Philosophy of Education

First published Mon Jun 2, 2008; substantive revision Thu Aug 15, 2013

All human societies, past and present, have had a vested interest in education; and some wits have claimed that teaching (at its best an educational activity) is the second oldest profession. While not all societies channel sufficient resources into support for educational activities and institutions, all at the very least acknowledge their centrality—and for good reasons. For one thing, it is obvious that children are born illiterate and innumerate, and ignorant of the norms and cultural achievements of the community or society into which they have been thrust; but with the help of professional teachers and the dedicated amateurs in their families and immediate environs (and with the aid, too, of educational resources made available through the media and nowadays the internet), within a few years they can read, write, calculate, and act (at least often) in culturally-appropriate ways. Some learn these skills with more facility than others, and so education also serves as a social-sorting mechanism and undoubtedly has enormous impact on the economic fate of the individual. Put more abstractly, at its best education equips individuals with the skills and substantive knowledge that allows them to define and to pursue their own goals, and also allows them to participate in the life of their community as full-fledged, autonomous citizens.

But this is to cast matters in very individualistic terms, and it is fruitful also to take a societal perspective, where the picture changes somewhat. It emerges that in pluralistic societies such as the Western democracies there are some groups that do not wholeheartedly support the development of autonomous individuals, for such folk can weaken a group from within by thinking for themselves and challenging communal norms and beliefs; from the point of view of groups whose survival is thus threatened, formal, state-provided education is not necessarily a good thing. But in other ways even these groups depend for their continuing survival on educational processes, as do the larger societies and nation-states of which they are part; for as John Dewey put it in the opening chapter of his classic work Democracy and Education (1916), in its broadest sense education is the means of the “social continuity of life” (Dewey 1916, 3). Dewey pointed out that the “primary ineluctable facts of the birth and death of each one of the constituent members in a social group” make education a necessity, for despite this biological inevitability “the life of the group goes on” (Dewey, 3). The great social importance of education is underscored, too, by the fact that when a society is shaken by a crisis, this often is taken as a sign of educational breakdown; education, and educators, become scapegoats.

It is not surprising that such an important social domain has attracted the attention of philosophers for thousands of years, especially as there are complex issues aplenty that have great philosophical interest. Even a cursory reading of these opening paragraphs reveals that they touch on, in nascent form, some but by no means all of the issues that have spawned vigorous debate down the ages; restated more explicitly in terms familiar to philosophers of education, the issues the discussion above flitted over were: education as transmission of knowledge versus education as the fostering of inquiry and reasoning skills that are conducive to the development of autonomy (which, roughly, is the tension between education as conservative and education as progressive and as an instrument of human liberation, which also is closely related to differing views about human “perfectibility”—issues that historically have been raised in debates concerning the aims of education); the question of what this knowledge, and what these skills, ought to be—part of the domain of philosophy of the curriculum; the questions of how learning is possible, and what is it to have learned something—two sets of issues that relate to the question of the capacities and potentialities that are present at birth, and also to the process (and stages) of human development and to what degree this process is flexible and hence can be influenced or manipulated; the tension between liberal education and vocational education, and the overlapping issue of which should be given priority—education for personal development or education for citizenship (and the issue of whether or not this is a false dichotomy); the differences (if any) between education and enculturation; the distinctions among educating versus teaching versus training versus indoctrination; the relation between education and maintenance of the class structure of society, and the issue of whether different classes or cultural groups can—justly—be given educational programs that differ in content or in aims; the issue of whether the rights of children, parents, and socio-cultural or ethnic groups, conflict—and if they do, the question of whose rights should be privileged; the question as to whether or not all children have a right to state-provided education, and if so, should this education respect the beliefs and customs of all groups and how on earth would this be accomplished; and a set of complex issues about the relation between education and social reform, centering upon whether education is essentially conservative, or whether it can and/or should be an (or, the) agent of social change and/or personal liberation. Perhaps the most fundamental issue is that concerning aims: What are the basic aims and ideals of the educational enterprise? What ought educators try to accomplish? It is worth noting that in the Western philosophical tradition at least, most of the major figures, with varying articulations and qualifications, regarded the fostering of reason or rationality as a fundamental educational aim. (Curren 2000, Scheffler 1973/1989, Siegel 1988, 1997, 2007)

It is impressive that most of the philosophically interesting issues touched upon above, plus additional ones not alluded to here, were addressed in one of the early masterpieces of the Western intellectual tradition—Plato's Republic. A.N. Whitehead somewhere remarked that the history of Western philosophy is nothing but a series of footnotes to Plato, and if the Meno and the Laws are added to the Republic, the same is true of the history of educational thought and of philosophy of education in particular. At various points throughout this essay the discussion shall return to Plato, and at the end there shall be a brief discussion of two other great figures in the field—Rousseau and Dewey. But the account of the field needs to start with some features of it that are apt to cause puzzlement, or that make describing its topography difficult. These include, but are not limited to, the interactions between philosophy of education and its parent discipline.

1. Problems in delineating the field

There is a large—and ever expanding—number of works designed to give guidance to the novice setting out to explore the domain of philosophy of education; most if not all of the academic publishing houses have at least one representative of this genre on their list, and the titles are mostly variants of the following archetypes: The History and Philosophy of Education, The Philosophical Foundations of Education, Philosophers on Education, Three Thousand Years of Educational Wisdom, A Guide to the Philosophy of Education, and Readings in Philosophy of Education. The overall picture that emerges from even a sampling of this collective is not pretty; the field lacks intellectual cohesion, and (from the perspective taken in this essay) there is a widespread problem concerning the rigor of the work and the depth of scholarship—although undoubtedly there are islands, but not continents, of competent philosophical discussion of difficult and socially important issues of the kind listed earlier. On the positive side—the obverse of the lack of cohesion—there is, in the field as a whole, a degree of adventurousness in the form of openness to ideas and radical approaches, a trait that is sometimes lacking in other academic fields.

Part of the explanation for this diffuse state of affairs is that, quite reasonably, many philosophers of education have the goal (reinforced by their institutional affiliation with Schools of Education and their involvement in the initial training of teachers) of contributing not to philosophy but to educational policy and practice. This shapes not only their selection of topics, but also the manner in which the discussion is pursued; and this orientation also explains why philosophers of education—to a far greater degree, it is to be suspected, than their “pure” cousins—publish not primarily in philosophy journals but in a wide range of professionally-oriented journals (such as Educational Researcher, Harvard Educational Review, Teachers College Record, Cambridge Journal of Education, Journal of Curriculum Studies, and the like). Some individuals work directly on issues of classroom practice, others identify as much with fields such as educational policy analysis, curriculum theory, teacher education, or some particular subject-matter domain such as math or science education, as they do with philosophy of education. It is still fashionable in some quarters to decry having one's intellectual agenda shaped so strongly as this by concerns emanating from a field of practice; but as Stokes (1997) has made clear, many of the great, theoretically fruitful research programs in natural science had their beginnings in such practical concerns—as Pasteur's groundbreaking work illustrates. It is dangerous to take the theory versus practice dichotomy too seriously.

