaggar and Harding object. Thus empiricism, tempered by Nelson's focus on communities as knowers, can adequately take into account the social identities of knowers and the complex dependencies of individuals on epistemological communities.

Helen Longino's approach in Science as Social Knowledge (1990) is to argue that among the many ways in which science is social is that epistemological norms apply to practices of communities, not just to individuals. In The Fate of Knowledge (2002), she further develops her contextual empiricist argument along lines that break down the dichotomy between the rational and the social (and many other dichotomies along the way). Although her argument has a wide scope, we are now concerned only with the ways in which her view breaks the connection between individualism and empiricism. Longino distinguishes between individualism as a philosophical position (that, among other things, tends to consider knowers interchangeable) and whether individuals, in fact, have knowledge (2002, 14–48). She does not deny that epistemic norms apply to the practices of individuals or that Einstein had an “extraordinary intellect, but what made [Einstein's] brilliant ideas knowledge were the processes of critical reception” (2002, 122). Knowledge requires social interaction, not a dichotomy between the rational and the social; it also integrates values—some of them social—at both the constitutive and contextual levels.

The responses of Longino, Nelson, Antony, and Duran to feminist critiques of earlier stages of analytic philosophy all illustrate variations on theme (1): they agree with certain facets of the feminist critique, but draw on resources within particular strands of analytic philosophy (in their cases naturalized epistemology/philosophy of science) as well as other feminist resources to produce epistemologies that overcome the objections to analytic epistemology. Their strategies vary: Longino and Nelson de-emphasize the individual in favor of communities; Antony and Duran keep the focus on individuals, but make them more concrete; in addition, Antony tries to resolve the paradox of bias.

Let us turn much more briefly to strategies (2) and (3). The claim in (2) is that there were errors of interpretation in the feminist analyses of analytic philosophy and its antecedents that weaken the feminist critiques. In (3) it is that critics have gone too far in undermining fields of philosophy such as metaphysics or central notions such as rationality that we need to retain. Examples of both approaches (sometimes even in one paper) can be found in Louise Antony and Charlotte Witt's A Mind of One's Own, a collection of papers that focused on reason and objectivity in both the history of Western philosophy and various fields of contemporary philosophy (1993/2002). Those who propound claim (2) include Margaret Atherton and Louise Antony. Atherton criticizes both Genevieve Lloyd (1984) and Susan Bordo (1987) for their interpretations of Descartes (1993/2002). Although Atherton's piece is purely historical, it is relevant to our discussion here because feminists of all persuasions who debate the merit of analytic philosophy acknowledge historical analyses, especially Lloyd's extensive work on “the man of reason.” Louise Antony argues that Alison Jaggar (1983) and Jane Flax (1987) mischaracterize the rationalist or empiricist traditions, and so miss the extent to which analytic philosophers have already rejected aspects of them. This leads feminists to misidentify analytic epistemology with empiricism and overlook more rationalistic possibilities (Antony 1993/2002).

Finally, strategy (3). When analytic feminists defend a field or a concept from critiques of other feminists who have “gone too far,” they might be fending off postmodern critics who do not want to do traditional metaphysics at all or they might be arguing about which aspects of the field are male-biased (for example, foundationalist styles of metaphysics or the tendency to see selected categories as natural). Both Charlotte Witt and Sally Haslanger argue that there is no specifically feminist reason for rejecting metaphysics in general. Witt considers the particular case of “what it is to be human.” She argues that feminists, in fact, need assumptions and theories about what it is to be human even in order to criticize traditional metaphysical theories (1993/2002). Haslanger discusses a range of issues concerning social construction, realism, and natural and social kinds. In the course of her discussion of feminists such as Catharine MacKinnon and Judith Butler, Haslanger makes many distinctions among kinds and functions of social constructions, sorts out ways in which metaphysics and politics are related, and, in general, provides an example of feminist metaphysical debate that distinguishes male-biased facets of metaphysics from facets useful for feminists (1995b, 1996, 2000, 2005). One way of characterizing this approach is that it goes for the “kernels of truth” within larger, more problematic (or at least more polemical) discussions, and thereby performs a service for readers who might be sympathetic with some aspects of the views of MacKinnon or Butler, but who are not willing to accept the body of work that encompasses them. We return to feminist metaphysics in Section 8.

