Emily Elizabeth Constance Jones

First published Fri Mar 25, 2011

Emily Elizabeth Constance Jones (1848–1922), a contemporary of Bertrand Russell and G. E. Moore at Cambridge University, worked primarily in philosophical logic and ethics. Her most significant contribution to the former area is her application of the intension-extension distinction to singular terms, anticipating Frege's related distinction between sense and reference and Russell's pre-“On Denoting” distinction between meaning and denotation. Widely regarded as an authority on philosophical logic by figures as diverse as F. C. S. Schiller and G. F. Stout on the one hand and C. S. Peirce on the other, Jones appeared in published symposia alongside such eminent contemporaries as W. E. Johnson and Bernard Bosanquet and became, in 1896, the first woman to present a paper at the Cambridge Moral Sciences Club. Jones was sufficiently esteemed by Peirce for him to cite her Elements of Logic as a Science of Propositions as an authoritative source on the “Material Fallacy” in Baldwin's widely-read reference work, Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology. Her major publication, A New Law of Thought and its Logical Bearings, published in 1911 by Cambridge University Press, contained an enthusiastic preface by Stout and was received favorably in Mind, where the reviewer, Schiller, remarked: “Miss Jones has made a great discovery.” In the same year, Russell delivered a paper to the Moral Sciences Club, subsequently published as “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description”, responding to a critical paper by Jones, delivered to the same society some months earlier. Jones also published in ethics, and was regarded by Henry Sidgwick, her mentor, as one of his prize students. Yet, despite the fact that she published numerous articles, a monograph and several textbooks (some going into multiple editions), and was a very visible member of the English philosophical community from the 1890s until her death in 1922, she is now almost entirely forgotten.

This entry will focus on Jones's contribution to philosophical logic—in particular, her law of significant assertion—and her criticisms of Russell.

1. Biographical Sketch

Born in Wales in 1848, Emily Elizabeth Constance Jones matriculated at Girton College, Cambridge University's newly established women's college, in 1875. She studied for the Moral Sciences Tripos under Henry Sidgwick, James Ward and John Neville Keynes, receiving a “First Class”, Sidgwick being among her examiners. (Her brothers' education took priority over her own, delaying her entry into the academy and occasioning subsequent interruptions.) It was due to the interventions of Sidgwick and Ward that Jones, fluent from childhood in both German and French, was offered to complete, upon graduation, the remaining half of a translation of Hermann Lotze's massive Mikrocosmos, left unfinished by Elizabeth Hamilton (the recently deceased daughter of Sir William Hamilton). Jones later went on to become Sidgwick's literary executor. Her research in philosophical logic dates from 1884, when she began her career at Girton College as Resident Lecturer in Moral Sciences and was called upon to teach courses in logic; she later became Vice-Mistress and, subsequently, Mistress of Girton. During this period, Jones wrote a number of introductory logic texts, some of which went through several printings. By 1890, in her Elements of Logic as a Science of Propositions, whose main philosophical themes are summarized in the “The Import of Categorical Propositions” (Jones 1893a), she developed her “law of significant assertion”—the “new law of thought” which would become the focus of her subsequent work in philosophical logic, culminating in the eponymously-titled monograph, published by Cambridge University Press in 1911. Jones was also a capable administrator. When she became Mistress of Girton in 1903, the college was £43,000 in debt; at the time of her retirement in 1916, the debt had been paid off and funds had been raised to finance several fellowships. Her death in 1922 was marked by the appearance of substantial obituaries in both Mind and the Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society.

2. A New Law of Thought

2.1 The Paradox of Predication

In her autobiography, Jones wrote of an early fascination with issues related to the nature and structure of content:

This unsettled question—what is asserted when you make a statement, and what is the proper form of statement?—had deeply interested me from the time when I was a student and puzzled over Mill's and Jevons' accounts of propositions. (Jones 1922, 71)

Part of what fascinated her concerned (what I'll call) the paradox of predication—a paradox that Jones traced to Plato's Sophist. To understand Jones's main contributions to philosophical logic, it is useful to review Hermann Lotze's influential discussion, well known to Jones, of this paradox:

This absolute connection of two concepts S and P, in which the one is unconditionally the other, and yet both stand over against each other as different, is a relation quite impracticable in thought; by means of this copula, the simple ‘is’ of the categorical judgment, two different contents cannot be connected at all; they must either fall entirely within one another, or they must remain entirely separate, and the impossible judgment, ‘S is P’, resolves itself into three others, ‘S is S’, ‘P is P’, ‘S is not P.’ (Lotze 1888, 79)

To predicate P of S is either to say of S what it is not, or it is to say of S what it is. That is, it is to say that S is not S (because it is P), or it is to say that it is S. We either get a contradiction—we say, in effect, that S is not S—or an instance of the law of identity—we say that S is S. Neither option is satisfactory.

For Lotze, assertion takes essentially two forms: identity sentences and their negations. This renders him incapable of making sense of (what Jones called) significant assertion. Either one asserts a triviality (A is A) or an absurdity (A is not A). (He vaguely hints at a pragmatic account of such assertion, remarking that, perhaps, “what we mean by them will eventually justify itself.”) As we shall see, Jones does not depart from Lotze's austere conception of logical form: an affirmative proposition S is P states an identity, and is true just in case the extension of S = the extension of P. However, she is able to graft a notion of intensional content onto Lotze's logical skeleton, thus avoiding his paradoxical conclusion, that, despite appearances, all positive assertion is analyzed in terms of A is not A.

