Environmental Aesthetics

First published Mon Jan 29, 2007; substantive revision Mon Jan 26, 2015

Environmental aesthetics is a relatively new sub-field of philosophical aesthetics. It arose within analytic aesthetics in the last third of the twentieth century. Prior to its emergence, aesthetics within the analytic tradition was largely concerned with philosophy of art. Environmental aesthetics originated as a reaction to this emphasis, pursuing instead the investigation of the aesthetic appreciation of natural environments. Since its early stages, the scope of environmental aesthetics has broadened to include not simply natural environments but also human and human-influenced ones. At the same time, the discipline has also come to include the examination of that which falls within such environments, giving rise to what is called the aesthetics of everyday life. This area involves the aesthetics of not only more common objects and environments, but also a range of everyday activities. Thus, early in the twenty-first century, environmental aesthetics embraces the study of the aesthetic significance of almost everything other than art.

1. History

Although environmental aesthetics has developed as a sub-field of Western philosophical aesthetics only in the last forty years, it has historical roots in eighteenth and nineteenth century European and North American aesthetics. In these centuries, there were important advances in the aesthetics of nature, including the emergence of the concept of disinterestedness together with those of the sublime and the picturesque, as well as the introduction of the idea of positive aesthetics. These notions continue to play a role in contemporary work in environmental aesthetics, especially in the context of its relationship to environmentalism.

1.1 Eighteenth Century Aesthetics of Nature

In the West, the first major philosophical developments in the aesthetics of nature occurred in the eighteenth century. During that century, the founders of modern aesthetics not only began to take nature as a paradigmatic object of aesthetic experience, they also developed the concept of disinterestedness as the mark of such experience. Over the course of the century, this concept was elaborated by various thinkers, who employed it to purge from aesthetic appreciation an ever-increasing range of interests and associations. According to one standard account (Stolnitz 1961), the concept originated with the third Earl of Shaftesbury, who introduced it as a way of characterizing the notion of the aesthetic, was embellished by Francis Hutcheson, who expanded it so as to exclude from aesthetic experience not simply personal and utilitarian interests, but also associations of a more general nature, and was further developed by Archibald Alison, who took it to refer to a particular state of mind. The concept was given its classic formulation in Immanuel Kant’s Critique of Judgment, in which nature was taken as an exemplary object of aesthetic experience. Kant argued that natural beauty was superior to that of art and that it complemented the best habits of mind. It is no accident that the development of the concept of disinterestedness and the acceptance of nature as an ideal object of aesthetic appreciation went hand in hand. The clarification of the notion of the aesthetic in terms of the concept of disinterestedness disassociated the aesthetic appreciation of nature from the appreciator’s particular personal, religious, economic, or utilitarian interests, any of which could impede aesthetic experience.

The theory of disinterestedness also provided groundwork for understanding the aesthetic dimensions of nature in terms of three distinct conceptualizations. The first involved the idea of the beautiful, which readily applies to tamed and cultivated European gardens and landscapes. The second centered on the idea of the sublime. In the experience of the sublime, the more threatening and terrifying of nature’s manifestations, such as mountains and wilderness, when viewed with disinterestedness, can be aesthetically appreciated, rather than simply feared or despised. These two notions were importantly elaborated by Edmund Burke and Kant. However, concerning the appreciation of nature, a third concept was to become more significant than that of either the beautiful or the sublime: the notion of the picturesque. Thus, by the end of the eighteenth century, there were three clearly distinct ideas each focusing on different aspects of nature’s diverse and often contrasting moods. One historian of the picturesque tradition (Conron 2000) argues that in “eighteenth-century English theory, the boundaries between aesthetic categories are relatively clear and stable”. The differences can be summarized as follows: objects experienced as beautiful tend to be small and smooth, but subtly varied, delicate, and “fair” in color, while those experienced as sublime, by contrast, are powerful, vast, intense, terrifying, and “definitionless”. Picturesque items are typically in the middle ground between those experienced as either sublime or beautiful, being complex and eccentric, varied and irregular, rich and forceful, and vibrant with energy.

It is not surprising that of these three notions, the idea of the picturesque, rather that of the beautiful or the sublime, achieved the greatest prominence concerning the aesthetic experience of nature. Not only does it occupy the extensive middle ground of the complex, irregular, forceful, and vibrant, all of which abound in the natural world, it also reinforced various long-standing connections between the aesthetic appreciation of nature and the treatment of nature in art. The term “picturesque” literally means “picture-like” and the theory of the picturesque advocates aesthetic appreciation in which the natural world is experienced as if divided into art-like scenes, which ideally resemble works of arts, especially landscape painting, in both subject matter and composition. Thus, since the concept of disinterestedness mandated appreciation of nature stripped of the appreciator’s own personal interests and associations, it helped to clear the ground for experience of nature governed by the theory of the picturesque, by which the appreciator is encouraged to see nature in terms of a new set of artistic images and associations. In this way the idea of the picturesque relates to earlier conceptions of the natural world as comprised of what were called “works of nature”, which, although considered in themselves to be proper and important objects of aesthetic experience, were thought to be even more appealing when they resembled works of art. The idea also resonates with other artistic traditions, such as that of viewing art as the mirror of nature. The theory of the picturesque received its fullest treatment in the late eighteenth century when it was popularized in the writings of William Gilpin, Uvedale Price, and Richard Payne Knight. At that time, it provided an aesthetic ideal for English tourists, who pursued picturesque scenery in the Lake District, the Scottish Highlands, and the Alps.