However, there is another consequence of this institutional housing of the vast majority of philosophers of education that is worth noting—one that is not found in a comparable way in philosophers of science, for example, who almost always are located in departments of philosophy—namely, that experience as a teacher, or in some other education-related role, is a qualification to become a philosopher of education that in many cases is valued at least as much as depth of philosophical training. The issue is not that educational experience is irrelevant—clearly it can be highly pertinent—but it is that in the tradeoff with philosophical training, philosophy often loses. (And this is exacerbated by the absence of philosophy of education from the list of courses offered by many philosophy departments and of faculty members claiming it as an area of specialization or competence, so much so that far too many philosophy graduate students are unaware of the basic character of the subject or even that it constitutes a part of the parent discipline's portfolio [Siegel 2009b].) But there are still other factors at work that contribute to the field's diffuseness, that all relate in some way to the nature of the discipline of philosophy itself.

1.1 The open nature of philosophy and philosophy of education

In describing the field of philosophy, and in particular the sub-field of philosophy of education, one quickly runs into a difficulty not found to anything like the same degree in other disciplines. For example, although there are some internal differences in opinion, nevertheless there seems to be quite a high degree of consensus within the domain of quantum physics about which researchers are competent members of the field and which ones are not, and what work is a strong (or potential) contribution. The very nature of philosophy, on the other hand, is “essentially contested”; what counts as a sound philosophical work within one school of thought, or socio-cultural or academic setting, may not be so regarded (and may even be the focus of derision) in a different one. Coupled with this is the fact that the borders of the field are not policed, so that the philosophically untrained can cross into it freely—indeed, over the past century or more a great many individuals from across the spectrum of real and pseudo disciplines have for whatever reason exercised their right to self-identify as members of this broad and loosely defined category of “philosophers” (as a few minutes spent browsing in the relevant section of a bookstore or some of the less scholarly education journals will verify).

In essence, then, there are two senses of the term “philosopher” and its cognates: a loose but common sense in which any individual who cogitates in any manner about such issues as the meaning of life, the nature of social justice, the essence of sportsmanship, the aims of education, the foundations of the school curriculum, or relationship with the Divine, is thereby a philosopher; and a more technical sense referring to those who have been formally trained or have acquired competence in one or more areas such as epistemology, metaphysics, moral philosophy, logic, philosophy of science, and the like. If this bifurcation presents a problem for adequately delineating the field of philosophy, the difficulties grow tenfold or more with respect to philosophy of education.

This essay offers a description and assessment of the field as seen by scholars rooted firmly in the formal branch of “philosophy of education”, and moreover this branch as it has developed in the English-speaking world (which does not, of course, entirely rule out influences from Continental philosophy); but first it is necessary to say a little more about the difficulties that confront the individual who sets out, without presuppositions, to understand the topography of “philosophy of education”.

1.2 The different bodies of work traditionally included in the field

It will not take long for a person who consults several of the introductory texts alluded to earlier to encounter a number of different bodies of work that have by one source or another been regarded as part of the domain of philosophy of education; the inclusion of some of these as part of the field is largely responsible for the diffuse topography described earlier. What follows is an informal and incomplete accounting.

First, there are works of advocacy produced by those non-technical, self-identified “philosophers” described above, who often have an axe to grind; they may wish to destroy (or to save) common schooling, support or attack some innovation or reform, shore-up or destroy the capitalist mode of production, see their own religion (or none at all) gain a foothold in the public schools, strengthen the place of “the basics” in the school curriculum, and so forth. While these topics certainly can be, and have been, discussed with due care, often they have been pursued in loose but impressive language where exhortation substitutes for argumentation—and hence sometimes they are mistaken for works of philosophy of education. In the following discussion this genre shall be passed over in silence.

Second, there is a corpus of work somewhat resembling the first, but where the arguments are tighter, and where the authors usually are individuals of some distinction whose insights are thought-provoking—possibly because they have a degree of familiarity with some branch of educational activity, having been teachers, school principals, religious leaders, politicians, journalists, and the like. While these works frequently touch on philosophical issues, they are not pursued in any philosophical depth and can hardly be considered as contributions to the scholarship of the discipline. However, some works in this genre are among the classics of “educational thought”—a more felicitous label than “philosophy of education”; cases in point would be the essays, pamphlets and letters of Thomas Arnold (headmaster of Rugby school), John Wesley (the founder of Methodism), J.H. (Cardinal) Newman, T.H. Huxley, and the writings on progressive schooling by A.S. Neill (of Summerhill school). Some textbooks even include extracts from the writings or recorded sayings of such figures as Thomas Jefferson, Ben Franklin, and Jesus of Nazareth (for the latter three, in works spanning more than half a century, see Ulich 1950, and Murphy 2006). Books and extracts in this genre—which might be called “cultured reflection on education”—are often used in teacher-training courses that march under the banner of “educational foundations”, “introduction to educational thought”, or “introduction to philosophy of education”.

Third, there are a number of educational theorists and researchers whose field of activity is not philosophy but (for example) human development or learning theory, who in their technical work and sometimes in their non-technical books and reflective essays explicitly raise philosophical issues or adopt philosophical modes of argumentation—and do so in ways worthy of careful study. If philosophy (including philosophy of education) is defined so as to include analysis and reflection at an abstract or “meta-level”, which undoubtedly is a domain where many philosophers labor, then these individuals should have a place in the annals of philosophy or philosophy of education; but too often, although not always, accounts of the field ignore them. Their work might be subjected to scrutiny for being educationally important, but their conceptual or philosophical contributions are rarely focused upon. (Philosophers of the physical and biological sciences are far less prone to make this mistake about the meta-level work of reflective scientists in these domains.)

The educational theorists and researchers who are relevant as exemplars here are the behaviorist psychologist B.F. Skinner (who among other things wrote about the fate of the notions of human freedom and dignity in the light of the development of a “science of behavior”, and who developed a model of human action and also of learning that eschewed the influence of mental entities such as motives, interests, and ideas and placed the emphasis instead upon “schedules of reinforcement”); the foundational figure in modern developmental psychology with its near-fixation on stage theories, Jean Piaget (who developed in an abstract and detailed manner a “genetic epistemology” that was related to his developmental research); and the social psychologist Lev Vygotsky (who argued that the development of the human youngster was indelibly shaped by social forces, so much so that approaches which focused on the lone individual and that were biologically-oriented—he had Piaget in mind here—were quite inadequate).

Fourth, and in contrast to the group above, there is a type of work that is traditionally but undeservedly given a prominent place in the annals of philosophy of education, and which thereby generates a great deal of confusion and misunderstanding about the field. These are the books and reflective essays on educational topics that were written by mainstream philosophers, a number of whom are counted among the greatest in the history of the discipline. The catch is this: Even great philosophers do not always write philosophy! The reflections being referred to contain little if any philosophical argumentation, and usually they were not intended to be contributions to the literature on any of the great philosophical questions. Rather, they expressed the author's views (or even prejudices) on educational rather than philosophical problems, and sometimes—as in the case of Bertrand Russell's rollicking pieces defending progressive educational practices—they explicitly were “potboilers” written to make money. (In Russell's case the royalties were used to support a progressive school he was running with his then-current wife.) Locke, Kant, and Hegel also are among those who produced work of this genre. (It should be noted that Russell also made serious contributions to philosophy of education of the technical sort discussed below. Cf. Hare 1987.)