The debate surrounding this paradox was not marginal, but at the center of contemporary discussion. Although Jones's own solution falls squarely within the framework of nineteenth century logic, she seems to be responding to worries that were shared by Russell and Moore. Indeed, Dreben and Floyd (1991), who provide a useful discussion of the historical context, argue that the paradox is implicated in Russell and Moore's break with idealism.

2.2 Identity Propositions and Significant Assertion

The distinction between the intension (or connotation) and extension (or denotation) of names was widely acknowledged by nineteenth century logicians. But the distinction was applied, as a rule, to general names, not proper names. With regard to proper names, logicians generally sided with John Stuart Mill in holding that they lack connotation. Keynes, for example, writes that proper names are “non-connotative”—that is, “their application is not determined by a conventionally assigned set of attributes” (Keynes 1906, 42).

Jones's “New Law of Thought”—the law of significant assertion—incorporates the distinction as follows.

The Law of Significant Assertion:
Any Subject of Predication is an identity of denotation in diversity of intension. (Jones 1910–11: 169; 1911, 2)

The general idea is quite straightforward, especially to anyone familiar with Frege's sense-reference distinction (or Russell's pre-“On Denoting” distinction between meaning and denotation), even if the formulation is slightly clumsy: when we predicate a property of an individual or collection x, we first identify x via an intension f and then assert its identity with an individual or collection y, where y is itself identified via a distinct intension g. We thus combine “identity of denotation” or “denotational oneness” with “diversity of intension”. As she puts it as early as 1893, “the very essence of Categorical statements… is the reference (in affirmatives) of two terms to one object, in such a way as to indicate that the object (or group) pointed out by the one term has also the characteristics signified by the other…” (1893a, 219). Or, as Stout writes in his Preface to Jones (1911), “every affirmative proposition asserts, and every negative proposition denies, the union of different attributes within the unity of the same thing” (Stout 1911, v).

As noted, Jones's conception of logical form is austere: every positive proposition asserts an identity. Accordingly, she takes the terms of all F is G to be the quantifier phrase all F and the predicate G. (“I understand the terms to include the whole of any proposition except the copula” (1893–94, 36).) This departs from the then-standard view, which distinguishes, in addition to the copula, subject term (F), predicate term (G) and quantifier or “term indicator” (all). The term indicator, she notes, is optional, citing ‘Cicero is Tully’ as a case of an identity proposition in which it is absent (1890, 5).

There are thus only two forms that can properly be referred to as logical forms for Jones—identities and their negations. While Jones holds that S is P asserts an “identity of denotation” in “diversity of intension”, S is not P asserts “difference of denotation” in “intensional diversity”.

Generalizing the intension-extension distinction to proper names solves a problem that must be faced by anyone espousing the view that predication is, at root, identity. If we construe assertively uttering a sentence exemplifying ‘S is P’ as asserting the proposition that A is A, then we fail to capture the point of the assertion. The assertion appears significant and informative; yet the content is trifling—something about which we hardly need to be informed. If we take the general form of assertion to be an informative identity—to be “an identity of denotation in diversity of intension”—then the problem is solved.

It is worth remarking, however, that Jones's label “a new law of thought” is somewhat misleading. In the nineteenth century, the laws of thought were commonly understood to be: the law of identity, the law of non-contradiction, and the law of excluded middle. She does not state a new law, in addition to these three; nor is it clear how the new “law” can supplant the law of identity. What then is the status of her law, vis-à-vis the other laws? The following passage provides some help:

If we genuinely accept A is A as the expression of a fundamental and primary logical principle, the difficulty is, how theoretically to get beyond it. If we reject it, what we need, and what we find, to put in its place, is a principle of significant assertion of the form S is P. The laws of contradiction and excluded middle are laws of the relations of assertions, and they cannot be expressed in satisfactory and unambiguous form without the use of S is P, S is not P, propositions. So even for them we require a prior principle, explaining and justifying the S is P proposition itself. Such a logical principle, based on a new analysis of S is P, I think I can provide. (1911, 10–11)

Jones's worry seems to be that the law of identity is a poor model for ordinary assertions, which, unlike A is A, are significant and informative. Moreover, the remaining laws—the laws of non-contradiction and excluded middle—apply more generally than to identity assertions; thus they cannot be expressed in their full generality without invoking assertions of the form S is P and S is not P. (That is, the law of excluded middle cannot be expressed as: either A is A or A is not A; similarly, mutatis mutandis, for the law of non-contradiction.)

Still, although Jones advocates rejecting the law of identity in favor of S is P, it's not clear what she means by this. For one thing, not every instance of S is P is true. Moreover, it would seem that Jones must presuppose the law of identity in any case: after all, a predication is true, on her view, only if its terms co-refer—only if, that is, it involves the assertion of an identity. Without the law of identity, what would ground the truth of such a predication?