1.2 Nineteenth Century Aesthetics of Nature

Following its articulation in the eighteenth century, the idea of the picturesque remained a dominant influence on popular aesthetic experience of nature throughout the entire nineteenth and well into the twentieth century. Indeed, it is still an important component of the kind of aesthetic experience commonly associated with ordinary tourism—that which involves seeing and appreciating the natural world as it is represented in the depictions found in travel brochures, calendar photos, and picture postcards. However, while the idea of the picturesque continued to guide popular aesthetic appreciation of nature, the philosophical study of the aesthetics of nature, after flowering in the eighteenth century, went into decline. Many of the main themes, such as the concept of the sublime, the notion of disinterestedness, and the theoretical centrality of nature in philosophical aesthetics, culminated with Kant, who gave some of these ideas such exhaustive treatment that a kind of philosophical closure was seemingly achieved. Following Kant, a new world order was initiated by Hegel. In Hegel’s philosophy, art was the highest expression of “Absolute Spirit”, and it, rather than nature, was destined to become the favored subject of philosophical aesthetics. Thus, in the nineteenth century, both on the continent and in the United Kingdom, relatively few philosophers and only a scattering of thinkers of the Romantic Movement seriously pursued the theoretical study of the aesthetics of nature. There was no philosophical work comparable to that of the preceding century.

However, while the philosophical study of the aesthetics of nature languished in Europe, a new way of understanding the aesthetic appreciation of the natural world was developing in North America. This conception of nature appreciation had roots in the American tradition of nature writing, as exemplified in the essays of Henry David Thoreau. It was also inspired by the idea of the picturesque and, to a lesser extent, that of the sublime, especially in its artistic manifestations, such as the paintings of Thomas Cole and Frederic Church. However, as nature writing became its more dominant form of expression, the conception was increasingly shaped by developments in the natural sciences. In the middle of the nineteenth century, it was influenced by the geographical work of George Perkins Marsh (1865), who argued that humanity was increasingly causing the destruction of the beauty of nature. The idea was forcefully presented toward the end of the century in the work of American naturalist John Muir, who was steeped in natural history. Muir explicitly distinguished this kind of understanding of aesthetic appreciation from that governed by the idea of the picturesque. In a well-known essay, “A Near View of the High Sierra” (1894), two of Muir’s artist companions, who focus on mountain scenery, exemplify aesthetic experience of nature as guided by the idea of the picturesque. This differs from Muir’s own aesthetic experience, which involved an interest in and appreciation of the mountain environment somewhat more akin to that of a geologist. This way of experiencing nature eventually brought Muir to see the whole of the natural environment and especially wild nature as aesthetically beautiful and to find ugliness primarily where nature was subject to human intrusion. The range of things that he regarded as aesthetically appreciable seemed to encompass the entire natural world, from creatures considered hideous in his day, such as snakes and alligators, to natural disasters thought to ruin the environment, such as floods and earthquakes. The kind of nature appreciation practiced by Muir has become associated with the contemporary point of view called “positive aesthetics” (Carlson 1984). Insofar as such appreciation eschews humanity’s marks on the natural environment, it is somewhat the converse of aesthetic appreciation influenced by the idea of the picturesque, which finds interest and delight in evidence of human presence.

2. Twentieth Century Developments

Western philosophical study of the aesthetics of the natural world reached a low point in the middle of the twentieth century, with the focus of analytic aesthetics almost exclusively on philosophy of art. At the same time, the view that aesthetic appreciation of nature is parasitic upon that of art and even the idea that it is not in fact aesthetic appreciation at all were defended by some thinkers. However, in the last third of the century, there was a reaction to the neglect of the natural world by the discipline of aesthetics, which initiated a revival of the aesthetic investigation of nature and led to the emergence of environmental aesthetics.

