Dreams and Dreaming

First published Thu Apr 9, 2015

Dreams and dreaming have been topics of philosophical inquiry since antiquity. Historically, the topic of dreaming has mostly been discussed in the context of external world skepticism. As famously suggested by Descartes, dreams pose a threat towards knowledge because it seems impossible to rule out, at any given moment, that one is now dreaming. Since the 20th century, philosophical interest in dreaming has increasingly shifted towards questions related to philosophy of mind. What exactly does it mean to say that dreams are conscious experiences during sleep? Do dreams have duration, or are they the product of instantaneous memory insertion at the moment of awakening? Should dreams be described as hallucinations or illusions occurring in sleep, or should they rather be described as imaginative experiences? Do dreams involve real beliefs? And what is the relationship between dreaming and self-consciousness?

This entry provides an overview of the main themes in the philosophical discussion on sleep and dreaming and emphasizes the connection between issues from different areas of philosophy. Because recent philosophical work on dreaming has taken on a distinctly interdisciplinary flavor, this entry also includes pointers to the relevant scientific literature and gives several examples of how evidence from scientific sleep and dream research has informed the philosophical debate, and vice versa.

1. Dreams and epistemology

1.1 Cartesian dream skepticism

The most famous and most widely discussed philosophical problem raised by dreaming is whether dreams pose a threat towards our knowledge of the external world (see Williams 1978; Stroud 1984; Newman 2010; Klein 2014). Descartes illustrates the problem in a particularly compelling manner in the Meditations, where he uses the dream example to motivate skepticism about sensory-based beliefs about the external world, including his own bodily existence. Dreams are clearly not the only case in which sensory experience can lead us astray; familiar cases of sensory illusions show that perception is not always reliable. Yet, as Descartes notes, these cases are too easily avoided to raise general doubts about the reliability of sensory perception. The same is not true, however, for dreaming. Dreams suggest that even in a best-case scenario of sensory perception (Stroud 1984), in which standard cases of misperception (as in seeing very small or faraway objects as too big or too small) can be ruled out and which consequently seem indubitably certain (Descartes 1641: I.6), sensory deception is possible. Even Descartes’ realistic experience of sitting dressed by the fire and looking at a piece of paper in his hands (Descartes 1641: I.5) could be nothing but a dream.

There are different ways of construing the dream argument. A particularly drastic claim would be that Descartes might conceivably be trapped in a lifelong dream in the sense that none of his experiences, including his waking experiences, have ever been caused by external objects (Newman 2010 calls this the Always Dreaming Doubt). A weaker claim is that while he is not always dreaming, he cannot rule out, at any given moment, that he is now dreaming (the Now Dreaming Doubt; for a fuller discussion of both versions, see Newman 2010). This weaker claim is still epistemologically damaging: even though some of his sensory-based beliefs might be true, the possibility that he might now be dreaming renders him unable to distinguish his true beliefs from those that are false. His doubt thus prevents him from possessing sensory-based knowledge about the world.

The general form of Cartesian-style skeptical arguments can be reconstructed as follows (this standard reconstruction is quoted from Klein 2014):

  1. If I know that p, then there are no genuine grounds for doubting that p.
  2. U is a genuine ground for doubting that p.
  3. Therefore, I do not know that p.

If we apply this to the case of dreaming, we get:

  1. If I know that I am sitting dressed by the fire, then there are no genuine grounds for doubting that I am really sitting dressed by the fire.
  2. If I were now dreaming, this would be a genuine ground for doubting that I am sitting dressed by the fire: in dreams, I have often had the realistic experience of sitting dressed by the fire when I have actually been lying undressed in bed!
  3. Therefore, I do not know that I am now sitting dressed by the fire.

It is also important to see what the dream argument does not do. In particular, the dream argument casts doubt only on sensory-based beliefs about the external world—of which Descartes’ belief that he is sitting dressed by the fire is a particularly clear example. At the same time, however, Descartes insists that truths of a very general kind, which are not based on sensory perception and do not concern actual existence (such as that 2+3=5 or that a square has no more than 4 sides), are knowable even if he is now dreaming:

although, in truth, I should be dreaming, the rule still holds that all which is clearly presented to my intellect is indisputably true. (Descartes 1641: V.15)

Even in dreams, the evidence of reason, or so Descartes would have it, is trustworthy. Consequently, dreams do not undermine our ability to engage in the project of rational inquiry (Frankfurt 1970; but see Broughton 2002), and the possibility of dream deception is limited to sensory-based beliefs.