2.3 Observations on Intension and Extension

Although the concept of intension plays an important role in Jones's theory, she recognizes that grasping the intension of a name is neither necessary nor sufficient for grasping its extension. One may grasp the intension of a term and not grasp its extension, or conversely, grasp its extension but not its intension. Although undeveloped, her observations here are remarkably prescient.

Concerning the possibility that grasping an expression's extension does not require grasping its intension, she writes:

I know that metal in extension denotes gold, silver, copper, iron, lead, tin, mercury, aluminium, etc., and I know these when I see them, but I am not able to give a satisfactory statement of the intension which they have in common…

Or again I know, or I may know, all the inhabitants of a country parish and be able to greet them correctly by name when I meet them, but may be entirely unable to give a recognizable description of any of them. Or I may know real diamonds from paste, or one disease from another, and always apply the names rightly, and yet be unable to set out even to myself the connotation or intension. (1911, 13)

The point applies to the intensions of proper names as well as natural kind terms. What these considerations suggest, as similar considerations later suggested to Saul Kripke and Hilary Putnam, is that names and natural kind terms do not pick out their referents descriptively: mastery of either proper names or natural kind terms does not require that we associate with them any reference-determining description. Jones, however, doesn't draw this bold conclusion. In fact, she thinks the observation is harmless, since, on her view, the intension of a term can be reconstructed by reflecting on its extension.

What I insist on is that all the names we use have both extension and intension; and either of these may be a guide to the other. I may have the things to which a name applies put before me (extensive definition) and from examination of them reach the intension; or have intension given, and go out and by means of it determine extension. (1911, 14)

It doesn't appear, however, that Jones is committing herself to any strong thesis here—that, contra Frege, there is a “backward road” from referent to sense; only that, in practice, a term's intension can often be gleaned from examination of its extension.

In addition, grasping a term's intension does not guarantee being able to identify its extension:

On the other hand I may have full descriptive knowledge of a person or plant or precious stone, and yet not be able to recognize the person or plant or jewel though it may much concern me to do so. I may even know much more about a person than his ordinary acquaintances, or even than his dearest friend, and be able to give a much more accurate description of his appearance and manner, and yet not know him when I meet him. (1911, 13–4)

To connect this observation with the previous, we must assume that the competent use of N, where N is a name or natural kind term, involves a capacity to recognize N's referent. What this passage then shows is that this recognitional capacity is not grounded in our grasping any reference-securing description or intension. But then grasping a name's intension does not, by itself, put one in a position to use it to refer.

Of course, the points are, as indicated, undeveloped, and the above interpretation, written in the light of later discussions by Kripke, Putnam and Gareth Evans, may put more weight on Jones's remarks than they can plausibly bear. But the passage's placement early on in the monograph reflects an awareness of its significance. (The passage does, of course, fail to register the thought that her observations could undermine a key aspect of her proposal—that names and natural kind terms have intensions, or sense.)

2.4 Applying the Analysis

As we have seen, Jones holds that all affirmative propositions are identities. Applying the analysis can be less than straightforward, however. Consider her analysis of (1):

This small fragrant wild flower is Clematis.

On her view, ‘this small fragrant wild flower’ and ‘Clematis’ have the same extension, yet they possess distinct intensions (Jones 1893–94, 36). Jones doesn't fully work out the details of this proposal, but the idea seems to be that the extension of the subject term is identical to some Clematis—a subset of the things in the extension of ‘Clematis’.

As can be seen, the analysis assumes that predicate terms are implicitly quantified. Jones held, following Sir William Hamilton, that quantification is not restricted to subject terms, but applies to predicate terms as well (although the quantifier attaching to the predicate is never articulated). Hamilton's doctrine of the quantification of the predicate allowed for all sorts of monstrosities (Kneale and Kneale, 1962, 352–4). However, the only cases that Jones discusses involve quantifying the predicate with ‘some’, and assigning truth conditions to ‘Q + S are some P’ is relatively straightforward:

All S is some P |S - P*| = 0 where P*P
Some S is some P |S*P*| > 0 where S*S and P*P

In each case, we get the same truth conditions we would have with a quantifier-free predicate. E.g., ‘All S is some P’ is true just in case all S are P.

The endorsement of Hamilton's view might seem perverse—and, in fact, Jones is critical of his view in her logic primer (1906, 35–6)—but it is necessary if Jones is to retain the view that significant assertion is, at root, the assertion of an identity. After all, if all humans are mortal asserts an identity, then, given that identity is commutative, it entails the apparently nonsensical mortals are all humans. The result is at least intelligible if we suppose that the predicate is also quantified—if, that is, all humans are mortal is just all humans are some mortals. For then, the consequence would be some mortals are all humans, which is just the claim that some subset of the set of mortals is identical to the set of (all) humans. (This, of course, is not quite an identity statement, since one of the terms is quantified, but it is the closest we can get to a workable version of Jones's proposal.)

The analysis is applied to a variety of statement forms (see 1911, 48–53). One cannot escape the impression, however, that Jones, like the Oxbridge logicians generally, “dissected with some crude instruments” (Grattan-Guinness 1985-86). Still, while the Law of Significant Assertion cannot be true in its full generality—it is implausible for many of the sentence forms she considers and fails to apply to numerous forms she fails to consider—a restriction of the law to identity sentences is worth considering. Accordingly, in discussing Jones in relation to Frege and Russell, I will construe The Law of Significant Assertion as a doctrine concerning identity sentences—sentences of the form a is b (where a and b are names, demonstratives or descriptions and is functions accordingly as the is of identity, not predication)—and not as a claim about subject-predicate sentences generally.