A more controversial analytic feminist response that fits into (3) is Martha Nussbaum's defense of concepts and standards of objectivity and reason. In the context of a laudatory review of the first edition of Antony and Witt's A Mind of One's Own, Nussbaum argues forcefully that it is in feminists' interests, both theoretically and practically, to retain fairly traditional ideals of objectivity and rationality while acknowledging their abusive use. This position, in itself, would not have generated great controversy, even if not universally accepted. However, because Nussbaum sees certain critics of the male-biased aspects of objectivity and reason as part of a “feminist assault on reason” (1994, 59), her essay and her interpretation of other feminists' views generated wide and heated discussion among feminist philosophers.[11]

As we close the discussion of analytic feminists' responses to critiques of analytic philosophy, it is important to restate the obvious: not every analytic feminist would agree with the responses articulated in the few examples chosen here. Indeed, in spite of the desire that analytic feminist philosophy be sufficiently normative, there is ongoing disagreement over issues such as the attitude to take toward concepts that have typically embodied that normativity. Consider traditional ideals of objectivity: views range from the claim that although the ideals of rationality and objectivity are “both unattainable and undesirable,” we nevertheless ought to embrace them as “regulative norms” or “heuristics” (Antony 1995, 87) to a number of different understandings of objectivity that would make them not so subject to distortion or misuse (for example, E. Lloyd 1995a, 1995b, Haslanger 1993/2002, Scheman 2001a, Heldke 2001, Janack 2002).

Finally, we need to remember that what a feminist expects of a philosophical method—her own preferred method(s) or others—will influence her critique of it.[12] It is important to be realistic in considering what any particular method might offer a feminist. For example, an analytic method is likely to provide a feminist with much more assistance in clarifying concepts, making distinctions, and evaluating arguments than with creating her “vision” or defining the goals of her work (see Garry 1995).

7. Analytic feminism: limitations and challenges

As noted previously, traditional analytic philosophy seemed to many to be the least hospitable philosophical method to feminists. Although analytic feminists have clearly increased the method's hospitality, we need to consider limitations and challenges that remain.

The strengths and limitations of various kinds of feminist philosophies can grow from the same sources—if a feminist is close to a mainstream tradition, she is subject to at least some of its limitations although she stands a better chance of influencing it and “building bridges” than does someone who critiques the tradition more deeply. In a 1979 conference talk Audre Lorde pointed to one risk quite powerfully by saying, “The master's tools will never dismantle the master's house” (Lorde 1984, 112). Although over the decades Lorde's claim sent chills down the spines of academic feminists across the disciplines, the very existence of feminist philosophy requires that the “tools” of the philosophical trade are not solely the property of the “master.” Feminist philosophers, analytic or not, build on the work not only of other feminists, but also of some traditional philosopher sometime. Because of the need to utilize as well as modify traditional philosophy, a feminist must always be alert for deeper levels of male bias that may become apparent as she continues her work. Some of the possibilities particularly relevant to analytic feminists are below.

  1. Naomi Scheman and Linda Alcoff, for example, point out ways in which analytic feminists may not fully appreciate all the political, metaphysical and epistemological “baggage” that has already been packed into their theories and concepts. Scheman thinks that Martha Nussbaum stops listening too soon to attacks on rationality and fails to appreciate that openness to reasonable argument (advocated by Nussbaum) implies that we recognize when our own conception of reasonableness is being questioned (Scheman 2001b). Alcoff, maintaining that we need some concept of reason, makes a similar argument against Nussbaum and points out the dogmatic character of claiming that some particular concept of reason is the concept that cannot be given up (Alcoff 1995).