John Locke is an interesting case in point. He had been requested by a cousin and her husband—possibly in part because of his medical training—to give advice on the upbringing of their son and heir; the youngster seems to have troubled his parents, most likely because he had learning difficulties. Locke, then in exile in Europe, wrote the parents a series of letters in which alongside sensible advice about such matters as the priorities in the education of a landed gentleman, and about making learning fun for the boy, there were a few strange items such as the advice that the boy should wear leaky shoes in winter so that he would be toughened up! The letters eventually were printed in book form under the title Some Thoughts Concerning Education (1693), and seem to have had enormous influence down the ages upon educational practice; after two centuries the book had run through some 35 English editions and well over thirty foreign editions, and it is still in print and is frequently excerpted in books of readings in philosophy of education. In stark contrast, several of Locke's major philosophical writings—the Essay Concerning Human Understanding, and the Letter on Toleration—have been overlooked by most educational theorists over the centuries, even though they have enormous relevance for educational philosophy, theory, policy, and practice. It is especially noteworthy that the former of these books was the foundation for an approach to psychology—associationism—that thrived during the nineteenth century. In addition it stimulated interest in the processes of child development and human learning; Locke's model of the way in which the “blank tablet” of the human mind became “furnished” with simple ideas that were eventually combined or abstracted in various ways to form complex ideas suggested to some that it might be fruitful to study this process in the course of development of a young child (Cleverley and Phillips 1986).

Fifth, and finally, there is a large body of work that clearly falls within the more technically-defined domain of philosophy of education. Three historical giants of the field are Plato, Rousseau, and Dewey, and there are a dozen or more who would be in competition for inclusion along with them; the short-list of leading authors from the second-half of the 20th century would include Israel Scheffler, Richard Peters and Paul Hirst, with many jostling for the next places—but the choices become cloudy as we approach the present day, for schisms between philosophical schools have to be negotiated.

It is important to note, too, that there is a sub-category within this domain of literature that is made up of work by philosophers who are not primarily identified as philosophers of education, and who might or might not have had much to say directly about education, but whose philosophical work has been drawn upon by others and applied very fruitfully to educational issues. (A volume edited by Amelie Rorty contains essays on the education-related thought, or relevance, of many historically important philosophers; significantly the essays are written almost entirely by philosophers rather than by members of the philosophy of education community. This is both their strength and their weakness. See Rorty 1998.)

We turn next to the difficulty in picturing the topography of the field that is presented by the influence of the last-mentioned category of philosophers.

1.3 Paradigm wars? The diversity of, and clashes between, philosophical approaches

As sketched earlier, the domain of education is vast, the issues it raises are almost overwhelmingly numerous and are of great complexity, and the social significance of the field is second to none. These features make the phenomena and problems of education of great interest to a wide range of socially-concerned intellectuals, who bring with them their own favored conceptual frameworks—concepts, theories and ideologies, methods of analysis and argumentation, metaphysical and other assumptions, criteria for selecting evidence that has relevance for the problems that they consider central, and the like. No wonder educational discourse has occasionally been likened to Babel, for the differences in backgrounds and assumptions means that there is much mutual incomprehension. In the midst of the melee sit the philosophers of education.

It is no surprise, then, to find that the significant intellectual and social trends of the past few centuries, together with the significant developments in philosophy, all have had an impact on the content and methods of argument in philosophy of education—Marxism, psycho-analysis, existentialism, phenomenology, positivism, post-modernism, pragmatism, neo-liberalism, the several waves of feminism, analytic philosophy in both its ordinary language and more formal guises, are merely the tip of the iceberg. It is revealing to note some of the names that were heavily-cited in a pair of recent authoritative collections in the field (according to the indices of the two volumes, and in alphabetical order): Adorno, Aristotle, Derrida, Descartes, Dewey, Habermas, Hegel, Horkheimer, Kant, Locke, Lyotard, Marx, Mill, Nietzsche, Plato, Rawls, Richard Rorty, Rousseau, and Wittgenstein (Curren 2003; Blake, Smeyers, Smith, and Standish 2003). Although this list conveys something of the diversity of the field, it fails to do it complete justice, for the influence of feminist philosophers is not adequately represented.

No one individual can have mastered work done by such a range of figures, representing as they do a number of quite different frameworks or approaches; and relatedly no one person stands as emblematic of the entire field of philosophy of education, and no one type of philosophical writing serves as the norm, either. At professional meetings, peace often reigns because the adherents of the different schools go their separate ways; but occasionally there are (intellectually) violent clashes, rivaling the tumult that greeted Derrida's nomination for an honorary degree at Cambridge in 1992. It is sobering to reflect that only a few decades have passed since practitioners of analytic philosophy of education had to meet in individual hotel rooms, late at night, at annual meetings of the Philosophy of Education Society in the USA, because phenomenologists and others barred their access to the conference programs; their path to liberation was marked by discord until, eventually, the compromise of “live and let live” was worked out (Kaminsky 1993). Of course the situation has hardly been better in the home discipline; an essay in Time magazine in 1966 on the state of the discipline of philosophy reported that adherents of the major philosophical schools “don't even understand one another”, and added that as a result “philosophy today is bitterly segregated. Most of the major philosophy departments and scholarly journals are the exclusive property of one sect or another” (Time, reprinted in Lucas 1969, 32). Traditionally there has been a time lag for developments in philosophy to migrate over into philosophy of education, but in this respect at least the two fields have been on a par.

Inevitably, however, traces of discord remain, and some groups still feel disenfranchised, but they are not quite the same groups as a few decades ago—for new intellectual paradigms have come into existence, and their adherents struggle to have their voices heard; and clearly it is the case that—reflecting the situation in 1966—many analytically-trained philosophers of education find postmodern writings incomprehensible while scholars in the latter tradition are frequently dismissive if not contemptuous of work done by the former group. In effect, then, the passage of time has made the field more, not less, diffuse. All this is evident in a volume published in 1995 in which the editor attempted to break down borders by initiating dialogue between scholars with different approaches to philosophy of education; her introductory remarks are revealing:

Philosophers of education reflecting on the parameters of our field are faced not only with such perplexing and disruptive questions as: What counts as Philosophy of Education and why?; but also Who counts as a philosopher of education and why?; and What need is there for Philosophy of Education in a postmodern context? Embedded in these queries we find no less provocative ones: What knowledge, if any, can or should be privileged and why?; and Who is in a position to privilege particular discursive practices over others and why? Although such questions are disruptive, they offer the opportunity to take a fresh look at the nature and purposes of our work and, as we do, to expand the number and kinds of voices participating in the conversation. (Kohli 1995, xiv).

There is an inward-looking tone to the questions posed here: Philosophy of education should focus upon itself, upon its own contents, methods, and practitioners. And of course there is nothing new about this; for one thing, over forty years ago a collection of readings—with several score of entries—was published under the title What is Philosophy of Education? (Lucas 1969). It is worth noting, too, that the same attitude is not unknown in philosophy; Simmel is reputed to have said a century or so ago that philosophy is its own first problem.