3. Comparison with Frege and Russell

Jones's analysis of identity sentences has obvious affinities with similar analyses advanced by Frege and the early Russell. In light of this, it is instructive to review how Frege and Russell argue for their respective analyses and compare their arguments with Jones's own.

3.1 Comparison with Frege

In the opening paragraph of “On Sense and Reference” (Frege 1892), Frege argues that a theory that identifies the semantic value of a name with its referent—the naïve theory—cannot differentiate between the contents of ‘Hesperus = Hesperus’ and ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’. Given the plausible assumption that the proposition expressed by a sentence is a function of the semantic values of its constituent expressions together with their mode of combination, it seems inevitable that what the latter sentence says is just what the former sentence says—assuming, with the naïve theory, that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ possess the same semantic value. Of course, the latter sentence is potentially informative, whereas the former sentence is not. This leads Frege to reject the naïve theory. He also rejects, for reasons that need not detain us, a view according to which identity is a relation between the names ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’. The view he settles on is that the contribution that ‘Hesperus’ makes to the propositions expressed by the above-quoted identity sentences is a sense —a way of thinking of the referent. (While one might say that the semantic value of ‘Hesperus’ is the associated sense, this would be incorrect, since, on Frege's view, ‘Hesperus’ has two semantic values—its sense, and the referent determined by this sense. The proposition expressed by, e.g., ‘Hesperus = Phosphorus’ is partly determined by this sense, whereas the referent of this sentence—for Frege, its truth-value—is partly determined by the associated referent.)

Jones's argument is similar, but not identical, to Frege's. She argues that a theory that assimilates all assertion to A is A must fail to account for cases of significant assertion—cases in which we go beyond “pure tautology”. Frege's argument is more sophisticated, making implicit appeal to a principle of compositionality, and considering alternative theories of the semantic contents of singular terms. Still, both are concerned to correct a similar—perhaps the same—mistake. Indeed, Jones's and Frege's interest in identity may derive from a common source, namely Lotze. A number of writers have suggested that Frege's remarks on the metaphysics of content were influenced by Lotze and have argued that they should be read in light of that influence (see Gabriel, 2002 for discussion and references). While their focus has been on ontological rather than purely semantic themes, it is not out of the question that Lotze's influence on Frege extended to semantic questions as well.

3.2 Comparison with Russell

Russell's analysis of identity sentences in Principles §64 falls out of his theory of denoting concepts—concepts that, like intensions, determine an extension. In this section Russell shows how the theory of denoting concepts can explain “why it is ever worthwhile to affirm identity”:

But the question arises: Why is it ever worth while to affirm identity? The question is answered by the theory of denoting. If we say “Edward VII is the King,” we assert an identity; the reason why this assertion is worth making is, that in the one case the actual term occurs, while in the other a denoting concept takes its place… Often two denoting concepts occur, and the term itself is not mentioned, as in the proposition “the present Pope is the last survivor of his generation.” When a term is given, the assertion of an identity with itself, though true, is perfectly futile, and is never made outside the logic-books; but where denoting concepts are introduced, identity is at once seen to be significant. In this case, of course, there is involved, though not asserted, a relation of the denoting concept to the terms, or of the two denoting concepts to each other. But the is which occurs in such propositions does not itself state this further relation, but states pure identity. (Russell 1903; note omitted)

This bears a striking similarity to Jones's proposal. When an identity statement relates two “terms”, or individuals, it is trivial and “is never made outside the logic-books”; but when at least one denoting concept is involved, the statement is significant. While these cases “involve” a relation of co-reference between the denoting concepts, or between one denoting concept and the term denoted, this relation is not part of what is stated: the one relation stated remains “pure identity”. Thus, even in the case of an identity statement involving a denoting concept, we nonetheless assert an identity involving the individual determined by the denoting concept.

In “The Existential Import of Propositions” (Russell 1905a), the theory of denoting concepts is applied to the problem of vacuous singular terms. Russell explains how the failure of a singular term to denote is compatible with the term's nonetheless having meaning, if we assume that denoting phrases (such as ‘the present King of France’) and at least certain names (‘Apollo’) express denoting concepts. Jones seems not to have considered the application of her denotation-connotation distinction to the problem of vacuous terms and does not appeal to its utility in this connection in arguing for her proposal.