2.1 The Neglect of the Aesthetics of Nature

In the first half of the twentieth century, Anglo-American philosophy largely ignored the aesthetics of nature. However, there were some noteworthy exceptions. For example, in North America, George Santayana investigated the topic as well as the concept of nature itself. Somewhat later, John Dewey contributed to the understanding of the aesthetic experience of both nature and everyday life, and Curt Ducasse discussed the beauty of nature as well as that of the human form. In England, R. G. Collingwood worked on both the philosophy of art and the idea of nature, but the two topics did not importantly come together in his thought. However, other than a few such individuals, as far as aesthetics was pursued, there was little serious consideration of the aesthetics of nature. On the contrary, the discipline was dominated by an interest in art. By the mid-twentieth century, within analytic philosophy, the principal philosophical school in the English-speaking world at that time, philosophical aesthetics was virtually equated with philosophy of art. The leading aesthetics textbook of the period was subtitled Problems in the Philosophy of Criticism and opened with the assertion: “There would be no problems of aesthetics, in the sense in which I propose to mark out this field of study, if no one ever talked about works of art” (Beardsley 1958). The comment was meant to emphasize the importance of the analysis of language, but it also reveals the art-dominated construal of aesthetics of that time. Moreover, if and when the aesthetic appreciation of nature was discussed, it was treated, by comparison with that of art, as a messy, subjective business of less philosophical interest. Some of the major aestheticians of the second half of the century argued that aesthetic judgments beyond what became known as the “artworld” must remain relative to conditions of observation and unfettered by the kind of constraints that govern the appreciation of art (Walton 1970, Dickie 1974).

The domination of analytic aesthetics by an interest in art had two ramifications. On the one hand, it helped to motivate a controversial philosophical position that denied the possibility of any aesthetic experience of nature whatsoever. The position held that aesthetic appreciation necessarily involves aesthetic judgments, which entail judging the object of appreciation as the achievement of a designing intellect. However, since nature is not the product of a designing intellect, its appreciation is not aesthetic (Mannison 1980). In the past, nature appreciation was deemed aesthetic because of the assumption that nature is the work of a designing creator, but this assumption is simply false or at least inadequate for grounding an aesthetics of nature. On the other hand, the art-dominated construal of aesthetics also gave support to approaches that stand within the many different historical traditions that conceptualize the natural world as essentially art-like—for example, as a set of the “works of nature”, or as the “handiwork” of a creator, or as picturesque scenery. For example, what might be called a landscape model of nature appreciation, which stems directly from the tradition of the picturesque, proposes that we should aesthetically experience nature as we appreciate landscape paintings. This requires seeing it to some extent as if it were a series of two-dimensional scenes and focusing either on formal aesthetic qualities or on artistic qualities dependent upon the kind of romantic images associated with the idea of the picturesque. Such art-oriented models of the aesthetic appreciation of nature, in addition to being supported by powerful and long-standing traditions of thought (Biese 1905, Nicolson 1959), are defended in some recent work in environmental aesthetics (Stecker 1997, Crawford 2004, Leddy 2005a). Likewise, the defense of formal aesthetic appreciation of nature has recently been renewed (Zangwill 2001 2013), although not without debate (Parsons 2004, Parsons and Carlson 2004, Moore 2006).

2.2 The Emergence of Environmental Aesthetics

In the last third of the twentieth century, a renewed interest in the aesthetics of nature emerged. This revival was the result of several different factors. In part, it was a response to the growing public concern about the apparent degeneration of the environment, aesthetic and otherwise. It was also the result of the academic world becoming aware of the significance of the environmental movement—at the level of both theoretical discussion and practical action. It is noteworthy that the emergence of the philosophical study of environmental ethics also dates from this time. Some of the earlier work in environmental aesthetics focused on empirical research conducted in response to public apprehension about the aesthetic state of the environment. Critics argued that the landscape assessment and planning techniques used in environmental management were inadequate in stressing mainly formal properties, while overlooking expressive and other kinds of aesthetic qualities (Sagoff 1974, Carlson 1976). Empirical approaches were also faulted as fixated on “scenic beauty” and overly influenced by ideas such as that of the picturesque (Carlson 1977). In general, the area was thought beset by theoretical problems (Sparshott 1972), and the empirical research in particular was said to lack an adequate conceptual framework, often being conducted in what one critic called a “theoretical vacuum” (Appleton 1975b). Attempts to fill this vacuum prompted the idea of sociobiological underpinnings for the aesthetic appreciation of nature, such as “prospect-refuge theory” (Appleton 1975a 1982), as well as other evolution-related accounts (Orians and Heerwagen 1986 1992). In addition, the concerns of this period motivated the development of a variety of theoretical models of aesthetic response grounded in, for example, developmental and environmental psychology (Kaplan and Kaplan 1989, Bourassa 1991). There are overviews (Zube 1984, Cats-Baril and Gibson 1986, Daniel 2001) and collections (Saarinen et al 1984, Nasar 1988, Sheppard and Harshaw 2001) of this and related kinds of research, as well as more recent studies that, although they have an essentially empirical orientation, are of considerable theoretical interest (Porteous 1996, Bell 1999, Parsons and Daniel 2002, Gobster et al 2007, Hill and Daniel 2008, Gobster 2008 2013).