Having described the general topography of the field of philosophy of education, the focus can change to pockets of activity where from the perspective of the present authors interesting philosophical work is being, or has been, done—and sometimes this work has been influential in the worlds of educational policy or practice. It is appropriate to start with a discussion of the rise and partial decline—but lasting influence of—analytic philosophy of education. This approach (often called “APE” by both admirers and detractors) dominated the field in the English-speaking world for several decades after the second world war, and its eventual fate throws light on the current intellectual climate.

2. Analytic philosophy of education, and its influence

Conceptual analysis, careful assessment of arguments, the rooting out of ambiguity, the drawing of clarifying distinctions—which make up at least part of the philosophical analysis package—have been respected activities within philosophy from the dawn of the field. Traditionally they have stood alongside other philosophical activities; in the Republic, for example, Plato was sometimes analytic, at other times normative, and on occasion speculative/metaphysical. (These overlap and intertwine, of course.) (Frankena 1956, cf. Frankena 1965a, 1965b.) Just as analytic techniques gained prominence and for a time hegemonic influence during and after the rise of analytic philosophy early in the 20th century, they came to dominate philosophy of education in the third quarter of that century (Curren, Robertson and Hager 2003).

2.1 The early work: C.D. Hardie

The pioneering work in the modern period entirely in an analytic mode was the short monograph by C.D. Hardie, Truth and Fallacy in Educational Theory (1941; reissued in 1962). In his Introduction, Hardie (who had studied with C.D. Broad and I.A. Richards) made it clear that he was putting all his eggs into the ordinary-language-analysis basket:

The Cambridge analytical school, led by Moore, Broad and Wittgenstein, has attempted so to analyse propositions that it will always be apparent whether the disagreement between philosophers is one concerning matters of fact, or is one concerning the use of words, or is, as is frequently the case, a purely emotive one. It is time, I think, that a similar attitude became common in the field of educational theory. (Hardie 1962, xix)

The first object of his analytic scrutiny in the book was the view that “a child should be educated according to Nature”; he teased apart and critiqued various things that writers through the ages could possibly have meant by this, and very little remained standing by the end of the chapter. Then some basic ideas of Herbart and Dewey were subjected to similar treatment. Hardie's hard-nosed approach can be illustrated by the following: One thing that educationists mean by “education according to Nature” (later he turns to other things they might mean) is that “the teacher should thus act like a gardener” who fosters the natural growth of his plants and avoids doing anything “unnatural” (Hardie 1962, 3). He continues:

The crucial question for such a view of education is how far does this analogy hold? There is no doubt that there is some analogy between the laws governing the physical development of the child and the laws governing the development of a plant, and hence there is some justification for the view if applied to physical education. But the educationists who hold this view are not generally very much concerned with physical education, and the view is certainly false if applied to mental education. For some of the laws that govern the mental changes which take place in a child are the laws of learning …. [which] have no analogy at all with the laws which govern the interaction between a seed and its environment. (Hardie 1962, 4)

2.2 The dominant years: language, and clarification of key concepts

About a decade after the end of the Second World War the floodgates opened and a stream of work in the analytic mode appeared; the following is merely a sample. D.J. O'Connor published An Introduction to Philosophy of Education (1957) in which, among other things, he argued that the word “theory” as it is used in educational contexts is merely a courtesy title, for educational theories are nothing like what bear this title in the natural sciences. Israel Scheffler, who became the paramount philosopher of education in North America, produced a number of important works including The Language of Education (1960), that contained clarifying and influential analyses of definitions (he distinguished reportive, stipulative, and programmatic types) and the logic of slogans (often these are literally meaningless, and should be seen as truncated arguments). (Cf. also Scheffler's Conditions of Knowledge (1965), still the best introduction to the epistemological side of philosophy of education, and his Reason and Teaching (1973/1989), which in a wide-ranging and influential series of essays makes the case for regarding the fostering of rationality/critical thinking as a fundamental educational ideal. Cf. Siegel 2001.) B.O. Smith and R.H. Ennis edited the volume Language and Concepts in Education (1961), and R.D. Archambault edited Philosophical Analysis and Education (1965), consisting of essays by a number of prominent British writers, most notably R.S. Peters (whose status in Britain paralleled that of Scheffler in the USA), Paul Hirst, and John Wilson. Topics covered in the Archambault volume were typical of those that became the “bread and butter” of analytic philosophy of education throughout the English-speaking world—education as a process of initiation, liberal education, the nature of knowledge, types of teaching, and instruction versus indoctrination.

Among the most influential products of APE was the analysis developed by Hirst and Peters (1970) and Peters (1973) of the concept of education itself. Using as a touchstone “normal English usage”, it was concluded that a person who has been educated (rather than instructed or indoctrinated) has been (i) changed for the better; (ii) this change has involved the acquisition of knowledge and intellectual skills, and the development of understanding; and (iii) the person has come to care for, or be committed to, the domains of knowledge and skill into which he or she has been initiated. The method used by Hirst and Peters comes across clearly in their handling of the analogy with the concept of “reform”, one they sometimes drew upon for expository purposes. A criminal who has been reformed has changed for the better, and has developed a commitment to the new mode of life (if one or other of these conditions does not hold, a speaker of standard English would not say the criminal has been reformed). Clearly the analogy with reform breaks down with respect to the knowledge and understanding conditions. Elsewhere Peters developed the fruitful notion of “education as initiation”.

The concept of indoctrination was also of great interest to analytic philosophers of education, for, it was argued, getting clear about precisely what constitutes indoctrination also would serve to clarify the border that demarcates it from acceptable educational processes. Unfortunately, ordinary language analysis did not produce unanimity of opinion about where this border was located, and rival analyses were put forward. Thus, whether or not an instructional episode was a case of indoctrination was determined by the content taught, the intention of the instructor, the methods of instruction that had been used, the outcomes of the instruction, or of course by some combination of these. (Snook 1972) The danger of restricting analysis to ordinary language (“normal English usage”) was recognized early on by Scheffler, whose preferred view of analysis emphasized

first, its greater sophistication as regards language, and the interpenetration of language and inquiry, second, its attempt to follow the modern example of the sciences in empirical spirit, in rigor, in attention to detail, in respect for alternatives, and in objectivity of method, and third, its use of techniques of symbolic logic brought to full development only in the last fifty years....It is...this union of scientific spirit and logical method applied toward the clarification of basic ideas that characterizes current analytic philosophy [and that ought to characterize analytic philosophy of education]. (Scheffler 1973/1989, pp. 9–10.)

2.3 Countervailing forces

After a period of dominance, for a number of important reasons the influence of APE went into decline. First, there were growing criticisms that the work of analytic philosophers of education had become focused upon minutiae and in the main was bereft of practical import. (It is worth noting that the 1966 article in Time, cited earlier, had put forward the same criticism of mainstream philosophy.) Second, in the early 1970's radical students in Britain accused the brand of linguistic analysis practiced by R.S. Peters of conservatism, and of tacitly giving support to “traditional values”—they raised the issue of whose English usage was being analyzed?