  2. Closely related is another possible objection, namely, that it may not be as easy to detach one's method from one's politics as one might think. Because analytic feminists have been sometimes rightly associated with liberalism (for example, Nussbaum 2000a and Cudd 2006) other analytic feminists take pains to separate their method from their politics. Louise Antony argues that her own socialist politics are compatible with an analytic method (2003). At a certain level, of course, she is right. But if an analytic feminist is articulating a socialist feminism, rather than an inclination toward some kind of socialism or other, then the facets of her position derived ultimately from Marx, from Quine, and from feminism need to be hammered out carefully in order to settle down together well.

  3. Clusters of separate objections focus around subjectivity and standpoints. Traditional analytic philosophy has been rightly criticized for its inability to handle subjectivity. In thinking about whether this criticism applies to analytic feminists as well, let's consider it in the context of knowledge. Elizabeth Anderson calls the position that knowledge is “situated” the fundamental point of feminist epistemology (see Feminist Epistemology and Philosophy of Science). Can “situated” knowledge as developed by analytic feminists capture both the individual subjectivity of human beings and the ways in which material conditions and complex social institutions structure the standpoints of women and others in marginalized groups? There are obviously two separate questions here—asked together because they focus on whether analytic feminism has the resources to capture what is very important to other feminist methodological traditions: standpoint theory and postmodernism.

    Consider Helen Longino as an example: she is dealing with situated knowledge in the context of the sciences. Her contextual empiricism and, more recently, her argument to dissolve completely the rational/social dichotomy and the dichotomies that underlie it allow her to delve into the right areas. Of course, science is not all of life or knowledge, so her argument would need to be extended into areas of everyday life that Lorraine Code, among others, has discussed. Whatever the limitations of contextual empiricism, it is better at analyzing the structural and material features that construct subjectivity than it is at illuminating individual subjectivity. It is in the latter area that postmodern and psychoanalytic approaches flourish (see, for example, Butler 1990, Butler and Salih 2003, Irigaray 1991, Irigaray and Whitford 1993, Kristeva and Oliver 2002). Their focus on the opaque, fragmented, or unfinished character of human subjectivity may be a bit untidy for many analytic feminists. But given the importance of this topic for feminist philosophy, there is a need for fruitful dialogue about it.

  4. Feminist standpoint theory, drawing originally from Marxist theory, raised a cluster of questions for analytic feminists: whether they can explain the political/material construction of standpoints in the production of knowledge, how they treat community-wide biases and assumptions, what criteria they use to distinguish “good” and “bad” biases, and so on. Sandra Harding advocates a pluralistic form of standpoint theory that focuses on the importance of starting research from the lives of marginalized people (1991). Doing so has many advantages, including an increased likelihood that we will be able to uncover community-wide biases and assumptions of the privileged as we produce knowledge in a number of fields. Although initially analytic feminist empiricists and standpoint theorists saw each other as embodying rival traditions and were often critical of each other, there has recently has been significant interest among analytic feminist empiricists in looking at the resources offered by standpoint theory as well as common themes or consensus in the two kinds of approaches (see, for example, Wylie 2004, Potter 2006, Crasnow 2008, Intemann 2010, a 2009 Hypatia symposium (Crasnow, Harding, Rouse, Kourany, Rolin, and Solomon, all 2009), and Anderson 2011). At this time, there is no consensus, simply an exploration that embodies a range of possibilities: incorporating the insights of standpoint theory into empirical (and empiricist) work (Wylie 2004), or maintaining that in a number of their forms they are compatible (Anderson 2011), or arguing that feminist empiricism and standpoint theory have significant overlaps but that their remaining differences show that they need each other (Intemann 2010). A fuller discussion of these issues can be found in Intemann (2010) and Anderson (2011).