Within philosophical aesthetics itself, the renewed interest in the aesthetics of nature was also fueled by another development: the publication of Ronald Hepburn’s seminal article “Contemporary Aesthetics and the Neglect of Natural Beauty” (1966). Hepburn’s essay helped to set the agenda for the aesthetics of nature in the late twentieth century. After noting that by essentially reducing all of aesthetics to philosophy of art, analytic aesthetics had virtually ignored the natural world, Hepburn argued that aesthetic appreciation of art frequently provides misleading models for the appreciation of nature. However, he nonetheless observed that there is in the aesthetic appreciation of nature, as in the appreciation of art, a distinction between appreciation that is only trivial and superficial and that which is serious and deep. He furthermore suggested that for nature such serious appreciation might require new and different approaches that can accommodate not only nature’s indeterminate and varying character, but also both our multi-sensory experience and our diverse understanding of it. By focusing attention on natural beauty, Hepburn demonstrated that there could be significant philosophical investigation of the aesthetic experience of the world beyond the artworld. He thereby not only generated renewed interest in the aesthetics of nature, he also laid foundations for environmental aesthetics in general as well as for the aesthetics of everyday life.

In the wake of Hepburn’s article, the next major developments in the emerging field of environmental aesthetics challenged both the idea that nature appreciation is not aesthetic and the persistence of art-oriented approaches to the aesthetic appreciation of nature. Although these views about the appreciation of nature had found some grounding in analytic aesthetics’ reduction of aesthetics to philosophy of art, as art’s monopoly on philosophical aesthetics began to weaken, they were increasing recognized to be deeply counterintuitive. Concerning the former, many of our fundamental paradigms of aesthetic experience seem to be instances of appreciation of nature, such as our delight in a sunset or in a bird in flight. Moreover, the Western tradition in aesthetics, as well as other traditions, such as the Japanese, has long been committed to doctrines that explicitly contradict the nonaesthetic conception of nature appreciation, such as the conviction that, as one philosopher expresses it, anything that can be viewed can be viewed aesthetically (Ziff 1979). Concerning the art-oriented models, it was argued by some that such approaches do not fully realize serious, appropriate appreciation of nature, but rather distort the true character of natural environments. For example, the landscape model recommends framing and flattening environments into scenery. Moreover, in focusing heavily on artistic qualities, these accounts are thought to neglect much of our normal experience and understanding of nature (Hepburn 1966, Carlson 1979, Berleant 1985 1988 1992, Saito 1998a 1998b). The problem, in short, is that they do not acknowledge the importance of aesthetically appreciating nature, as one aesthetician puts it, “as nature” (Budd 2002).

3. Basic Positions in Environmental Aesthetics

After the emergence of environmental aesthetics as a significant area of philosophical research, some basic positions crystallized. In the last part of the last century, these positions developed distinct points of view concerning the nature of the aesthetic appreciation of natural environments. At that time, the positions were frequently distinguished as belonging in one or the other of two groups, alternatively labeled cognitive and non-cognitive (Godlovitch 1994, Eaton 1998, Carlson and Berleant 2004), conceptual and non-conceptual (Moore 1999), or narrative and ambient (Foster 1998). The distinction marks a crucial division between those positions that take knowledge and information to be essential to aesthetic appreciation of environments and those that take some other feature, such as engagement, emotion arousal, or imagination, to be paramount. It thereby gives structure and organization to the diverse points of view represented in the field. Moreover, it is in line with similar distinctions used in aesthetic theory concerning the appreciation of art, music, and literature.

3.1 Cognitive Views

What are called cognitive, conceptual, or narrative positions in environmental aesthetics are united by the thought that knowledge and information about the nature of the object of appreciation is central to its aesthetic appreciation. Thus, they champion the idea that nature must be appreciated, as one author puts it, “on its own terms” (Saito 1998b). These positions tend to reject aesthetic approaches to environments, such as that governed by the idea of the picturesque, that draw heavily on the aesthetic experience of art for modeling the appreciation of nature. Yet they affirm that art appreciation can nonetheless show some of what is required in an adequate account of nature appreciation. For example, in serious, appropriate aesthetic appreciation of works of art, it is taken to be essential that we experience works as what they in fact are and in light of knowledge of their real natures. Thus, for instance, appropriate appreciation of a work such as Picasso’s Guernica (1937) requires that we experience it as a painting and moreover as a cubist painting, and therefore that we appreciate it in light of our knowledge of paintings in general and of cubist paintings in particular (Walton 1970). Adopting this general line of thought, one cognitive approach to nature appreciation, sometimes labeled the natural environmental model (Carlson 1979) or scientific cognitivism (Parsons 2002), holds that just as serious, appropriate aesthetic appreciation of art requires knowledge of art history and art criticism, such aesthetic appreciation of nature requires knowledge of natural history—the knowledge provided by the natural sciences and especially sciences such as geology, biology, and ecology. The idea is that scientific knowledge about nature can reveal the actual aesthetic qualities of natural objects and environments in the way in which knowledge about art history and art criticism can for works of art. In short, to appropriately aesthetically appreciate nature “on its own terms” is to appreciate it as it is characterized by natural science (Carlson 1981 2000 2007, Rolston 1995, Eaton 1998, Matthews 2002, Parsons 2002 2006b).