Third, criticisms of language analysis in mainstream philosophy had been mounting for some time, and finally after a lag of many years were reaching the attention of philosophers of education. There even had been a surprising degree of interest in this arcane topic on the part of the general reading public in the UK as early as 1959, when Gilbert Ryle, editor of the journal Mind, refused to commission a review of Ernest Gellner's Words and Things (1959)—a detailed and quite acerbic critique of Wittgenstein's philosophy and its espousal of ordinary language analysis. (Ryle argued that Gellner's book was too insulting, a view that drew Bertrand Russell into the fray on Gellner's side—in the daily press, no less; Russell produced examples of insulting remarks drawn from the work of great philosophers of the past. See Mehta 1963)

Richard Peters had been given warning that all was not well with APE at a conference in Canada in 1966; after delivering a paper on “The aims of education: A conceptual inquiry” that was based on ordinary language analysis, a philosopher in the audience (William Dray) asked Peters “whose concepts do we analyze?” Dray went on to suggest that different people, and different groups within society, have different concepts of education. Five years before the radical students raised the same issue, Dray pointed to the possibility that what Peters had presented under the guise of a “logical analysis” was nothing but the favored usage of a certain class of persons—a class that Peters happened to identify with. (See Peters 1973, where to the editor's credit the interaction with Dray is reprinted.)

Fourth, during the decade of the seventies when these various critiques of analytic philosophy were in the process of eroding its luster, a spate of translations from the Continent stimulated some philosophers of education in Britain and North America to set out in new directions and to adopt a new style of writing and argumentation. Key works by Gadamer, Foucault, and Derrida appeared in English, and these were followed in 1984 by Lyotard's The Postmodern Condition. The classic works of Heidegger and Husserl also found new admirers, and feminist philosophers of education were finding their voices—Maxine Greene published a number of important pieces in the 1970s and 1980s, including The Dialectic of Freedom (1988); the influential book by Nel Noddings, Caring: A Feminine Approach to Ethics and Moral Education, appeared the same year as the work by Lyotard, followed a year later by Jane Roland Martin's Reclaiming a Conversation. In more recent years all these trends have continued. APE was and is no longer the center of interest.

2.4 A new guise? Contemporary social, political and moral philosophy

By the 1980s, the rather simple if not simplistic ordinary language analysis practiced most often in philosophy of education was reeling under the attack from the combination of forces sketched above, but the analytic spirit lived on in the form of rigorous work done in other specialist areas of philosophy—work that trickled out and took philosophy of education in rich new directions. Technically-oriented epistemology, philosophy of science, and metaphysics flourished, as did the interrelated fields of social, political and moral philosophy. John Rawls published A Theory of Justice in 1971, a decade later Alasdair MacIntyre's After Virtue appeared, and in another decade or so there was a flood of work on individualism, communitarianism, democratic citizenship, inclusion, exclusion, the rights of children versus the rights of parents, and the rights of groups (such as the Amish) versus the rights of the larger polity. From the early 1990s philosophers of education have contributed significantly to the debates on these and related topics; indeed, this corpus of work illustrates that good philosophy of education flows seamlessly into work being done in mainstream areas of philosophy. Illustrative examples are Eamonn Callan's Creating Citizens: Political Education and Liberal Democracy (1997), Meira Levinson's The Demands of Liberal Education (1999), Harry Brighouse's Social Justice and School Choice (2000), and Rob Reich's Bridging Liberalism and Multiculturalism in American Education (2002). These works stand shoulder-to-shoulder with semi-classics on the same range of topics by Amy Gutmann (1999), Will Kymlicka (1995), Stephen Macedo (2000), and others. An excerpt from the book by Callan nicely illustrates that the analytic spirit lives on in this body of work; the broader topic being pursued is the status of the aims of education in a pluralistic society where there can be deep fundamental disagreements:

… the distinction must be underlined between the ends that properly inform political education and the extent to which we should tolerate deviations from those ends in a world where reasonable and unreasonable pluralism are entangled and the moral costs of coercion against the unreasonable variety are often prohibitive. Our theoretical as well as our commonsense discourse do not always respect the distinction…. If some of the teachings of the Roman Catholic Church conflict with our best theory of the ends of civic education, it does not follow that we have any reason to revise our theory; but neither does it mean we have any reason to impose these ends on Catholic schools and the families that they serve. (Callan 1997, 44)

Callan and White (2003) have offered an explanation of why the topics described above have become such a focus of attention. “What has been happening in philosophy of education in recent years”, they argue, mirrors “a wider self-examination in liberal societies themselves”. World events, from the fall of communism to the spread of ethnic conflicts “have all heightened consciousness of the contingency of liberal politics”. A body of work in philosophy, from the early Rawls on, has systematically examined (and critiqued) the foundations of liberalism, and philosophy of education has been drawn into the debates. Callan and White mention communitarianism as offering perhaps “the most influential challenge” to liberalism, and they write:

The debate between liberals and communitarians is far more than a theoretical diversion for philosophers and political scientists. At stake are rival understandings of what makes human lives and the societies in which they unfold both good and just, and derivatively, competing conceptions of the education needed for individual and social betterment. (Callan and White 2003, 95–96)

It should be appended here that it is not only “external” world events that have stimulated this body of work; events internal to a number of democratic societies also have been significant. To cite one example that is prominent in the literature in North America at least, the US Supreme Court issued a ruling (Wisconsin v. Yoder) in which members of the Amish sect were allowed to withdraw their children from public schools after the eighth grade—for, it had been argued, any deeper education would endanger the existence of the group and its culture. In assessing this decision—as of course philosophers have frequently done (see, for example, Kymlicka 1995)—a balance has to be achieved between (i) the interest of civic society in having an informed, well-educated, participatory citizenry; (ii) the interest of the Amish as a group in preserving their own culture; and (iii) the interests of the Amish children, who (according to some at least) have a right to develop into autonomous individuals who can make reflective decisions for themselves about the nature of the life they wish to lead. These are issues that fall squarely in the domain covered by the works mentioned above.

The quantity, variety and quality of work being produced on the complex and interrelated issues just outlined amounts to a veritable cottage industry of post-Rawlsian philosophy of education. There are, of course, other areas of activity where interesting contributions are being made, and the discussion will next turn to a sampling of these.

3. Other areas of contemporary activity

As was stressed at the outset, the field of education is huge and contains within it a virtually inexhaustible number of issues that are of philosophical interest. To attempt comprehensive coverage of how philosophers of education have been working within this thicket would be a quixotic task for a large single volume and is out of the question for a solitary encyclopedia entry. Nevertheless, a valiant attempt to give an overview was made in the recent A Companion to the Philosophy of Education (Curren 2003), which contained more than six-hundred pages divided into forty-five chapters each of which surveyed a subfield of work. The following random selection of chapter topics gives a sense of the enormous scope of the field: Sex education, special education, science education, aesthetic education, theories of teaching and learning, religious education, knowledge, truth and learning, cultivating reason, the measurement of learning, multicultural education, education and the politics of identity, education and standards of living, motivation and classroom management, feminism, critical theory, postmodernism, romanticism, the purposes of universities, affirmative action in higher education, and professional education. The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Education (Siegel 2009a) contains a similarly broad range of articles on (among other things) the epistemic and moral aims of education, liberal education and its imminent demise, thinking and reasoning, fallibilism and fallibility, indoctrination, authenticity, the development of rationality, Socratic teaching, educating the imagination, caring and empathy in moral education, the limits of moral education, the cultivation of character, values education, curriculum and the value of knowledge, education and democracy, art and education, science education and religious toleration, constructivism and scientific methods, multicultural education, prejudice, authority and the interests of children, and on pragmatist, feminist, and postmodernist approaches to philosophy of education.