  5. Related objections arise concerning naturalized epistemology. As mentioned above, feminist social epistemology is the most typical form of naturalized feminist epistemology today. Social epistemologists have deep critiques of individually oriented and “scientistic” analytic naturalized epistemology. In addition to feminists already discussed above, Phyllis Rooney and Lorraine Code have both argued that there is tension between typical naturalized epistemology and feminist epistemology; Rooney calls it an “uneasy alliance” (Rooney 2003). Code offers an ecological model that she maintains is preferable to analytically and individualistically oriented naturalism (1996, 2006). Rooney appeals to psychological studies of gender and cognition to provide evidence for her critique of assumptions of empirical studies (and of the epistemology that structures and then uses the empirical results). For example, Rooney wants to critique the assumption of the stability of the individual/social distinction, the stability of gender—or even that gender is either stable or situational, for there might be more choices (Rooney 2003). Although analytic feminist naturalized epistemologists might well agree with much of Rooney's critique, Code's 2006 ecological model would be a nearly impossible stretch. In any case, analytic feminists must be very careful as they choose their own models to reflect upon the kinds of assumptions to which they acquiesce, whether those just mentioned or others that might go under the label “scientism.”

  6. The final cluster of challenges concerns language, images, and “rhetorical space.” These challenges are meant to call attention to other kinds of “baggage” of which analytic feminists need to be aware. Although both feminist and nonfeminist analytic philosophers are thought to favor literal uses of language, they also rely on metaphors, analogies, images and the like in the course of making their philosophical cases (think of the frequency of Neurath's ship via Quine). Analytic feminists need to give attention to the assumptions and implications of their literal uses of language, their images and how they relate to what Lorraine Code calls the “rhetorical spaces” in which they function (or, in other cases, fail to function). In using ‘rhetorical spaces’ Code is thinking of the ways in which our discourses are structured to limit what can count as meaningful, be taken seriously, yield insight, expect uptake, and so on (1995, ix–x; with continued discussion in Code 2006).

    Marguerite La Caze, using methodology developed by Michele LeDoeuff, argues that feminists as well as nonfeminist analytic philosophers use images, for example, mythical social contracts in political philosophy and visual and spatial metaphors in knowledge, that can unwittingly perpetuate images that exclude women (La Caze 2002, LeDoeuff 1989; see also Gatens 1991). Analytic feminists are being called upon to widen the rhetorical spaces in analytic philosophy as well as to recognize and scrutinize the images that they, in fact, use in the course of their allegedly literal speech.

Most analytic feminists welcome challenges to their positions from other feminists. For, after all, there is no easier way to be kept honest and to recognize one's own collusion with male-biased philosophy than to have one's feminist colleagues point it out. It is part of any reasonable feminism to want to remain open to the ongoing possibility of collusion and self-deception. Candid, fair-minded conversation benefits all forms of feminism.

8. Other issues and directions

Obviously, it has not been possible to discuss the entire range of analytic feminism. Many of the examples in previous sections came from epistemology or philosophy of science, and a few from metaphysics. In this section, we will touch very briefly on some of the omissions: other areas of philosophy such as moral, social and political philosophy, and history of philosophy as well as a few “core” analytic fields not yet given their due.

8.1 Moral, Social and Political Philosophy

Our focus so far has steered away from fields traditionally acknowledged to concern “values” not simply because of the usual constraints of time and energy, but for two other reasons as well: first, fields such as epistemology are often deemed to be at the core of analytic philosophy, and second, feminist controversies in epistemology or metaphysics often divide along methodological lines in a way that they do not divide so cleanly in ethics, social/political philosophy, or history of philosophy. Although feminist philosophers in the latter areas still have differences in philosophical training, in writing styles, and in preferences for contemporary male figures with whom to converse, the “sides” in major controversies rarely fall neatly into divisions among analytic and non-analytic feminists. For example, early typical feminist controversies in moral theory have concerned whether one should favor an ethics of justice over an ethics of care or a virtue ethics, or whether one should prefer Kant over Hume or Aristotle as a starting point for moral thinking (see, for example, Herman 1993, Baier 1994, Held 1993, Homiak 1993, Larrabee 1993). Interestingly, the degree to which moral philosophers (analytic or not) rely upon and integrate historical figures into their work seems to be greater than among analytic philosophers doing epistemology and metaphysics.