4. Russell's Recognition of Jones

As we have seen, Jones's and Russell's respective analyses of identity statements are similar and, moreover, similarly motivated. This raises a question: did Russell, prior to their public exchange (discussed below), have any awareness of Jones's work? Complete ignorance on Russell's part seems unlikely, considering that her teacher, Ward, and her champion, Stout, were Russell's teachers at Cambridge.[1] It seems plausible that they would have attempted to interest Russell in the work of someone whose concerns overlapped with his so significantly. Moreover, Russell was a regular reader of the journals to which Jones contributed; in several cases, the two appeared in the same issue of Mind or of the Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society. (In fact, Jones's contribution to The Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society for 1906–07, which occurs in the same issue as Russell's “On the Nature of Truth”, is in part a commentary on Russell's paper.) But then we have another question—why does he never cite her distinction? Surely his audience, in particular readers of Mind, members of the Aristotelian Society and members of the Moral Sciences Club (see below), could be expected to be acquainted with it. If so, then it would make sense to mention it, if only to show how his (or Frege's) version of the distinction is markedly different. Even if there is disagreement with the framework in which the distinction is grounded, we need an explanation of total silence. After all, in “On Denoting” Russell cites approvingly Bradley's account of universal generalizations in terms of conditionals, even though he has decisively parted ways with Bradley's logic. So at least in one case he could separate a valuable idea from the framework in which it was expressed.

One document of interest concerning the question of influence is a letter to Philip Jourdain, dated September 5, 1909. Jourdain had sent Russell the draft of a long survey article on Frege's work, in which he mentions Jones's distinction, in Jones (1890) and (1982a), between intension and denotation—a distinction endorsed, as he noted in the published version of the article, by Keynes in the fourth (and final) edition of his influential text, Studies and Exercises in Formal Logic (Jourdain, 1911–12, 201–2, footnote 153). Although Jourdain's letter is now lost, it appears he is querying Russell about the relation between Jones's distinction and Frege's (and, quite possibly, Russell's related distinction between meaning and denotation). Here Russell responds:

It would seem, from what you say in your letter, that Miss Jones's distinction of signification and denotation must be much the same as Frege's Sinn and Bedeutung. But of course some such distinction is a commonplace of logic, and everything turns on the form given to the distinction. I have neither Keynes nor Miss Jones here, or I would look up the point. (Grattan-Guinness 1977, 119)

The note displays a remarkable lack of charity. Russell, instead of expressing interest in the possibility that Jones anticipated Frege on sense and reference, dismisses the distinction as “a commonplace of logic.” Going by what he writes here, how it is made, and not the distinction itself, is what is crucial. But until Russell developed the theory of descriptions, the distinction was made informally, both in his own case and in the case of Frege (1892). (While Frege 1893, §11, does present a formal theory of definite descriptions, one which could conceivably be employed as a formal theory of sense, it is doubtful that Russell had this version of Frege's theory in mind when writing the above.) Surely the distinction had been worth making in the cases of Frege and of his earlier self, even though no particular form seems to have been given to the distinction in either case. Russell's dismissal is therefore puzzling.

Moreover, had Russell consulted Keynes' account of Jones's distinction, he would have encountered an example that is quite similar to one used by Frege in the opening paragraph of “On Sense and Reference”:

If out of all triangles we select those which possess the property of having three equal sides, and if again out of all triangles we select those which possess the property of having three equal angles, we shall find that in either case we are left with precisely the same set of triangles. Thus, each side of our equation denotes precisely the same class of objects, but the class is determined or arrived at in two different ways. (Keynes 1906, 190)

Whether or not Keynes and Frege give the same “form” to the distinction, Keynes's presentation is sufficiently close to Frege's to suggest that one could hardly be in a position to dismiss the one, but not the other, as “commonplace”.[2]

One explanation of Russell's dismissal of Jones's distinction has to do with his correspondent. Jourdain, a former student of Russell's, was quite conversant with the developing mathematical logic (at least to a degree—he was a competent, but not quite first-rate, practitioner), went on to publish informed survey articles on (in addition to the piece on Frege already mentioned) Boole, Jevons, MacColl, and Peano, and had written on Russell's earlier work on the principles of mathematics. It's conceivable that Russell resented the fact that Jourdain, expert in both Oxbridge logic and mathematical logic, took Jones to be touching on a point that he and Frege had already laid claim to—perhaps even beating them to a crucial insight. Matters are made worse by the suggestion that Jones had—however casually and indirectly—influenced Russell. Any indication either that he was influenced by Jones, or that she anticipated him in some small way, would detract from Russell's own contribution. It is one thing to acknowledge a debt to a Frege or to a Peano. Russell saw these men not only as intellectual giants, but also as introducing genuinely revolutionary ideas and techniques into the study of logic and the foundations of mathematics. Not only was Jones manifestly not of their caliber, she was also philosophically quite retrograde. For Russell, mindful both of the figures he was allying himself with and of the innovation in thought that they were introducing, acknowledging that Jones had anticipated some of his ideas may have been repugnant. Small wonder, then, that he kept silent on the matter in his published work and correspondence. As it turns out, Jones was quickly to take credit (in print) for first giving expression to the distinction (see Jones 1910–11), although she sensibly refrained from suggesting that her work influenced Russell.

None of this is to deny that there may have been entirely intellectual reasons for Russell's dismissal. As indicated, Russell clearly saw Jones as a throwback to an earlier period. Thus, even if there was some recognition that she had come upon a distinction quite similar to that between sense and reference or meaning and denotation, Russell's indifference could quite easily be attributed to the fact that the insight was grafted onto a system of logic that he rejected.[3]

See Waithe and Cicero (1995, 37–43) for an extended discussion of the relation between Russell and Jones.