1.2 Earlier discussions of dream skepticism

Dream arguments have been a staple of philosophical skepticism since antiquity and in fact were so well known in the 17th century that in his objections to the Meditations, Hobbes (1641) criticized Descartes for not having come up with a more original argument and boring the reader with the all-too-familiar scenario of dream deception. Yet, it is has been Descartes’ version of the problem that has been most prominent in the philosophical discussion.

A first reason is that Descartes’ version of the problem sets the dream argument apart from other related skeptical arguments: unlike standard cases of sensory misperception, dreaming raises genuine doubts about the veracity of even best-case scenarios of sensory perception, and unlike the evil genius hypothesis (see next section), dreaming is cast as a real-world (and not a merely hypothetical) example of sensory deception. By contrast, many who discussed the dream example before him did not take the epistemological threat posed by dreaming to be unique. In the Theaetetus (157e), Plato has Socrates discuss a defect in perception that is common to

dreams and diseases, including insanity, and everything else that is said to cause illusions of sight and hearing and the other senses,

concluding that knowledge cannot be defined in terms of perception (see Chappell 2013). By contrast, Descartes thought that dreams pose a more serious threat to sensory-based knowledge than (avoidable) cases of sensory illusions. He also thought that dreams leave our ability to engage in rational inquiry intact, thus setting them apart from insanity and delusions. Dreams also appear in the canon of standard arguments (or modes) used by the Pyrrhonists to counter any knowledge claims, with the fourth of these arguments stating that the deliverances of the senses vary in different conditions such as health, illness, sleep, waking, joy or sorrow and hence are not to be trusted (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers; Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism). Augustine (Against the Academics; Confessions) acknowledges the dream problem, but tries to contain it by arguing that even if we are deceived while dreaming, we can at least distinguish dreams and illusions from actual perception retrospectively (see Matthew 2005: chapter 8 for discussion). And Montaigne (The Apology for Raymond Sebond), alluding to a variety of sensory illusions, notes that wakefulness itself is infested by reveries, which in some sense are a worse epistemological threat than nocturnal dreams. On this view, dream deception is no longer set apart even from standard wake states, but rather is used in a metaphorical sense referring to any type of sensory deception.

But there is another reason why Descartes’ version of the problem has been particularly influential. This has to do with the unique style of the Meditations. As Frankfurt (1970) points out, the first-person narrator of the Meditations is an everyman, whose epistemic situation is in no way idiosyncratic (as would be the case if he were insane), but rather representative of the typical defects of any human mind. The intimate tone of the Meditations fits Descartes’ strategy of starting out from commonsense arguments and gradually working towards a more refined philosophical position (Frankfurt 1970: 5), thereby enhancing their psychological effect on the reader. The dream argument is a compelling example of this. By first inviting the reader to consider the apparent indubitability of best-case scenarios of sensory deception and then using the dream of sitting by the fire to shatter this certainty, Descartes is appealing to his readers’ imagination and previous experience and assuming that they, like him, will have had many such dreams themselves.

Finally, much attention has been devoted to several dreams Descartes reportedly had as a young man and that according to his biographer Adrien Baillet (1691) embodied the theoretical doubts and the project of pure inquiry he later developed in the Discourse and Meditations (see also Leibniz 1880: IV; Cole 1992; Keefer 1996). Based on his reading of the dreams, Hacking even suggests that for Descartes, dream-skepticism was “a live skepticism […], that is, not a mere philosophical position, but genuine doubt” (Hacking 2001: 252). Prominent researchers such as Freud (1940) and Rechtschaffen (personal communication, quoted in Cole 1992: 213) have attested to the authenticity of Descartes’ dreams, but others have argued that the reports might be fabricated (Clarke 2006: 58–66, Browne 1977).

1.3 Dreaming and other skeptical scenarios

The inherent appeal to empirical plausibility is also what sets Cartesian dream skepticism apart from alternative versions of external-world skepticism such as the evil genius hypothesis, the brain-in-a-vat thought experiment and Matrix-style scenarios of deception. The first of these is introduced by Descartes in the First Meditation. After discussing the dream argument, Descartes introduces the possibility of an omnipotent but evil genius determined to deceive us even in our most basic beliefs. While he presents the scenario of dream deception as something that has often actually happened to him, he emphasizes that the evil genius hypothesis is a mere fiction intended to aid him in his systematic doubt (Meditations, I.15–16). Still, the evil genius hypothesis radicalizes the dream argument in two respects. One, it is intended to undermine not only Descartes’ sensory-based beliefs, but also those types of beliefs he thought were protected from the dream argument. Two, unlike the weaker reading of the dream argument introduced above, it involves a continuing rather than a temporary form of deception.