Other cognitive or quasi-cognitive accounts of the aesthetic appreciation of environments differ from scientific cognitivism concerning either the kind of cognitive resources taken to be relevant to such appreciation or the degree to which these resources are considered relevant. On the one hand, several cognitive approaches emphasize different kinds of information, claiming that appreciating nature “on its own terms” might well involve experiencing it in light of various cultural and historical traditions. Thus, in appropriate aesthetic appreciation, local and regional narratives, folklore, and even mythological stories about nature are endorsed either as complementary with or as alternative to scientific knowledge (Sepänmaa 1993, Saito 1998b, Heyd 2001). On the other hand, another at least quasi-cognitive approach strongly supports the idea that nature must be appreciated “as nature”, but does not go beyond that constraint. The justification for accepting the “as nature” restriction is that the aesthetic experience of nature should be true to what nature actually is. This, however, is the extent of the position’s commitment to cognitivism and marks the limits of the similarity that it finds between art appreciation and the appreciation of nature. It rejects the idea that scientific knowledge about nature can reveal the actual aesthetic qualities of natural objects and environments in the way in which knowledge about art history and art criticism can for works of art. Moreover, it holds that, unlike the case with art, many of the most significant aesthetic dimensions of natural objects and environments are extremely relative to conditions of observation. The upshot is that aesthetic appreciation of nature is taken to allow a degree of freedom that is denied to the aesthetic appreciation of art (Fisher 1998, Budd 2002).

3.2 Non-cognitive Views

Standing in contrast to the cognitive positions in environmental aesthetics are several so-called non-cognitive, non-conceptual, or ambient approaches. However, “non-cognitive” here should not be taken in its older philosophical sense, as meaning primarily or only “emotive”. Rather it indicates simply that these views hold that something other than a cognitive component, such as scientific knowledge or cultural tradition, is the central feature of the aesthetic appreciation of environments. The leading non-cognitive approach, called the aesthetics of engagement, draws on phenomenology as well as on analytic aesthetics. In doing so, it rejects many of the traditional ideas about aesthetic appreciation not only for nature but also for art. It argues that the theory of disinterestedness involves a mistaken analysis of the concept of the aesthetic and that this is most evident in the aesthetic experience of natural environments. According to the engagement approach, disinterested appreciation, with its isolating, distancing, and objectifying gaze, is out of place in the aesthetic experience of nature, for it wrongly abstracts both natural objects and appreciators from the environments in which they properly belong and in which appropriate appreciation is achieved. Thus, the aesthetics of engagement stresses the contextual dimensions of nature and our multi-sensory experiences of it. Viewing the environment as a seamless unity of places, organisms, and perceptions, it challenges the importance of traditional dichotomies, such as that between subject and object. It beckons appreciators to immerse themselves in the natural environment and to reduce to as small a degree as possible the distance between themselves and the natural world. In short, appropriate aesthetic experience is held to involve the total immersion of the appreciator in the object of appreciation (Berleant 1985 1988 1992 2013).

Other non-cognitive positions in environmental aesthetics contend that dimensions other than engagement are central to aesthetic experience. What is known as the arousal model holds that we may appreciate nature simply by opening ourselves to it and being emotionally aroused by it. On this view, this less intellectual, more visceral experience of nature constitutes a legitimate way of aesthetically appreciating it that does not require any knowledge gained from science or elsewhere (Carroll 1993). Another alternative similarly argues that neither scientific nor any other kind of knowledge facilitates real, appropriate appreciation of nature, but not because such appreciation need involve only emotional arousal, but rather because nature itself is essentially alien, aloof, distant, and unknowable. This position, which may be called the mystery model, contends that appropriate experience of nature incorporates a sense of being separate from nature and of not belonging to it—a sense of mystery involving a state of appreciative incomprehension (Godlovitch 1994). A fourth non-cognitive approach brings together several features thought to be relevant to nature appreciation. It attempts to balance engagement and the traditional idea of disinterestedness, while giving center stage to imagination. This position distinguishes a number of different kinds of imagination—associative, metaphorical, exploratory, projective, ampliative, and revelatory. It also responds to concerns that imagination introduces subjectivity by appealing to factors such as guidance by the object of appreciation, the constraining role of disinterestedness, and the notion of “imagining well” (Brady 1998 2003). A related point of view, which stresses the metaphysical dimensions of imagination, might also be placed in the non-cognitive group, although doing so requires making certain assumptions about the cognitive content of metaphysical speculation. According to this account, the imagination interprets nature as revealing metaphysical insights: insights about things such as the meaning of life, the human condition, or our place in the cosmos. Thus, this position includes within appropriate aesthetic experience of nature those abstract meditations and ruminations about ultimate reality that our encounters with nature sometimes engender (Hepburn 1996).

4. Recent Developments in Environmental Aesthetics

Since they first took form in the late twentieth century, the basic positions in environmental aesthetics have expanded from their initial focus on natural environments to consider human and human-influenced environments and developed such as to include an aesthetic investigation of everyday life in general. At the same time, the relationship between environmental aesthetics and environmentalism has been increasingly scrutinized, resulting in criticism of earlier work in the aesthetics of nature as well as detailed assessments of contemporary positions. Concerning both the aesthetics of human environments and environmentalism, approaches that combine the resources of both cognitive and non-cognitive points of views have become more common and seem especially fruitful.