5. The Exchange

On December 2, 1909, Jones delivered a paper to the Cambridge Moral Sciences Club, titled “Categorical Propositions and the Law of Identity” (later published, under a different title, as Jones 1910a). Russell responded at a meeting three months later, on March 10, 1911, delivering “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description”. While Russell did not acknowledge being influenced by Jones in his earlier work, nor did he compare her view to Frege's, it is significant that he took her work seriously enough to merit a public response, one that would be recorded in one of his most influential papers.

The main point of their exchange concerns the following well-known passage in “On Denoting”:

If a is identical with b, whatever is true of one is true of the other, and either may be substituted for the other in any proposition without altering the truth or falsehood of that proposition. Now George IV wished to know whether Scott was the author of Waverley; and in fact Scott was the author of Waverley. Hence, we may substitute Scott for the author of ‘Waverley’, and thereby prove that George IV wished to know whether Scott was Scott. Yet an interest in the law of identity can hardly be attributed to the first gentleman of Europe. (Russell 1905b, 420)

Of this passage, Jones writes:

When George IV asked whether Scott was the author of Waverley, what he wanted to know was, whether the intension (‘meaning’, connotation) of Author of ‘Waverley’ could be assigned to Scott—i.e.,—whether identity of denotation could be asserted between Scott and Author of ‘Waverley’. The “first gentleman of Europe” did not want to know whether Scott was Scott … .

No doubt, ‘if a is identical [in denotation, that is] with b,’ whatever is true of the thing denoted by a is true of the same thing denoted by bwith the obvious reservation that a is a does not convey the information that a has the intension (or connotation) b. (Jones 1910a, 379–80; the insertion is Jones's)

I quote Russell's response at length:

Miss Jones argues that ‘Scott is the Author of Waverley’ asserts identity of denotation between Scott and the author of Waverley. But there is some difficulty in choosing among alternative meanings of this contention. In the first place, it should be observed that the Author of Waverley is not a mere name, like Scott. Scott is merely a noise, or shape conventionally used to designate a certain person; it gives no information about that person, and has nothing that can be called meaning as opposed to denotation. (I neglect the fact, considered above, that names, as a rule, really stand for descriptions.) But the author of Waverley is not merely conventionally a name for Scott; the element of mere convention belongs here to the separate words, the and author and of and Waverley. Given what these words stand for, the author of Waverley is no longer arbitrary. When it is said that Scott is the author of Waverley, we are not stating that these are two names for one man, as we should be if we said ‘Scott is Sir Walter’. A man's name is what he is called, but however much Scott had been called the author of Waverley, that would not have made him be the author; it was necessary for him to actually write Waverley, which was a fact having nothing to do with names. (Russell 1910–11, 27–28)

This passage expands on a point made in “On Denoting”, where Russell writes:

Now the relation of meaning and denotation is not merely linguistic through the phrase: there must be a logical relation involved, which we express by saying that the meaning denotes the denotation. (Russell 1905b, 421)

In his response, Russell explains why it is that the relation between a name and its referent is “merely linguistic through the phrase”, whereas the relation between a description and its denotation must be “logical”. The relation between a name ß and what it stands for is (merely) linguistic in that it is acceptable to specify what ß stands for with the phrase ‘the referent/denotation of ß’. The reason that it is acceptable is because ß has its reference or denotation determined conventionally. Thus, since no analysis is possible, all we can do is state the brute fact captured by the schema ‘ß stands for the referent/denotation of ß’. In contrast, the relation between a description and what it denotes is logical—the denotation relation is constrained by the meanings of the constituents of the description and their mode of combination. Thus, if ß is a description, ‘ß stands for the referent/denotation of ß’ does not state a brute fact about our use of ß. Rather, it states a fact that holds in virtue of other facts—facts about the meanings of ß's constituents and their mode of combination.

A bit later, he continues:

If we are to say, as Miss Jones does, that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ asserts an identity of denotation, we must regard the denotation of ‘the author of Waverley’ as the denotation of what is meant by ‘the author of Waverley’. Let us call the meaning of ‘the author of WaverleyM. Thus M is what ‘the author of Waverley’ means. Then we are to suppose that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ means ‘Scott is the denotation of M’. But here we are explaining our proposition by another of the same form, and thus have made no progress towards a real explanation. ‘The denotation of M’, like ‘the author of Waverley’¸ has both meaning and denotation, on the theory we are examining. If we call its meaning M′, our proposition becomes ‘Scott is the denotation of M′’. But this leads to an endless regress. Thus the attempt to regard our proposition as asserting identity of denotation breaks down, and it becomes imperative to find some other analysis. When this analysis has been completed, we shall be able to reinterpret the phrase ‘identity of denotation’, which remains obscure so long as it is taken as fundamental. (Russell 1910–11, 28–29)

Let's unpack this. Russell is here evaluating a hypothesis according to which a description such as ‘the author of Waverley’ is, contrary to his own view, meaningful in isolation.[4] To assume that this description is meaningful in isolation is to assume that, for some M, ‘the author of Waverley’ means M. Let's call this meaning M*. Since we accept the following:

The denotation of ‘the author of Waverley’ = the denotation of what is meant by ‘the author of Waverley

we also accept

The denotation of ‘the author of Waverley’ = the denotation of M*

Now the meaning-in-isolation theorist might suggest that our original sentence, ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’, means that Scott is the denotation of M*. But, as Russell observes, all this does is to replace one description with another. In failing to tell us what ‘the author of Waverley’ means in terms that don't involve an expression equally in need of analysis, we have been given no evidence that this, or any, description is meaningful in isolation.