Given this enormous range, there is no non-arbitrary way to select a small number of topics for further discussion, nor can the topics that are chosen be pursued in great depth. The choice of those below has been made with an eye to filling out and deepening the topographical account of the field that was presented in the preceding sections. The discussion will open with a topic of great moment across the academic educational community, one concerning which adherents of some of the rival schools of philosophy (and philosophy of education) have had lively exchanges.

3.1 Philosophical disputes concerning empirical education research

The educational research enterprise has been criticized for a century or more by politicians, policymakers, administrators, curriculum developers, teachers, philosophers of education, and by researchers themselves—but the criticisms have been contradictory. Charges of being “too ivory tower and theory-oriented” are found alongside “too focused on practice and too atheoretical”; but particularly since publication of the book by Stokes mentioned earlier, and also in light of the views of John Dewey and William James that the function of theory is to guide intelligent practice and problem-solving, it is becoming more fashionable to hold that the “theory v. practice” dichotomy is a false one. (For an illuminating account of the historical development of educational research and its tribulations, see Lagemann 2000.)

A similar trend can be discerned with respect to the long warfare between two rival groups of research methods—on one hand quantitative/statistical approaches to research, and on the other hand the qualitative/ethnographic family. (The choice of labels here is not entirely risk-free, for they have been contested; furthermore the first approach is quite often associated with “experimental” studies, and the latter with “case studies”, but this is an over-simplification.) For several decades these two rival methodological camps were treated by researchers and a few philosophers of education as being rival paradigms (Kuhn's ideas, albeit in a very loose form, have been influential in the field of educational research), and the dispute between them was commonly referred to as “the paradigm wars”. In essence the issue at stake was epistemological: members of the quantitative/experimental camp believed that only their methods could lead to well-warranted knowledge claims, especially about the causal factors at play in educational phenomena, and on the whole they regarded qualitative methods as lacking in rigor; on the other hand the adherents of qualitative/ethnographic approaches held that the other camp was too “positivistic” and was operating with an inadequate view of causation in human affairs—one that ignored the role of motives and reasons, possession of relevant background knowledge, awareness of cultural norms, and the like. Few if any commentators in the “paradigm wars” suggested that there was anything prohibiting the use of both approaches in the one research program—provided that if both were used, they only were used sequentially or in parallel, for they were underwritten by different epistemologies and hence could not be blended together. But recently the trend has been towards rapprochement, towards the view that the two methodological families are, in fact, compatible and are not at all like paradigms in the Kuhnian sense(s) of the term; the melding of the two approaches is often called “mixed methods research”, and is growing in popularity. (For more detailed discussion of these “wars” see Howe 2003 and Phillips 2009.)

The most lively contemporary debates about education research, however, were set in motion around the turn of the millennium when the US Federal Government moved in the direction of funding only rigorously scientific educational research—the kind that could establish causal factors which could then guide the development of practically effective policies. (It was held that such a causal knowledge base was available for medical decisionmaking.) The definition of “rigorously scientific”, however, was decided by politicians and not by the research community, and it was given in terms of the use of a specific research method—the net effect being that the only research projects to receive Federal funding (until this policy was reversed by the new Obama administration) were those that carried out randomized controlled experiments or field trials (RFTs). It has become common over the last decade to refer to the RFT as the “gold standard” methodology.

The National Research Council (NRC)—an arm of the U.S. National Academies of Science—issued a report, influenced by postpostivistic philosophy of science (NRC 2002), that argued that this criterion was far too narrow. Numerous essays have appeared subsequently that point out how the “gold standard” account of scientific rigor distorts the history of science, how the complex nature of the relation between evidence and policy-making has been distorted and made to appear overly simple (for instance the role of value judgments in linking empirical findings to policy directives is often overlooked), and qualitative researchers have insisted upon the scientific nature of their work.

Nevertheless, and possibly because it tried to be balanced and supported the use of RFTs in some research contexts, the NRC report has been the subject of symposia in four journals, where it has been supported by a few and attacked from a variety of philosophical fronts: Its authors were positivists, they erroneously believed that educational inquiry could be value neutral and that it could ignore the ways in which the exercise of power constrains the research process, they misunderstood the nature of educational phenomena, they were guilty of advocating “your father's paradigm”. This last critic asserted that educational research should move “toward a Nietzschean sort of ‘unnatural science’ that leads to greater health by fostering ways of knowing that escape normativity” (Lather 2004, p. 27)—a suggestion that evokes the reaction discussed in Section 1.3 above, namely, one of incomprehension on the part of most researchers and those philosophers of education who work within a different tradition where a “way of knowing”, in order to be a way of knowing, must inevitably be normative.

The final complexity in the debates over the nature of educational research is that there are some respected members of the philosophy of education community who claim, along with Carr, that “the forms of human association characteristic of educational engagement are not really apt for scientific or empirical study at all” (Carr 2003, 54–5). His reasoning is that educational processes cannot be studied empirically because they are processes of “normative initiation”—a position that as it stands begs the question by not making clear why such processes cannot be studied empirically. (For a more thorough treatment of the philosophical controversies concerning empirical educational research cf. Phillips 2009.)

3.2 The content of the curriculum, and the aims and functions of schooling

The issue of what should be taught to students at all levels of education—the issue of curriculum content—obviously is a fundamental one, and it is an extraordinarily difficult one with which to grapple. In tackling it, care needs to be taken to distinguish between education and schooling—for although education can occur in schools, so can mis-education, and many other things can take place there that are educationally orthogonal (such as the provision of free or subsidized lunches, or the development of social networks); and it also must be recognized that education can occur in the home, in libraries and museums, in churches and clubs, in solitary interaction with the public media, and the like.

In developing a curriculum (whether in a specific subject area, or more broadly as the whole range of offerings in an educational institution or system), a number of difficult decisions need to be made. Issues such as the proper ordering or sequencing of topics in the chosen subject, the time to be allocated to each topic, the lab work or excursions or projects that are appropriate for particular topics, can all be regarded as technical issues best resolved either by educationists who have a depth of experience with the target age group or by experts in the psychology of learning. But there are deeper issues, ones concerning the validity of the justifications that have been given for including particular subjects or topics in the offerings of formal educational institutions. (Why should evolution be included, or excluded, as a topic within the standard high school subject Biology? Is the justification that is given for teaching Economics in some schools coherent and convincing? Does the justification for not including the Holocaust or the phenomenon of wartime atrocities in the curriculum in some countries stand up to critical scrutiny?)