Similarly, among feminists writing in social and political philosophy the focus is more often on whether one is liberal, socialist, radical, or postmodern than the degree to which one is analytic. For example, Martha Nussbaum defends her liberal “capabilities” approach against anti-liberal opponents (2000a, 2000b). Marilyn Friedman may choose to write about autonomy in a certain fashion because she works within a liberal tradition in political and moral philosophy (2003). Although both are rightly considered analytic feminists, this is not usually a salient facet of what interests philosophers about their work. Lisa Schwartzman's feminist critique (but not rejection) of liberalism is in conversation with many analytically inclined philosophers but others as well (2006). On the other hand, Ann Cudd, in Analyzing Oppression, explicitly situates her work in and defends both the analytic and liberal traditions (2006, ix).

At other times it is more important in moral and political philosophy to be writing as both a lesbian and a feminist than to be analytic or not. For example, what is most distinctive about Cheshire Calhoun's Feminism, The Family, and the Politics of the Closet is her exploration of the structure of gay and lesbian subordination and its relation to feminism (2000). Of course, Marilyn Frye and Claudia Card have provided decades of examples of thinking outside any number of “boxes”—analytic or otherwise (see, for example, Frye 1983, 1992, 2011; Card 1995, 1996, 2002).

What might underlie some of the differences just noted are the various roles that normativity plays in moral, social and political philosophy on the one hand and in metaphysics and epistemology on the other. Recall in Section 4 the discussion of analytic feminists' “core desire” for normativity; what this normativity amounts to in their discussions of metaphysics and epistemology is that concepts and arguments carry enough “weight” to justify their positions for philosophical and feminist purposes. In moral, social and political philosophy normativity is much more pervasive. Except for the some “meta-issues,” the very subject matter and sets of concepts in moral and political philosophy are themselves normative: What moral theory should one adopt? What position on justice? What analysis of rape?

Regardless of the points just noted, many feminists writing on topics in moral, social and political philosophy, both theoretical and practical, could well identify themselves as analytic feminists (and sometimes do). On topics such as sexual harassment, abortion, or pornography there would be little in common among analytic feminists other than writing style and a tendency to make many distinctions and cite from a range of analytic figures. Of course, these are factors they would share with analytic feminists in other fields of philosophy. One does not want to overemphasize the contrast drawn here between moral/political philosophy and metaphysics/epistemology—it is a difference of degree. See, for example, Anita Superson on sexual harassment (1993) and Elizabeth Anderson and Ann Cudd on feminism and rational choice theory (2002). See also Rae Langton's work on pornography (1993; 2009; Hornsby and Langton 1998; West and Langton 1999), which draws on J.L. Austin (1962) and Catharine MacKinnon (1987) .

8.2 History of Philosophy

In the heyday of analytic philosophy, it was thought appropriate in some Anglo-American philosophy departments to write about historical figures as if they were disembodied voices entering into contemporary debates in analytic philosophy. Given that this tendency has receded and that feminists tend not to favor the use of disembodied voices in any case, feminist historians of philosophy tend not to identify their historical work as analytic. It is controversial enough to identify it as feminist! The series Re-Reading the Canon, edited by Nancy Tuana, provides more than thirty volumes of feminist interpretation of major figures.[13] Of course, feminist philosophers who write on historical figures often draw on them to treat contemporary topics as well. In this latter work, it is appropriate to think of them as analytic; for example, Martha Nussbaum or Charlotte Witt might turn to Aristotle for ideas in the course of analytic feminist work on anti-essentialism (Nussbaum 1995) and metaphysics (Witt 1993/2002, 2011a).