4.1 The Aesthetics of Human Environments and Everyday Life

Both the cognitive and the non-cognitive orientations in environmental aesthetics have resources that are brought to bear on the aesthetic investigation of human and human-influenced environments as well as on that of everyday life in general. Of the basic positions, some non-cognitive approaches have made the most substantial contributions to these areas of research. The aesthetics of engagement is particularly significant in this regard, constituting a model for the aesthetic appreciation of not simply both nature and art, but also of every other aspect of human experience; it studies the aesthetic dimensions of rural countrysides, small towns, large cities, theme parks, gardens, museums, and even human relationships. Moreover, unlike most other approaches in environmental aesthetics, from early on in the development of the field, the aesthetics of engagement focused not only on natural environments, but also on human environments and especially on urban environments (Berleant 1978 1984 1986). Much of this material is available in more recently published volumes (Berleant 1997 2005 2010 2012). Consequently, it has become a foundation for a substantial body of research on the aesthetic appreciation of urban environments (Haapala 1998, von Bonsdorff 2002, Blanc 2013, Paetzold 2013). Other non-cognitive accounts, such as that which stresses imagination, likewise illuminate our aesthetic responses to a range of human environments as well as to our uses of them for resource extraction and agricultural production (Brady 2003 2006).

Cognitive accounts also investigate the aesthetic appreciation of human environments, arguing that, as with natural environments, appropriate appreciation depends on knowledge of what something is, what it is like, and why it is as it is. Scientific cognitivism claims that for human environments knowledge provided by the social sciences, especially history, is equally as relevant to aesthetic appreciation as that given by the natural sciences (Carlson 2008). For appropriate appreciation of rural and urban environments, as well as specialized environments such as those of industry and agriculture, what is needed is information about their histories, their functions, and their roles in our lives (Carlson 1985 2001, Parsons 2008b, Parsons and Carlson 2008). Other approaches emphasize the aesthetic potential of cultural traditions, which seem especially relevant to the appreciation of what might be termed cultural landscapes—environments that constitute important places in the cultures and histories of particular groups of people. What is often called a sense of place, together with ideas and images from folklore, mythology, and religion, frequently plays a significant role in individuals’ aesthetic experience of their own home landscapes (Saito 1985, Sepänmaa 1993, Carlson 2000, Firth 2008).

Fruitful approaches to the aesthetic appreciation of human environments as well as to other aspects of everyday life also can be found in views that draw on both cognitive and non-cognitive positions. There have been several attempts to explicitly forge connections between the two orientations (Foster 1998, Moore 1999 2008, Berleant and Carlson 2007). Moreover, there are numerous studies that, moving beyond the cognitive/non-cognitive distinction, inform our understanding of the appreciation of human environments (Arntzen and Brady 2008, Herrington 2009), such as rural countrysides (Sepänmaa 2005, von Bonsdorff 2005, Andrews 2007, Leddy 2008) and urban cityscapes (von Bonsdorff 2002, Macauley 2007) as well as more specialized environments, such as industrial sites (Saito 2004, Maskit 2007) and shopping centers (Brottman 2007, Vogel 2014). Beyond the consideration of these larger, public environments, the aesthetics of everyday life becomes especially relevant. It investigates not only the aesthetic qualities of smaller, more personal environments, such as individual living spaces, for example, yards and houses (Melchionne 1998 2002, Lee 2010), but also the aesthetic dimensions of normal day-to-day experiences (Leddy 1995 2005b 1012b, Saito 2001 2007a 2012, Haapala 2005, Mandoki 2007, Irvin 2008a 2008b, Maskit 2011) as well as everyday activities such as playing sports (Welsch 2005) and dining (Korsmeyer 1999). There are several collections focusing on this kind of research that yield insight into and encourage appreciation of almost every aspect of day to day life (von Bonsdorff and Haapala 1999, Light and Smith 2005, Yuedi and Carter 2014). However, although the various lines of research are clearly very productive, the credentials of the aesthetics of everyday life as an investigation of genuine aesthetic experiences have recently been challenged and debated (Dowling 2010, Melchionne 2011 2013 2014, Leddy 2012a, Naukkarinen 2013).

Nonetheless, in spite of these challenges and concerns about the aesthetics of everyday life, when it turns to the investigation of things such as sports and food, it begins to come full circle, connecting environmental aesthetics back to the edges of more traditional aesthetics and to the study of clearly genuine aesthetic experiences. By way of the aesthetics of everyday life, environmental aesthetics makes contact with the philosophy of borderline art forms, not only the “arts” of sport and cuisine, but also the art of gardening (Miller 1993, Carlson 1997, Ross 1998, Cooper 2006, Parsons 2008a) and the arts of landscaping, architecture, and design (Stecker 1999, Carlson 2000, Parsons 2008b 2011, Forsey 2013). In addition, but now within the context of environmental aesthetics, traditional art forms, such as poetry and literature (Berleant 1991 2004, Ross 1998, Sepänmaa 2004) and painting, sculpture, dance, and music (Berleant 1991 2004, Ross 1998, Mullis 2014) as well as newer forms, such as environmental art with its special relevance to environmental aesthetics (Crawford 1983, Carlson 1986, Ross 1993, Brady 2007, Brook 2007, Fisher 2007, Lintott 2007, Parsons 2008a, Simus 2008b), are explored and re-explored—both as aesthetically significant dimensions of our everyday experiences and concerning their roles in shaping aesthetic appreciation of both natural and human environments.