The brain-in-a-vat thought experiment introduces a slightly modernized version of the evil genius hypothesis. The basic idea is that you are nothing but a disembodied brain in a vat containing nutrient fluids and appropriately stimulated by evil scientists or a supercomputer, with the result that your conscious experience is exactly the same as it would be if you were an ordinary, embodied human being (see Putnam 1981 for a vivid description and refutation of the brain-in-a-vat thought experiment based on content or semantic externalism; see Brueckner 2012 for discussion). A popular version is introduced in the Matrix-trilogy, which has its protagonists living their lives in an unrecognized computer simulation while in fact, they are lying in pods. Unlike the classical brain-in-a-vat thought experiment, matrixers are essentially embodied brains in vats (for a detailed discussion of how the Matrix relates to the other skeptical scenarios discussed here, see Chalmers 2005).

What distinguishes all three scenarios from the dream argument is that while the former appeal to logical or even nomological possibility, dream deception is commonly regarded as a regularly recurring actuality (cf. Windt 2011; see, however, Bostrom 2003 for an argument intending to show that there are good reasons for thinking that we are actually, and not just hypothetically, living in a computer simulation). Yet, even purely hypothetical skeptical scenarios may enhance their psychological force by capitalizing upon the analogy with real-world dreams. Clark (2005) argues that the Matrix systematically equivocates between different uses of the concept of dreaming, where one involves “industrial-strength deception”, or instances in which both sensory experience and intellectual functioning are exactly the same as in standard wake-states, and the other involves real-world dreams that actually differ from standard wake states, for instance by involving compromised critical thinking and bizarre occurrences such as sudden shifts in visual imagery. This systematic ambiguity, according to Clark, is what makes the Matrix scenario so compelling.

1.4 Cartesian dream skepticism and real-world dreams

All of this raises the question of whether Descartes’ scenario of dream deception is really empirically plausible by capturing what it is typically like to dream. At the end of the Sixth Meditation, Descartes himself suggests that this is not the case. Contrary to his remarks in the First Meditation, he notes that dreams are in fact quite different from waking experiences, for instance in that they are only rarely connected to waking memories and in that persons may suddenly appear or disappear in dreams. Indeed, he uses this more sophisticated phenomenological description (Frankfurt 1970) to introduce the famous coherence test of dreaming and wakefulness. Contrary to his earlier remarks in the First Meditation, he thinks he has now found a mark by which dreaming and wakefulness can be distinguished (cf. Meditation I.7):

But when I perceive objects with regard to which I can distinctly determine both the place whence they come, and that in which they are, and the time at which they appear to me, and when, without interruption, I can connect the perception I have of them with the whole of the other parts of my life, I am perfectly sure that what I thus perceive occurs while I am awake and not during sleep. And I ought not in the least degree to doubt of the truth of these presentations, if, after having called together all my senses, my memory, and my understanding for the purpose of examining them, no deliverance is given by any one of these faculties which is repugnant to that of any other: for since God is no deceiver, it necessarily follows that I am not herein deceived. (Meditation VI. 24)

He concludes that dreaming is no longer a serious threat to sensory-based knowledge: even if the coherence test is too demanding to be carried out in every instance of perception, we now at least in principle have the means to rule out that we are dreaming at any given moment.

Several of Descartes’ contemporary critics claimed, however, that the coherence test itself is too error-prone to be of use. Hobbes (1641) argues that if it is possible that someone could merely dream of successfully performing the coherence test, the test is useless. Similarly, Bourdin (1641) criticizes Descartes’ reliance on clear and distinct ideas as indicators of genuine insight (see section 1.2) as insufficient, arguing that one does occasionally dream of having a particularly clear and distinct insight and only realizes upon awakening that this impression was false. He then argues that dreams, contrary to Descartes’ own claims, should lead us to doubt even our most basic beliefs about mathematical truths. Both Hobbes and Bourdin, then, are challenging Descartes’ characterization of what it is actually like to dream—and it should be clear that these diverging statements about what we do (or do not) typically dream about are at least in principle open to empirical investigation. Indeed, the alleged incoherence of dreams is closely related to empirical work on dream bizarreness, which investigates the occurrence of discontinuities (e.g., sudden, disconnected jumps in the dream narrative), incongruencies (e.g., the appearance of objects or dream characters out of their proper context, such as George Clooney suddenly sitting in my kitchen) and vague or undefined objects or persons in dreams (see Hobson 1988; Revonsuo & Salmivalli 1995).

Other authors have tried to use research findings to limit or even escape the threat of dream deception. Grundmann (2002) appeals to scientific dream research to introduce an introspective criterion by which we can determine that we are awake rather than dreaming. Because critical reasoning abilities are typically absent in dreams, he argues that when we introspectively notice that we are able to engage in critical reflection and when ongoing experience is seamlessly integrated with our memories, we have good reason to think that we are now awake. However, Windt (2011) argues that reasoning is not uniformly absent in the dream state and is often systematically corrupted when it does occur. While genuinely rational thought at least sometimes occurs in dreams, it is not recognizable: we are occasionally misled by apparently rational thought and critical reasoning in dreams. She concludes that Grundmann’s introspective criterion often fails and thus cannot lay skeptical worries to rest.