8.3 Philosophy of Language

Analytic feminist work in philosophy of language is not as extensive as discussions of language are among French feminists or in other disciplines. Nor has it yet been developed to the extent that analytic feminist epistemology or philosophy of science have (although, of course, it intersects with work in metaphysics, philosophy of mind, epistemology, and philosophical method). After articles in early anthologies (Vetterling-Braggin et al. 1977, 1981), analytic work seemed to taper off. For example, the Hypatia special issue on Philosophy and Language (Bauer and Oliver 1992) contained only one article on an analytic philosopher, Frege, and it was very critical (Nye 1992). An analytic feminist special issue of Philosophical Topics (Haslanger 1995a) contained two philosophy of language essays (Mercier 1995, Hornsby 1995). Other work during this period includes, for example, Hintikka and Hintikka (1983), Tanesini (1994), Nye (1998), Hornsby (2000), and Clough (2003). In addition, feminists also find resources in analytic philosophers of language for their own projects. The most prominent example, also noted above, is Langton and her colleagues' and critics' work on pornography (and by implication, rape) that relies on Austin's philosophy of language. See Saul (2010; especially note 4) for an outline of this literature as well as a more detailed account of the broader field. Some of the more recent analytic philosophy of language essays have focused on the methodological implications of considering politically significant terms in philosophy of language (Saul 2012) and further development of the ways language obscures ideology (Haslanger 2011). Given that philosophy of language is also closely related to metaphysics, the discussion continues below.

8.4 Metaphysics

Feminist metaphysicians tackle all major areas of metaphysics, divided by Haslanger into a study of what is real, of basic concepts used in understanding ourselves and the world, and of presuppositions of inquiry (2000, 108). Analytic feminist metaphysicians have moved beyond defending metaphysics against what they considered feminists' misunderstanding or underappreciation of it and currently just go about their work (see, for example, essays in Witt 2011b). Although we have briefly discussed metaphysical examples in earlier sections, one theme in analytic feminist metaphysics that is tied to philosophy of language and to philosophical method bears special mention: the analysis of the category or concept woman (and sex and gender). This flourishing literature provides excellent examples of the ways that real life politics and values interact with central philosophical issues of meaning, ontology, and method. To cite just a few examples: Marilyn Frye's work on the nature of social categories, metaphors, and species (2005, 2011), many responses to Spelman's 1988 Inessential Woman, Haslanger's treatment of social constructions, semantics, and types of analyses (e.g., in 2000, 2005, 2012) that has generated other work by those already discussing women, sex and gender, for example, Natalie Stoljar (2011) and Mari Mikkola (2009, 2011). (See also the entries in this encyclopedia on Feminist Metaphysics and Feminist Perspectives on Sex and Gender.)

8.5 Logic

A collection of essays, Representing Reason: Feminist Theory and Formal Logic (Falmagne and Hass 2002), brings together feminist philosophers with various methodological preferences as well as two psychologists. Several papers take off from the only sustained feminist reading of the history of logic, Andrea Nye's Words of Power (1990). A number of the authors in this collection, regardless of their methodological background, tend to try to salvage what they consider important from formal logic and to reframe their own favorite logical “kernels of truth” in ways that can be useful for feminists—or at a minimum avoid feminist objections. This approach has also been used by Audrey Yap in the course of her defense of Carnap's principle of tolerance (2010). There has also been recent work on informal logic that reflects analytic feminists' sensibilities; see, for example, essays in Rooney and Hundleby (2010).

