Notes to Emily Elizabeth Constance Jones

1. Russell and Jones did exchange letters sometime between 1909 and 1911, although only Jones's side of the correspondence is preserved (the letters are dated in month-day format, and the precise year cannot always be determined by reference to external events), so Russell clearly knew of Jones herself, if not her work. The exchange contains a request to attend Russell's lectures on the principles of mathematics, a note some months later thanking Russell for allowing Jones to attend, a note thanking Russell for agreeing to lecture at Girton on “Philosophy and Common Sense”, and, finally, a response to a letter Russell wrote in which he appears to have clarified his response to an earlier letter by Jones (or, possibly, to Jones 1910).

2. Frege's example, though different from Keynes's, is sufficiently close to it to make us suspect that Keynes, if not Jones, was influenced by Frege (the text of Jones he cites was completed in 1889, so there can be no question of Jones being influenced by Frege). However, given that Frege's text was not widely known at the time, and that in any case Keynes did not read German (Skidelsky 1983, 61), this appears unlikely.

3. Russell, it should be mentioned, later expressed misgivings about Jones's abilities. Regarding a forthcoming meeting of the Moral Sciences Club, which he would be unable to attend, Russell wrote to Lady Ottoline Morrell, on January 14, 1914: “poor Miss Jones (Principal of Girton, inventor of a new law of thought, motherly, prissy, and utterly stupid) is reading” (Russell 1992, 470). The utter disdain expressed here hardly simplifies matters. Possibly the hostility to Jones was due in part to her perceived “stupidity”; but there is also the very real possibility that the reverse is true and the hostility in fact colored his estimation of her abilities.

4. Russell (1905), (1910) held that definite descriptions could not be assigned meanings directly, but admitted only of a contextual definition. When we provide an analysis of a sentence containing a description the F, no item corresponding to the description remains. On the contextual definition Russell favored, the F is G is defined as: something is both G and uniquely F.

Copyright © 2011 by
Gary Ostertag <>

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