Either way, an important point is that any version of the dream argument that appeals to real-world dreams, for instance by making implicit assumptions about what it is actually or even typically like to dream, is open to empirical investigation. Dream research can thus be used, at least in principle, to assess the empirical plausibility of characterizations of dreaming in the context of different skeptical and anti-skeptical arguments. This raises the interesting possibility that any version of the dream argument that appeals to real-world dreams can at best justify a local form of skepticism, but cannot show, on pains of becoming self-defeating, that dreams pose a global threat to knowledge in general (including knowledge about dreams; cf. Stroud 1984; Grundmann 2002).

2. The ontology of dreams

2.1 Are dreams experiences?

Aside from concerns about empirical plausibility, it is important to note that Cartesian dream skepticism depends on even more basic background assumptions. In particular, it assumes that dreams are deceptive, first, because they are conscious experiences that are subjectively indistinguishable from standard waking experiences and second, because they involve false beliefs. One strategy for refuting Cartesian dream skepticism in the newer literature has been to question these assumptions and deny either that dreams are experiences at all (Malcolm 1956), or that they are deceptive in the ways envisioned by Descartes. A common strategy is to allow that dreams are experiences but deny either that they involve false percepts or that they involve false sensory-based beliefs, or both (Ichikawa 2008; see section 2.6). For this reason, the epistemological problem of dream skepticism is both historically and systematically related to newer treatments of dreaming in philosophy of mind.

This connection can be seen most clearly in Malcolm’s analysis of dreaming. Malcolm (1956) argues that attempts to conceive of dreams as experiences during sleep are senseless and that dreams consequently provide no foothold for philosophical skepticism. His key claim is that “if a person is in any state of consciousness it logically follows that he is not sound asleep” (Malcolm 1956: 21). On this view, external-world skepticism motivated by dreaming can be refuted by defending internal-world skepticism about the experiential status of dreaming. Inspired by some remarks of Wittgenstein’s (1953: 184; see Chihara 1965 for discussion), Malcolm argues that

the concept of dreaming is derived, not from dreaming, but from descriptions of dreams, i.e., from the familiar phenomenon that we call “telling a dream”. (Malcolm 1959: 55)

It follows that retrospective dream reports are the sole criterion for determining whether a dream occurred and that there is no independent way of verifying the occurrence of dreams in sleep. Sentences about dreaming differ from first-person, past-tense psychological sentences because the latter, unlike the former, are at least in principle verifiable by independent observations (at least this was Malcolm’s view; for a discussion of counterexamples, see Canfield 1961; Siegler 1967; Schröder 1997). According to Malcolm, dream reports and waking memory reports are governed by different grammars and it would be mistaken to infer that an identity of experience lies behind them:

If a man had certain thoughts and feelings in a dream it no more follows that he had those thoughts and feelings while asleep, than it follows from his having climbed a mountain in a dream that he climbed a mountain while asleep. (Malcolm 1959/1962: 51–52)

On this view, dream thoughts and feelings do not count as thoughts and feelings at all. For the same reason, it is impossible to mistakenly think, judge or assert that one is now awake while in fact one is dreaming (Malcolm 1956).

An underlying problem with this view is what exactly Malcolm means by “conscious experience”. While Malcolm (1956) seems to be saying that conscious experience is conceptually tied to wakefulness, he later claims that speaking of dreams as conscious experiences is unintelligible:

[…] the phrases “mental activity”, “mental phenomenon”, “conscious experience”, are so vague that I should not have known what I was asserting. (Malcolm 1959: 52)

He continues to think, however, that our definitions of mental state terms such as “thoughts”, “impressions”, “feelings”, “imagery”, and “beliefs” are sufficiently sharp to be inapplicable to dreaming. If having experiences in sleep involves having thoughts, impressions, beliefs etc. in sleep, then dreams are not, according to Malcolm, experiences.

An important consequence of this view is that because dream reports, for Malcolm, are the sole criterion of dreaming, there can be no additional observational evidence for saying that a person is now asleep and dreaming. According to Malcolm, contemporaneous evidence such as sleepwalking or sleeptalking could not count as evidence for saying that dreams are experiences occurring during deep sleep, because they would show that the person in question was at least partially awake. Similarly, any attempts to adopt a physiological criterion of dreaming (such as EEG measures of brain activity during sleep) would change the concept of dreaming. Hence, according to Malcolm, empirical evidence is irrelevant for the study of dreaming and attempts to study dreams scientifically are misconceived.