The different justifications for particular items of curriculum content that have been put forward by philosophers and others since Plato's pioneering efforts all draw, explicitly or implicitly, upon the positions that the respective theorists hold about at least three sets of issues. First, what are the aims and/or functions of education (aims and functions are not necessarily the same)? Alternatively, as Aristotle asked, what constitutes the good life and/or human flourishing, such that education should foster these? (Curren, forthcoming) These two formulations are related, for it is arguable that our educational institutions should aim to equip individuals to pursue this good life—although this is not obvious, both because it is not clear that that there is one conception of the good or flourishing life that is the good or flourishing life for everyone, and it is not clear that this is a question that should be settled in advance rather than determined by students for themselves. Thus, for example, if our view of human flourishing includes the capacity to act rationally and/or autonomously, then the case can be made that educational institutions—and their curricula—should aim to prepare, or help to prepare, autonomous individuals. A rival approach, associated with Kant, champions the educational fostering of autonomy not on the basis of its contribution to human flourishing, but rather the obligation to treat students with respect as persons. (Scheffler 1973/1989, Siegel 1988) Still others urge the fostering of autonomy on the basis of students' fundamental interests, in ways that draw upon both Aristotelian and Kantian conceptual resources. (Brighouse 2006, 2009) How students should be helped to become autonomous or develop a conception of the good life and pursue it is of course not immediately obvious, and much philosophical ink has been spilled on the matter. One influential line of argument was developed by Paul Hirst, who argued that knowledge is essential for developing and then pursuing a conception of the good life, and because logical analysis shows, he argued, that there are seven basic forms of knowledge, the case can be made that the function of the curriculum is to introduce students to each of these forms. (Hirst 1965; for a critique see Phillips 1987, ch.11.) Another is that curriculum content should be selected so as “to help the learner attain maximum self-sufficiency as economically as possible.” (Scheffler 1973/1989, p. 123)

Second, is it justifiable to treat the curriculum of an educational institution as a vehicle for furthering the socio-political interests and goals of a ruler or ruling class; and relatedly, is it justifiable to design the curriculum so that it serves as a medium of control or of social engineering? In the closing decades of the twentieth century there were numerous discussions of curriculum theory, particularly from Marxist and postmodern perspectives, that offered the sobering analysis that in many educational systems, including those in Western democracies, the curriculum does indeed reflect and serve the interests of the ruling class. Michael Apple is typical:

… the knowledge that now gets into schools is already a choice from a much larger universe of possible social knowledge and principles. It is a form of cultural capital that comes from somewhere, that often reflects the perspectives and beliefs of powerful segments of our social collectivity. In its very production and dissemination as a public and economic commodity—as books, films, materials, and so forth—it is repeatedly filtered through ideological and economic commitments. Social and economic values, hence, are already embedded in the design of the institutions we work in, in the ‘formal corpus of school knowledge’ we preserve in our curricula…. (Apple 1990, 8–9)

Third, should educational programs at the elementary and secondary levels be made up of a number of disparate offerings, so that individuals with different interests and abilities and affinities for learning can pursue curricula that are suitable? Or should every student pursue the same curriculum as far as each is able—a curriculum, it should be noted, that in past cases nearly always was based on the needs or interests of those students who were academically inclined or were destined for elite social roles. Mortimer Adler and others in the late twentieth century sometimes used the aphorism “the best education for the best is the best education for all”.

The thinking here can be explicated in terms of the analogy of an out-of-control virulent disease, for which there is only one type of medicine available; taking a large dose of this medicine is extremely beneficial, and the hope is that taking only a little—while less effective—is better than taking none at all. Medically, this is dubious, while the educational version—forcing students to work, until they exit the system, on topics that do not interest them and for which they have no facility or motivation—has even less merit. (For a critique of Adler and his Paideia Proposal, see Noddings 2011.) It is interesting to compare the modern “one curriculum track for all” position with Plato's system outlined in the Republic, according to which all students—and importantly this included girls—set out on the same course of study. Over time, as they moved up the educational ladder it would become obvious that some had reached the limit imposed upon them by nature, and they would be directed off into appropriate social roles in which they would find fulfillment, for their abilities would match the demands of these roles. Those who continued on with their education would eventually be able to contemplate the metaphysical realm of the “forms”, thanks to their advanced training in mathematics and philosophy. Having seen the form of the Good, they would be eligible after a period of practical experience to become members of the ruling class of Guardians.

3.3 Social Epistemology

Related to the issues concerning the aims and functions of education and schooling just rehearsed are those involving the specifically epistemic aims of education and attendant issues treated by social epistemologists. There is, first, a lively debate concerning putative epistemic aims, whether truth (or knowledge understood in the “weak” sense of true belief) (Goldman 1999), critical thinking or rationality and rational belief (or knowledge in the “strong” sense that includes justification) (Scheffler 1973/1989, Siegel 1988, 1997, 2005), or understanding (Elgin 1999, 1999a). Next is controversy concerning the places of testimony and trust in the classroom: In what circumstances if any ought students to trust their teachers' pronouncements, and why? Related are questions concerning indoctrination : How if at all does it differ from legitimate teaching? Is it inevitable, and if so is it not always or necessarily bad? Additionally there are traditional epistemological worries concerning absolutism and relativism with respect to knowledge, truth and justification as these relate to what is taught, with more recent worries concerning the character and status of group epistemologies and the prospects for understanding such epistemic goods “universalistically” in the face of some feminist, multiculturalist and postmodernist challenges adding newer dimensions to the more familiar mix. (There is more here than can be briefly summarized; for more systematic treatment cf. Robertson 2009 and Siegel 2004.)

3.4 Rousseau, Dewey, and the progressive movement

Plato's educational scheme was guided, presumably, by the understanding he thought he had achieved of the transcendental realm of fixed “forms”. Dewey, ever a strong critic of positions that were not naturalistic or that incorporated a priori premises, commented as follows:

Plato's starting point is that the organization of society depends ultimately upon knowledge of the end of existence. If we do not know its end, we shall be at the mercy of accident and caprice…. And only those who have rightly trained minds will be able to recognize the end, and ordering principle of things. (Dewey 1916, 102–3)

Furthermore, as Dewey again put it, Plato “had no perception of the uniqueness of individuals…. they fall by nature into classes”, which masks the “infinite diversity of active tendencies” which individuals harbor (104). In addition, Plato tended to talk of learning using the passive language of seeing, which has shaped our discourse down to the present.

In contrast, for Dewey each individual was an organism situated in a biological and social environment in which problems were constantly emerging, forcing the individual to reflect, act, and learn. Dewey, following William James, held that knowledge arises from reflection upon our actions and that the worth of a putative item of knowledge is directly correlated with the problem-solving success of the actions performed under its guidance. Thus Dewey, sharply disagreeing with Plato, regarded knowing as an active rather than a passive affair—a strong theme in his writings is his opposition to what is sometimes called “the spectator theory of knowledge”. All this is made clear enough in a passage containing only a thinly-veiled allusion to Plato's famous allegory of the prisoners in the cave whose eyes are turned to the light by education:

In schools, those under instruction are too customarily looked upon as acquiring knowledge as theoretical spectators, minds which appropriate knowledge by direct energy of intellect. The very word pupil has almost come to mean one who is engaged not in having fruitful experiences but in absorbing knowledge directly. Something which is called mind or consciousness is severed from the physical organs of activity. (164)

It is easy to see here the tight link between Dewey's epistemology and his views on education—his anti-spectator epistemology morphs directly into advocacy for anti-spectator learning by students in school—students learn by being active inquirers. Over the past few decades this view of learning has inspired a major tradition of research by educational psychologists, and related theory-development (the “situated cognition” framework); and these bodies of work have in turn led to innovative efforts in curriculum development. (Phillips 2003.)