4.2 Environmental Aesthetics and Environmentalism

The relationships between contemporary environmentalism and the positions and ideas of environmental aesthetics have sources in the aesthetics of nature developed in the eighteenth and nineteenth centuries. As noted, early environmental movements, especially in North America, were fueled by a mode of aesthetic appreciation shaped not only by the notion of the picturesque but also by ideas developed by thinkers such as Muir (Hargrove 1979, Callicott 1994, Wattles 2013). However, more recently the relationships between environmental aesthetics and environmentalism have been less congenial (Carlson 2010). Some individuals interested in the conservation and protection of both natural and human heritage environments have not found in traditional aesthetics of nature the resources that they believe are needed in order to carry out an environmentalist agenda (Loftis 2003). Others investigate problems posed by environments with unique features, such as isolation (Parsons 2015). The problem is especially acute concerning environments, such as wetlands, that do not fit conventional conceptions of scenic beauty (Rolston 2000, Callicott 2003). Moreover, in line with earlier criticisms that much of the empirical work in landscape assessment and planning was focused only on scenic, picturesque environments, much of the historical tradition concerning the aesthetic appreciation of nature has come under attack. Various themes in the aesthetics of nature, such as appreciation grounded in the idea of the picturesque, have been criticized in a number of ways: as anthropocentric (Godlovitch 1994), scenery-obsessed (Saito 1998a), trivial (Callicott 1994), subjective (Thompson 1995), and/or morally vacuous (Andrews 1998). Similarly, in agreement with the aesthetics of engagement’s critique of the theory of disinterestedness, some find that concept to be questionable from an environmental standpoint (Rolston 1998).

There are a variety of responses to these kinds of criticisms of traditional aesthetics of nature and of the notions of disinterestedness and the picturesque. Some reassess and defend the picturesque tradition, arguing that it, as well as some other aspects of the tradition, has been misunderstood by some contemporary aestheticians (Brook 2008, Paden 2013, Paden et al 2013). Others turn to the investigation of the too-long neglected member of the original eighteenth-century triumvirate of the beautiful, the sublime, and the picturesque, finding in the sublime new resources for approaching the aesthetic appreciation of the natural world (Brady 2012 2013, Shapshay 2013). However, whatever the final verdict about the significance of the picturesque and the sublime, the resources of non-cognitive positions, especially the aesthetics of engagement, are taken to counter the criticisms that, due to the influence of ideas such as that of the picturesque, aesthetic experience of nature must be both anthropocentric and scenery-obsessed (Rolston 1998 2002). The charge of anthropocentricity is also explicitly addressed by the mystery approach, which attempts to give aesthetic appreciation of nature an “acentric” basis (Godlovitch 1994). Concerning the concept of disinterestedness, some philosophers yet hold the view that some form of the theory of disinterestedness is essential, since without it the notion of the aesthetic itself lacks conceptual grounding (Budd 2002), while others claim that an analysis of aesthetic experience in terms of the concept of disinterestedness helps to meet the charges that traditional aesthetics is anthropocentric and subjective, since such an analysis supports the objectivity of aesthetic judgments (Brady 2003). Similarly, cognitive accounts also furnish replies to some of these charges. Scientific cognitivism in particular, with its focus on scientific knowledge, is claimed to help meet the worry that aesthetic appreciation of environments is of little significance in environmental conservation and preservation since aesthetic appreciation is trivial and subjective (Hettinger 2005, Parsons 2006a 2008a). However, the extent to which scientific cognitivism and related views can underwrite a robust objectivism concerning the appropriate aesthetic appreciation of nature is questioned on various grounds (Budd 2002, Hettinger 2007, Bannon 2011, Stecker 2012).

In spite of such reservations about cognitivist positions and objectivity, in light of the seeming relevance of scientific cognitivism to environmental preservation and its stress on the importance of natural sciences such as geology, biology, and especially ecology in aesthetic appreciation of nature, it is sometimes interpreted as an “ecological aesthetic” in the tradition of Aldo Leopold, who linked the beauty of nature to ecological integrity and stability (Callicott 1994 2003, Gobster 1995). However, although it has roots in Leopold’s thought, the explicit idea of an ecological aesthetic, or as it is sometimes called, an ecoaesthetic, seems to have somewhat later origins (Meeker 1872, Koh 1988). Moreover, although the idea has a role within analytic environmental aesthetics, perhaps best filled by scientific cognitivism, it has also been adopted by some philosophers working in the continental tradition. For example, it is claimed that although phenomenological work in “ecological aesthetics” is “still in its infancy”, the work of Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty is applicable to its development and, moreover, that the aesthetics of engagement is the first and currently the strongest “comprehensive phenomenological theory of ecological aesthetics” (Toadvine 2010). There is also more recent research in environmental aesthetics that draws on both analytic and continental traditions (Tafalla 2011, Leddy 2012b, Maskit 2014).