Malcolm’s analysis of dreaming has been criticized for a number of reasons (see for instance the essays collected in Dunlop 1977). The most profound objection is that Malcolm assumes an overly strict form of verificationism as well as a naïve view of language and conceptual change. Contra Malcolm, many today assume that justification does not depend on strict criteria with the help of which the truth of a statement can be determined with absolute certainty, but “on appeals to the simplicity, plausibility, and predictive adequacy of an explanatory system as a whole” (Chihara & Fodor 1965: 197). But if this is correct, then it might be possible to justify theoretical statements about the occurrence of experiences during sleep even in the absence of strict criteria, for instance by using behavioral and/or physiological evidence during sleep to verify dream reports (Ayer 1960). Even when this cannot be done, it is not clear that the absence of such evidence sets dreaming apart from other first-person, past-tense psychological sentences that as a matter of fact can no longer be verified (Siegler 1967; Schröder 1997).

Another important criticism is Putnam’s claim that Malcolm’s analysis of the concept of dreaming relies on a misguided view of analyticity, according to which philosophers have access to deep conceptual truths that are hidden to laypersons:

the lexicographer would undoubtedly perceive the logical (or semantical) connection between being a pediatrician and being a doctor, but he would miss the allegedly “logical” character of the connection between dreams and waking impressions. […] this “depth grammar” kind of analyticity (or “logical dependence”) does not exist. (Putnam 1962 [1986]: 306)

A related problem is that even if one accepts Malcolm’s analysis of the concept of dreaming,

it is a mistake to invest the demonstration that it is impossible to have experiences while asleep with more import than it has. It is an observation about our use of the word “experience”, and no more. It does not imply that nothing goes on in our minds while we dream. (Nagel 1959: 114)

Of course Malcolm would think it did: saying that one had something going through one’s mind in sleep involves describing dreaming as a (conscious) mental state, which to Malcolm once more is quite inappropriate. Yet, this only follows if we accept Malcolm’s implicit assumption of the existence of depth grammar and of strict, unchangeable rules for the application of mental state terms. If we do not, then there is no longer an obvious contradiction involved in saying that one has thoughts, feelings or beliefs—or perhaps even experiences—while asleep and dreaming. This should alert us to the fact that purely conceptual arguments of the type proposed by Malcolm do not, on their own, prohibit the application of such mental state terms to dreaming (Windt 2013). To the extent that they do, this is a mere conceptual stipulation and not really informative for an interdisciplinary investigation of dreaming. Rather, whether dream thoughts, feelings or beliefs are sufficiently similar to waking ones to count as real instances of their kind is an open question.

From now on, and in keeping with the philosophical discussion on dreaming, I will use the term “conscious experience” as an umbrella term for asking about the occurrence of sensations, thoughts, impressions, emotions etc. in dreams (cf. Dennett 1976). What these have in common is that is that they are phenomenal states: there is something it is like to be in these states for the subject of experience (cf. Nagel 1974). Asking about dream experience, then, is to ask whether it is like something to dream while one is dreaming, and whether what it is like is similar to (or relevantly different from) corresponding waking experiences. Note that these are two different questions: It might be like something to dream (and dreams might be experiences in this very general sense), though what it is like to dream might still be different from standard waking experience. If so, dreams might count as experiences even if they do not involve actual instances of sensations, emotions etc.

2.2 Dreams as instantaneous memory insertions

A second important objection to the view that dreams are conscious experiences during sleep is the claim that it relies on insufficient empirical evidence or is even empirically implausible. A particularly prominent version of this objection is to say that dreams lack temporal extension: dreams are instantaneous memory insertions occurring at the moment of awakening. The most prominent contemporary version, at least in philosophy, is Dennett’s (1976) cassette theory of dreaming. In “Are dreams experiences?”, he develops an extended thought experiment introducing a rival to the received view of dreams as conscious experiences during sleep. The cassette theory says that dreams are the product of two processes: a composition process responsible for the composition of dream narratives during sleep and a memory-loading process responsible for the ability to recall the dream upon awakening. Importantly, the only difference between the received view and the cassette theory is that the former additionally posits a conscious presentation process during sleep. On the received view, it is like something to dream; on the cassette theory, it is only like something to recall dreams. Both theories, however, are supposed to deal equally well with the available empirical evidence, for instance on the relationship between dreaming and REM sleep. The important point, for Dennett, is that it is impossible to distinguish between the two rival theories on the basis of dream recall. The thought experiment thus is not intended to show that dreams are not experiences, but rather that the question of whether they are cannot be settled by armchair conceptual analysis or on the basis of subjective testimony, but “only by the triumph of a good empirical theory over rival empirical theories” (Dennett 1979: 317). In this respect, the aims of Dennett’s argument are diametrically opposed to Malcolm’s. In Consciousness Explained, Dennett (1991) uses a similar thought experiment to undermine the distinction between memory insertion and memory revision for waking memory reports (see also Emmett 1978 for a critical discussion of this point).