8.6 Wittgenstein

As someone cited by both analytic philosophers and postmodernists, Wittgenstein embodies the intersection of their interests, or at least that possibility. The authors in Naomi Scheman and Peg O'Connor's Feminist Interpretations of Ludwig Wittgenstein (2002) explore and employ aspects of Wittgenstein's work that range from engendering the Tractatus to applying his Remarks on Colour to racism—though many essays center around remarks in his later work in epistemology and philosophy of language. Although Wittgenstein would surely not have imagined his work to be fruitful for feminists, the editors and authors find it very rich. For example, Scheman considers it important for feminists to acknowledge that Wittgenstein provides a way out of debates about objectivist epistemologies and realist metaphysics by reminding us that both sides are still held captive by the picture that “only something that transcended our practices could make notions such as truth and reality genuinely, fully, robustly meaningful” (Scheman and O'Connor 2002, 17). See also Alessandra Tanesini's feminist interpretation of Wittgenstein (2004) and other Wittgenstein-influenced works such as Heyes (2000, 2003), O'Connor (2002, 2011), Frye (2005, 2011), Scheman (2011) and Garry (2012).

9. Concluding thoughts

Although methodology is the focus in this essay, it is nevertheless important to ask whether there is value in identifying one's feminist philosophy by method. In some respects, there is. Recall the point with which this essay began: by originally naming themselves ‘analytic feminists’ these philosophers declared that feminism need not be postmodern and that analytic philosophy is not irredeemably male-biased. Beyond this, there is a mixture of advantages and disadvantages to identifying oneself by method. It may help to make apparent a feminist philosopher's assumptions and probable toolbox if she identifies her feminism as analytic (or postmodern or pragmatist). At the same time, we need to keep in mind that every feminist discourse undermines its “paternal” method to some degree (see Harding 1991). Thus even if a feminist identifies herself as analytic, she still takes pains to differentiate her views in some respects from her “paternal” discourse. Indeed, part of the meaning of a feminist's claiming a discourse is to say, “It is this discourse against which I struggle.” Such a claim can enable her audience to understand her views better. However, her use of ‘analytic’ might also unnecessarily limit her appeal—particularly if she is trying to communicate in interdisciplinary or international feminist contexts.

There can also be rhetorical advantages for feminists to claim their analytic heritage, especially in locations in which analytic philosophy remains “dominant.”[14] A feminist who is willing to claim an analytic tradition might be able to more meaningfully critique it in certain ways—after all she has given it her best effort. At the very least, her critiques, revisions, and insights might seem more acceptable to nonfeminist analytic philosophers because she is “one of their own.”[15]

It is a disadvantage to call oneself an analytic feminist if, by doing so, one were to encourage others to subsume feminism under a patrilineal identity. In the context of discussing the importance of constructing a feminist genealogy of feminist thought by claiming and engaging with other feminist thinkers, Marilyn Frye notes ironically how much “better placed in history” it seems to be when one is seen “in that august Oxbridge lineage [of Austin and Wittgenstein, rather] than in a lineage featuring dozens of mimeographed feminist pamphlets authored by collectives, … Kate Millett, Mary Daly, Andrea Dworkin, …[feminist philosophers such as] Claudia Card, Naomi Scheman, Maria Lugones, Sarah Hoagland, and troubadours like Alix Dobkin and Willie Tyson” (Frye 2001, 86–87). In order to resist the comfort/erasure of the patrilineal heritage, analytic feminists need to do as Frye says: to claim and engage other feminist thinkers. Many, including Frye, already do so. This will not only help to sustain a feminist tradition, it will also increase the richness of feminist work and decrease the odds of feminists being held captive by male-biased philosophical methods, theories, concepts and images.


  • Addelson, Kathryn Pyne, 1991, Impure Thoughts: Essays on Philosophy, Feminism, amp; Ethics, Philadelphia: Temple University Press.
  • Alcoff, Linda, 1995, “Is the Feminist Critique of Reason Rational?” Philosophical Topics 23(2): 1–26.
  • –––, 1996, Real Knowing: New Versions of the Coherence Theory, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
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