There is, in addition, considerable interest in environmental aesthetics in China (Chen 2015) and especially in ecological aesthetics. The research is pursued by several Chinese aestheticians, who are likewise influenced by work in phenomenology and have developed robust versions of ecological aesthetics. Although much of this work is only available in Chinese, one version accessible in English embraces, as the “four keystones of ecological aesthetic appreciation”, not only the centrality of ecological knowledge defended by scientific cognitivism and the rejection of the duality of humanity and the natural world endorsed by the aesthetic of engagement, but also the over-arching value of ecosystem biodiversity and health and the continued guidance of ecological ethics (Cheng 2013a 2013b). The focus on the last two of these four “keystones” is comparable to attempts by some Western aestheticians to bring aesthetic appreciation of environments, both natural and human, in line with environmental and moral obligations to maintain ecological health (Rolston 1995, Eaton 1997 1998, Lintott 2006, Saito 2007a 2007b) and to forge strong positive links between aesthetic appreciation of nature and nature preservation (Rolston 2002, Brady 2003, Carlson and Lintott 2007, Parsons 2008a, Lintott and Carlson 2014). In this sense, ecological aesthetics speaks to the charge that traditional aesthetic appreciation of nature is morally vacuous, although the degree to which moral considerations and appropriate aesthetic appreciation of nature are importantly related remains a matter of discussion and debate (Loftis 2003, Bannon 2011, Stecker 2012).

Like the movement toward more ecologically informed aesthetic appreciation, the tradition that connects the aesthetic appreciation of nature with positive aesthetics has also been supported by some environmental philosophers (Rolston 1988, Hargrove 1989). The contention that untouched, pristine nature has only or primarily positive aesthetic qualities has been related to scientific cognitivism. Some suggest that linking the appreciation of nature to scientific knowledge explains how positive aesthetic appreciation is nurtured by a scientific worldview that increasingly interprets the natural world as having positive aesthetic qualities, such as order, balance, unity, and harmony (Carlson 1984). Other philosophers see the relationship between scientific cognitivism and positive aesthetics somewhat conversely, arguing that the latter should simply be assumed, in which case it provides support for the former (Parsons 2002). Nonetheless, several aestheticians and environmental philosophers find positive aesthetics generally problematic, either since it appears to undercut the possibility of the kind of comparative assessments thought to be necessary for environmental planning and preservation (Thompson 1995, Godlovitch 1998a) or because the idea itself seems unintuitive, obscure, and/or inadequately justified (Godlovitch 1998b, Saito 1998a, Budd 2002, Stecker 2012). Even philosophers who are somewhat open to the idea of positive aesthetics have some reservations about its original formulation, arguing that it depends too heavily on a now out-dated conception of ecology and/or does not adequately include an evolutionary understanding of nature as an essential component of its aesthetic appreciation (Simus 2008a, Paden et al 2012). Such considerations may point to a more plausible version of positive aesthetics.

In view of this kind of fruitful discussion both within and among the various positions represented in contemporary environmental aesthetics, perhaps the proposals most useful for promoting and supporting the aesthetic appreciation and preservation of all kinds of environments, both natural and human, are those that depend not simply on any one particular model or theory of aesthetic experience, but rather attempt to constructively bring together the resources of several different positions (Nassauer 1997, Lintott 2006, Carlson 2008, Moore 2008, Cheng et al 2013). For example, there are efforts to combine elements of cognitive approaches with non-cognitive points of view, such as imagination-based accounts (Fudge 2001) or the aesthetics of engagement (Rolston 1998 2002, Saito 2007b). In addition, some thinkers explore new avenues that can be constructively related to environmental aesthetics, for instance, feminist theory (Lee 2006, Lintott 2010), social and political theory (Berleant 2005 2012, Ross 2005, Simus 2008b), philosophy of biology (Parsons and Carlson 2008), and animal treatment and protection issues (Parsons 2007, Hettinger 2010, Semczyszyn 2013, Brady 2014a). Others explicitly pursue the application of theory to environmental policy and practice (Saito 2007b, Berleant 2010 2012, Parsons 2010, Sepänmaa 2010, Robinson and Elliott 2011, Brady 2014b). All these contributions continue to shape the future directions of environmental aesthetics (Saito 2010, Blanc 2012, Drenthen and Keulartz 2014). Such innovative, eclectic approaches may be the most successful not only in furthering a wide range of environmental goals and practices but also in fostering a deeper understanding and appreciation of the aesthetic potential of the world in which we live.


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