The basic idea behind Dennett’s cassette theory goes back to a famous dream reported by Maury (1861), in which a long and complex dream about the French revolution culminated in his execution on the guillotine. At this point, Maury awoke to find that the headboard of his bed had fallen on his neck. Because the dream seemed to systematically build up to its dramatic climax, which in turn was occasioned, it would seem, by an external stimulus, he and others suggested that such cases were best explained as instantaneous memory insertions experienced at the moment of awakening. This theory, also known as the Goblot-hypothesis, was discussed by many dream researchers, such as Binz (1878), Goblot (1896), Freud (1899), and more recently Hall (1981; for a discussion from the perspective of contemporary dream research, see Kramer 2007: 22–24). Dennett’s cassette theory also has philosophical precedent, with Gregory (1916) suggesting that dreams are psychical explosions occurring at the moment of awakening. It also continues to be discussed in the contemporary literature. Rosen (2013) argues that dreams are experiences, but at the same time proposes that Malcolm and Dennett were right to raise skeptical worries about the trustworthiness of dream reports. Her narrative fabrication thesis says that dream reports are in fact often the product of confabulation and fail to accurately describe experiences occurring during sleep. By contrast, Windt (2013) defends an anti-skeptical view according to which dream reports can, at least under certain conditions, be regarded as trustworthy with respect to previous experience during sleep.

2.3 Empirical evidence on sleep and dreaming

Whereas Dennett (1976) takes the empirical evidence to be insufficient for deciding the question of whether dreams are experiences, more recent authors (Flanagan 2000; Metzinger 2003; Revonsuo 2006; Rosen 2013; Windt 2013) suggest otherwise.

A first reason for thinking that dreams are experiences during sleep is the relationship between dreaming and REM (rapid eye movement) sleep. Researchers in the 1950s discovered that sleep is not a uniform state of rest and passivity, but that there is a characteristic and interindividually stable sleep architecture involving different stages of sleep (Aserinsky & Kleitman 1953, 1955; Dement & Kleitman 1957). Periods of slow wave sleep (also called non-REM or NREM sleep), so called because of the presence of characteristic slow-wave, high-voltage EEG activity, are followed by periods of high-frequency, low-voltage activity during REM sleep. This latter activity is in fact indistinguishable, using EEG measures alone, from measures obtained during wakefulness. REM sleep is also characterized by rapid eye movements and a near-complete loss of muscle tone. Further characteristics of REM sleep include increased blood pressure, respiratory rate and pupil diameter as well as irregular heart rate (for details, see Dement 1999: 27–50; Jouvet 1999). Because of this combination of wake-like brain activity and peripheral paralysis, REM sleep is sometimes also called paradoxical sleep (Jouvet 1999).

Importantly, reports of dreaming are much more frequent following REM sleep awakenings (81.9%) than following NREM sleep awakenings (43%; Nielsen 2000). The former tend to be more elaborate, vivid, and emotionally intense, whereas the latter tend to be more thought-like, confused, non-progressive and repetitive (Hobson et al. 2000), leading to the assumption that dreaming is “physically diagnosable” (Hobson 1988: 154). Yet, attempts to identify dreaming with mental activity during REM sleep are controversial, and many now hold that dreams can occur in all stages of sleep (e.g., Antrobus 1990; Foulkes 1993b; Solms 1997, 2000; Domhoff 2003). Nielsen’s (2000) covert REM sleep hypothesis, according to which NREM sleep dreams are associated with sub-threshold REM activity, is a compromise between both extremes. The controversy about the sleep-stage correlates of dreaming is further complicated by the fact that there is currently no standardized and widely accepted definition of dreaming (Pagel et al. 2001). It thus seems plausible that

differences in definitions of “cognitive activity” and/or “dreaming” […] account for much of the variability in levels of mentation recall from REM and NREM sleep that has been observed in previous studies. (Nielsen 2000: 853)