The final important difference with Plato is that, for Dewey, each student is an individual who blazes his or her unique trail of growth; the teacher has the task of guiding and facilitating this growth, without imposing a fixed end upon the process. Dewey sometimes uses the term “curriculum” to mean “the funded wisdom of the human race”, the point being that over the course of human history an enormous stock of knowledge and skills has accumulated and the teacher has the task of helping the student to make contact with this repertoire—but helping by facilitating rather than by imposing. (All this, of course, has been the subject of intense discussion among philosophers of education: Does growth imply a direction? Is growth always good—can't a plant end up misshapen, and can't a child develop to become bad? Is Dewey some type of perfectionist? Is his philosophy too vague to offer worthwhile educational guidance? Isn't it possible for a “Deweyan” student to end up without enough relevant knowledge and skills to be able to make a living in the modern world?)

Dewey's work was of central importance for the American progressive education movement in its formative years, although there was a fair degree of misunderstanding of his ideas as progressives interpreted his often extremely dense prose to be saying what they personally happened to believe. Nevertheless, for better or worse, Dewey became the “poster child” of progressive education.

His popularity, however, sharply declined after the Soviets launched Sputnik, for Dewey and progressive education were blamed for the USA losing the race into space (illustrating the point about scapegoating made earlier). But he did not remain in disgrace for long and for some time has been the focus of renewed interest—although it is still noticeable that commentators interpret Dewey to be holding views that mirror their own positions or interests. And interestingly, there now is slightly more interest in Dewey on the part of philosophers of education in the UK than there was in earlier years, and there is growing interest by philosophers from the Continent (see, for example, Biesta and Burbules 2003).

To be the poster child for progressivism, however, is not to be the parent. That honor must go to Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and to his educational novel written in soaring prose, Emile (first published in 1762). Starting with the premise that “God makes all things good; man meddles with them and they become evil” (Rousseau 1955, 5), Rousseau held that contemporary man has been misshapen by his education; the “crushing force” of social conventions has stifled the “Nature within him”. The remedy adopted in the novel is for the young Emile to be taken to his family estate in the country where, away from the corrupting influence of society and under the watchful eye of his tutor, “everything should … be brought into harmony with these natural tendencies”. (This idea of education according to nature, it will be recalled, was the object of Hardie's analytic attention almost two centuries later.)

Out in the countryside, rather than having a set curriculum that he is forced to follow, Emile learns when some natural stimulus or innate interest motivates him—and under these conditions learning comes easily. He is allowed to suffer the natural consequences of his actions (if he breaks a window, he gets cold; if he takes the gardener's property, the gardener will no longer do him favors), and experiences such as these lead to the development of his moral system. Although Rousseau never intended these educational details to be taken literally as a blueprint (he saw himself as developing and illustrating the basic principles), over the ages there have been attempts to implement them, one being the famous British “free school”, A.S. Neill's Summerhill (cf. Neill 1960). (It is worth noting that Neill claimed not to have read Rousseau, but he was working in a milieu in which Rousseau's ideas were well-known.) Furthermore, over the ages these principles also have proven to be fertile soil for philosophers of education to till.

Even more fertile ground for comment, in recent years, has been Rousseau's proposal for the education of girls, developed in a section of the novel (Book V) that bears the name of the young woman who is destined to be Emile's soul-mate, Sophie. The puzzle has been why Rousseau—who had been so far-sighted in his discussion of Emile's education—was so hide-bound if not retrograde in his thinking about her education. One short quotation is sufficient to illustrate the problem: “If woman is made to please and to be in subjection to man, she ought to make herself pleasing in his eyes and not provoke him …her strength is in her charms” (324). Not surprisingly, feminist philosophers of education have been in the vanguard of the critique of this position (Martin 1985).

The educational principles developed by Rousseau and Dewey, and numerous educational theorists and philosophers in the interregnum, are alive and well in the twenty-first century. Of particular contemporary interest is the evolution that has occurred of the progressive idea that each student is an active learner who is pursuing his or her own individual educational path. By incorporating elements of the classical empiricist epistemology of John Locke, this progressive principle has become transformed into the extremely popular position known as constructivism, according to which each student in a classroom constructs his or her own individual body of understandings even when all in the group are given what appears to be the same stimulus or educational experience. (A consequence of this is that a classroom of thirty students will have thirty individually-constructed, and possibly different, bodies of “knowledge”, in addition to that of the teacher.) There is also a solipsistic element here, for constructivists also believe that none of us—teachers included—can directly access the bodies of understandings of anyone else; each of us is imprisoned in a world of our own making. It is an understatement to say that this poses great difficulties for the teacher. The education journals of the past two decades contain many thousands of references to discussions of this position, which has become a type of educational “secular religion”; for reasons that are hard to discern it is particularly influential in mathematics and science education. (For a discussion of the underlying philosophical ideas in constructivism, and for an account of some of its varieties and flaws, see the essays in Phillips (ed. 2000.)

4. Concluding remarks

As stressed earlier, it is impossible to do justice to the whole field of philosophy of education in a single encyclopedia entry. Different countries around the world have their own intellectual traditions and their own ways of institutionalizing philosophy of education in the academic universe, and no discussion of any of this appears in the present essay. But even in the Anglo-American world there is such a diversity of approaches to the discipline that any author attempting to produce a synoptic account will quickly run into the borders of his or her competence. Clearly this has happened in the present case.

Fortunately, in the last twenty years or so resources have become available that significantly alleviate these problems. There has been a flood of encyclopedia entries, commenting on the field as a whole or on many specific topics not well covered in the present essay (see, as a sample, Burbules 1994, Chambliss 1996, Curren 1998, 1998a, Phillips 1985, 2010, Siegel 2007, Smeyers 1994), an “Encyclopedia” (Chambliss 1996a), a “Guide” (Blake, Smeyers, Smith and Standish 2003), a “Companion” (Curren 2003), two “Handbooks” (Siegel 2009a, Bailey, Barrow, Carr and McCarthy 2010), a comprehensive anthology (Curren 2007), a dictionary of key concepts in the field (Winch and Gingell 1999), and a good textbook or two (Carr 2003, Noddings 2011). In addition there are numerous volumes both of reprinted selections and of specially commissioned essays on specific topics, some of which were given short shrift in the present work (for another sampling see A. Rorty 1998, Stone 1994), and several international journals, including Theory and Research in Education, Journal of Philosophy of Education, Educational Theory, Studies in Philosophy and Education, and Educational Philosophy and Theory. Thus there is more than enough material available to keep the interested reader busy.


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