Jones responds:

Mr. Russell explains my meaning to be that the denotation of The author of Waverley is the denotation of what is meant by the author of Waverley. But I do not accept this. Meaning, intension, of author is authorship; denotation of author is person of whom authorship is an attribute. I do not see from the fact of one proposition being explained by another of the same form … it follows that we “have made no progress towards a real explanation.” This would seem to involve that one categorical proposition cannot be explained by other categorical propositions. (Jones 1910–11, 183–184)

Jones rejects the proposal that what is denoted by the F = what is denoted by the meaning of ‘the F’. While her reasoning is obscure, the point seems to be that these descriptions cannot co-refer, since they involve different concepts—one, but not the other, involves the concept of denotation. The point is confused, however; clearly, the descriptions are co-denoting—relative to the assumption that ‘the meaning of the F’ has a denotation.

Her second point is more intriguing: Jones objects to the regress argument's conclusion that no real explanation of the meaning of denoting phrases can be achieved if we explain a proposition containing such a phrase with another proposition containing a phrase of the same form. Once again, however, the point is undeveloped. Nonetheless, it is implied that a categorical proposition can indeed be explained by another categorical proposition, so from the fact that p and q share the same form it does not follow that (e.g.) q fails to explain p (in the relevant sense of ‘explain’). (Recall that she takes all categorical propositions to possess the same form.) Echoing Jones's sentiment, R. M. Sainsbury writes, “it is unclear what sort of explanation is needed, and why the circularity is vicious. This objection [i.e., Russell's] must be regarded as therefore inconclusive” (Sainsbury 1979, 105). (Broad (1912) responds similarly.) Hylton (1990, 252–53), on the other hand, argues quite persuasively that there is a vicious regress here (Hylton's remarks are concerned specifically with the passage in “On Denoting”, however).

The point is developed further in Jones's reply to Broad (1912), responding to Jones (1910–11):

If I say that the import of, e.g. Scott is the Author of Waverley, is to assert identity of denotation with diversity of intension, I can of course also say that: What is denoted by ‘what is denoted by “Scott”’, is identical with what is denoted by ‘what is denoted by “Author of Waverley”’. As Mr. Broad suggests, the repetition in Subject and Predicate is ineffective, and

What is denoted by ‘Scott’
What is denoted by ‘What is denoted by “Scott”’

have all three the same identical denotation.

Scott is the Author of Waverley.

If my analysis (as far as denotation is concerned) is applied to this, we get:—

What is denoted by ‘Scott’ is identical with what is denoted by ‘Author of Waverley’.

If the same analysis is applied to (2) we have :—

What is denoted by ‘What is denoted by “Scott”’ is identical with what is denoted by ‘what is denoted by “Author of Waverley”’,

and so on. We have simply a repetition, for each successive more complicated proposition, of the analysis adopted.

I think that a regress equally “infinite,” equally inevitable, equally innocuous, equally useless, would emerge in the case of any propositional analysis treated in the same way… (Jones 1913, 528)

Jones seems to miss an important point here. The existence of a sequence such as (1′)–(3′) is predicted on both analyses—one according to which ‘Author of Waverley’ (or ‘the author of Waverley’) has meaning in isolation, and one according to which it does not. Thus, the inevitability of the sequence is of no consequence, as it fails to tell against Russell's theory.

To see this, note that Russell could easily acknowledge that a sequence of the following form will exist when ‘a’ is either a name or a definite description

a is the referent of ‘a
a is the referent of “the referent of ‘a’”
a is the referent of ‘the referent of “the referent of ‘a’”’

In the case of names, the first clause provides the ultimate explanation for the truth of each succeeding clause. This is not true, however, when ‘a’ is a description.

Consider, for example, the following segment of an infinite sequence:

the referent of ‘Scott’
the referent of ‘the referent of “Scott”’

We can say that:

‘Scott’ refers to (4).
‘Scott’ refers to (5).
‘Scott’ refers to (6).

Notice, however, that each member of the latter sequence after (4*) holds because (4*) holds. (Unless, of course, one wants to deny that even ‘Scott’ has meaning in isolation; but this is obviously not Jones's position.) That is, ‘Scott’ refers to the referent of ‘Scott’ (i.e., (5)) because ‘Scott’ refers to Scott (i.e., (4)).

Now consider the following initial segment of an infinite sequence, (7)–(9), together with the corresponding reference assignments, (7*)–(9*):

the author of Waverly
the referent of ‘the author of Waverly
the referent of ‘the referent of “the author of Waverly”’
‘the author of Waverly’ refers to (7)
‘the author of Waverly’ refers to (8)
‘the author of Waverly’ refers to (9)

Here we see a contrast with (4*)–(6*): explaining (8*) by citing (7*) is unsatisfying, since we have no explanation of (7*). Moreover, (7*), unlike (4*), does not state a brute semantic fact—a fact that cannot be further explained in semantic terms.