A more differentiated picture of brain activity during sleep and its relation to dreaming is suggested by neuroimaging studies, which show that REM sleep is characterized by a shift in regional activation patterns compared to both wakefulness and NREM sleep (Dang-Vu et al. 2007; Nir & Tononi 2010; Desseilles et al. 2011). High activation levels in the pons, thalamus, temporo-occipital, motor, limbic, and paralimbic areas (including the amygdala), equaling or even surpassing those seen in wakefulness, fit in well with the predominance of visual and motor imagery during dreams and with the frequency of intense, often negative emotions. The comparative deactivation of the dorsolateral prefrontal and inferior parietal cortices fits in well with the cognitive deficits often thought to characterize dreaming such as the loss of self-awareness, the absence of critical thinking, mnemonic deficits and the delusional belief in the reality of dream events (Hobson et al. 2000). This convergence of neuroscientific evidence and the phenomenology of dreaming thus suggests the outlines of a naturalistic theory of dreaming. And if we follow Dennett (1976) in thinking that this kind of evidence is relevant for determining whether dream sensations and emotions are real instances of their kind, then this is a compelling reason for saying that dreams are, after all, experiences, in the sense of involving the phenomenology of seeing, feeling, etc during sleep.

A second line of evidence comes from lucid dreams, or dreams in which one knows that one is dreaming and is often able to exercise some level of dream control (LaBerge 2007). The term lucid dreaming was coined by van Eeden (1913), but the phenomenon has been known for centuries. Aristotle (On Dreams) already notes that one can sometimes be aware, while dreaming, that one is dreaming. Yet, many theorists, including many philosophers (e.g., Sartre 1940) thought that realizing that one is dreaming is incompatible with the dream state and that dream lucidity is strictly impossible. Researchers investigating lucid dreams in the laboratory, however, have proved otherwise (Hearne 1978; LaBerge et al. 1981). They showed that lucid dreamers can use specific, pre-arranged patterns of eye movements (e.g., right-left-right-left) to signal in real-time that they have now become lucid and are engaging in particular dream experiments. Because dream-eye movements correspond to real-eye movements (as predicted by the so-called scanning hypothesis; see Dement & Kleitman 1957; Leclair-Visonneau et al. 2010), these signals are clearly identifiable on the EOG. Retrospective reports confirm that the dreamer really was lucid and signaled lucidity (Dresler et al. 2012; Stumbrys et al. 2014). This technique has been used to study muscular activity accompanying body movements in dreams (Erlacher et al. 2003; Dresler et al. 2011), for advanced EEG analysis of brain activity during lucid dreaming (Voss et al. 2009), as well as for first imaging studies (Dresler et al. 2011, 2012). Eye signals can also be used to measure the duration of different activities performed in lucid dreams—e.g., walking, counting, or performing a simple gymnastics routine (Erlacher et al. 2014). Preliminary evidence suggests that walking and gymnastics take more time in lucid dreams than in wakefulness, but that the duration of counting is roughly the same. This is exactly the opposite of what would be predicted by the cassette theory, according to which the duration of dream actions should be much shorter than in wakefulness.

A third line of evidence comes from dream-enactment behavior (Nielsen et al. 2009), most prominently in patients with REM-sleep behavior disorder (RBD; Schenck & Mahowald 1996; Schenck 2005; Leclair-Visonneau et al. 2010). Due to a loss of the muscular atonia that accompanies REM sleep in healthy subjects, these patients show complex, seemingly goal-directed behaviors such as running or fighting off an attacker during REM sleep. Retrospective dream reports often match the observed behaviors, suggesting that patients are literally acting out their dreams during sleep. Many contemporary philosophers think that the evidence from lucid dreaming and dream-enactment behavior shows Dennett’s cassette theory to be empirically invalid (e.g., Revonsuo 2006: 77).

The discovery of REM sleep also profoundly altered the theoretical conception of sleep. Going back to Aristotle (On Sleeping and Waking), sleep had been defined in negative terms as the absence of wakefulness and perception. This tendency is still found in Malcolm’s claim that “to a person who is sound asleep, ‘dead to the world’, things cannot even seem” (Malcolm 1956: 26). With the discovery of REM sleep, sleep came to be regarded as a heterogeneous phenomenon characterized by the cyclic alteration of different sleep stages. REM sleep was now considered as “neither sleeping nor waking. It was obviously a third state of the brain, as different from sleep as sleep is from wakefulness” (Jouvet 1999: 5). The folk-psychological dichotomy between sleep and wakefulness now seemed oversimplified and empirically implausible.