This disparity between the two cases may not settle the case in Russell's favor—perhaps, ‘the author of Waverly’, like ‘Scott’, is meaningful in isolation after all, even though its meaning (or denotation), unlike that of ‘Scott’, can't be assigned directly (indeed, Richard Montague provided the tools for constructing precisely such a meaning). Even so, the point is that the mere existence of a sequence such as (7*) – (9*) does not settle the case in Jones's favor.

6. Related Criticisms of Russell

An important related criticism, not acknowledged by Russell in subsequent writings (it appeared after his response to Jones in “Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description”) is a critique of a famous passage in Principia Mathematica. In arguing that descriptions are incomplete symbols and have no meaning in isolation, Russell claims that although ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ expresses an identity, ‘the author of Waverley’ cannot be a name. If it were, then it would be a value of c in the propositional function ‘Scott is c’. But this would mean that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ expresses what ‘Scott is Scott’ expresses, which is absurd:

The “author of Waverly” cannot mean the same as “Scott,” or “Scott is the author of Waverley” would mean the same as “Scott is Scott” which it plainly does not; nor can the “author of Waverley” mean anything other than “Scott” or “Scott is the author of Waverley” would be false. Hence the “author of Waverley” means nothing. (Whitehead and Russell 1910, 67)

Jones observes:

Granted that Intension and Denotation are differently defined, this argument seems to depend on a double use of the word meaning—thus: when it is said that the author of Waverley cannot mean the same as Scott, meaning signifies intension or connotation; plainly intension (or connotation) of the author of Waverley and of Scott, cannot be the same. But when it is said that the author of Waverley cannot mean anything other than Scott, or Scott is the author of Waverley would be false, “mean anything other than Scott” must be understood of denotation; if Scott and the author of Waverley are two distinct persons, clearly Scott is the author of Waverley must be false. (My identity-in-diversity theory removes the difficulty at once.) (Jones 1910–11, 175–76)

Jones's point can be summarized as follows. When Russell argues that ‘author of Waverly’ cannot mean the same as ‘Scott’ because this would imply that ‘Scott is the author of Waverley’ and ‘Scott is Scott’ express the same proposition, he uses ‘meaning’ in an intensional sense: “plainly intension (or connotation) of the author of Waverley and of Scott, cannot be the same.” But when he argues that ‘the author of Waverly’ must mean the same thing as ‘Scott’, he uses ‘meaning’ in the denotational sense. Russell's premises, disambiguated, can be recast as follows: ‘the author of Waverly’ and ‘Scott’ cannot have the same intension; ‘the author of Waverly’ and ‘Scott’ must have the same denotation. From these, it does not follow that ‘the author of Waverly’ has neither denotation nor connotation—that it lacks meaning.

Jones seems to be perfectly correct here. The Principia argument intending to show that descriptions such as ‘the author of Waverly’ have no meaning in isolation assumes that an expression can only possess one kind of meaning—and thus that sameness of meaning is either sameness of intension or sameness of denotation—and Jones is quite right to challenge this.

7. Women in Early Analytic Philosophy

Jones was not the only woman contributing to philosophical logic and related areas at the beginning of the twentieth century: Peirce's student, Christine Ladd-Franklin (1847-1930) made significant contributions to logic and psychology (see Russinoff 1999 for Ladd-Franklin's contributions to the algebra of logic), and the writings of Lady Victoria Welby (1837–1912) on meaning were widely read. Indeed, Peirce reviewed her What is Meaning?, together with Russell's Principles of Mathematics, in The Nation. (Dale 1996 discusses Welby's role in the development of the theory of meaning.) Later figures include the philosopher of science, Dorothy Wrinch (1894–1976), a Girton student who went on to study under Russell, and Susanne Langer (1895–1985), who wrote a dissertation under Alfred North Whitehead at Radcliff in 1926. Wrinch, who published papers in Mind on, among other things, the theory of relativity, later abandoned philosophy for chemistry, teaching for many years at Smith College. Langer, who later achieved prominence in the philosophy of art, published several technical articles on type theory and related topics early in her career (see, for example, Langer 1926, 1927). Possibly the most prominent woman analytic philosopher of the first half of the twentieth century, however, was another Girton student, L. Susan Stebbing (1885–1943), Professor of Philosophy at Bedford College, London, and co-founder of the journal Analysis. Stebbing, through her most successful student, Max Black, is responsible for one of the largest “families” in Josh Dever's Philosophy Family Tree (Dever 2006—see the Other Internet Resources).

Waithe (1995) is an important resource for research into these women, as well as numerous minor figures. On the larger question of the erasure of women from the history of philosophy, from antiquity to the French Revolution, Eileen O'Neill's essay, “Disappearing Ink” (O'Neill 1998), remains indispensable.


Primary Sources

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Works Discussing Jones

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Other Works Cited

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I would like to thank to Kenneth Blackwell, Rosalind Carey, Juliet Floyd, Nicholas Griffin, Kevin Klement and Consuelo Preti for their comments on an earlier draft of this entry. I would also like to acknowledge my debt to the pioneering work of Mary Ellen Waithe and Samantha Cicero, whose comprehensive and informed chapter on E. E. Constance Jones in Waithe (1995) first brought Jones to my attention.

Copyright © 2011 by
Gary Ostertag <gostertag@gc.cuny.edu>

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