The changing view of sleep was accompanied by a changed understanding of dreaming. Where Aristotle (On Dreams) had still allocated dreaming to the residual movements of the sensory organs arising during the quiet of sleep and in the absence of external sensory stimulation, researchers from the 19th century onwards believed dreams to occur in an intermediate period between sleep and wakefulness. Even after the discovery of REM sleep, the “paradigm […] of dreaming as half-waking, half-sleeping, persisted” (Jouvet 1999: 5), and researchers only gradually came to regard REM sleep as a genuine and unique sleep stage. Also, from the 1950s onwards, the scientific study of dreams for the first time seemed feasible, and at least initially, the new fields of scientific sleep and dream research developed together. It was in this climate that Malcolm (1956, 1959) appealed to the earlier practice of regarding dream reports as the sole source of evidence for the study of dreaming and objected to the classification of dreams as experiences occurring in sleep. According to Malcolm, experiences could at best occur during half sleep, whereas he followed Aristotle in assuming that dreaming proper occurred during deep sleep. Seen in this light, Malcolm was as much objecting to the reconceptualization of dreams as to that of sleep (for an excellent history of the study of sleep and dreaming, see Kroker 2007).

2.4 Dreams and hallucinations

Granting that dreams are experiences (in the sense of phenomenal experience, as described above), how can the conscious experience of dreaming be described conceptually? Throughout the history of philosophy, the standard view has been that dreams have the same phenomenal character as waking perception and count as hallucinations in the philosophical sense, that is, as experiences that are subjectively indistinguishable from genuine perception but where there is no mind-independent object being perceived (Crane 2011; Macpherson 2013). As is the case for waking hallucinations, dreams seemingly put us in contact with mind-independent objects. Yet, because dreams unfold in the absence of an appropriate contemporaneous stimulus sources, they fit the philosophical concept of hallucination. Note that this might even be true of false awakenings, or realistic dreams of waking up in one’s actual sleeping environment. Even if I seem to see my bedroom in such a dream, and even if I my visual experience is exactly the same as it would be if I were to open my eyes, this would still not count as a case of sensory perception: as long as my eyes were closed during the episode, I would not, literally, be seeing my bedroom, but hallucinating it. In fact, this is why false awakening are sometimes thought to be a particularly compelling reason for endorsing dream skepticism (cf. Russell 1948: 153).

The view that dreams involve hallucinatory experiences is the core intuition behind Cartesian dream skepticism and implicit in Descartes’ assertion than even if all of my sensory experiences are false because I am now dreaming,

it is certain that I seem to see light, hear a noise, and feel heat; this cannot be false, and this is what in me is properly called perceiving (sentire). (Descartes 1641: II.9)

It also lies at the heart of Aristotle’s theory of dreaming (On Dreams), according to which dreams result from the movements of the sensory organs that continue even after the original stimulus has disappeared. In the silence of sleep and in the absence of any contemporaneous sensory stimulation, these residual movements result in sometimes vivid sensory imagery that is subjectively indistinguishable from actual sensory perception. Similar views of dreams as the after-effects of a prior stimulus were held by many other ancient authors (Dreisbach 2000; Barbera 2008).

While Descartes was troubled by the hallucinatory character of dreams, Leibniz was fascinated by it, noting that the spontaneous formation of visions in dream is “more elegant than any which we can attain by much thought while awake” (Leibniz, Philosophical Papers and Letters, Vol. I, 177–178). Berkeley (1710: I.18) used the example of dreaming to motivate his idealist claim that the existence of external bodies is not necessary for the production of vivid experiences. The only difference between dreams and waking experiences, according to Berkeley, lies in the comparative instability and lack of coherence of dreams (see Downing 2013 for details). A similar intuition underlies Russell’s remarks on dreams in the context of sense-data theory (Huemer 2011). In dreams, according to Russell,

I have all the experiences that I seem to have; it is only things outside my mind that are not as I believe them to be while I am dreaming. (Russell 1948: 149–150)

Elsewhere, he goes so far as to claim that dreams and waking life

must be treated with equal respect; it is only by some reality not merely sensible that dreams can be condemned. (Russell 1914: 69)

Here, we see that historically, epistemological questions about dreaming were closely connected to psychological questions and questions from philosophy of mind about the nature and ontology of dream experience.

In the context of Hume’s taxonomy of the mind, dreams occupy an interesting intermediate position between impressions, including sensations, passions and emotions, which enter into the mind “with most force and violence” (Hume 1739:, and ideas, or “the faint images of these in thinking and reasoning” (Hume 1739: On the one hand, Hume is committed to the empiricist claim that as mere creatures of the mind, dreams depend on prior impressions but themselves count as ideas. On the other hand, dreams are an obvious counterexample to his dichotomous distinction between impressions and ideas, because “in sleep, in a fever, in madness, or in any very violent emotions of the soul, our ideas may approach to our impressions” (Hume 1739: and indeed may be subjectively indistinguishable from them. Hume’s attempt to distinguish impressions and ideas by their different degrees of vivacity has frequently been criticized as unclear and unconvincing (for instance famously by Ryle 1949), and his classification of dreams as ideas seems to exacerbate this problem (Waxman 1994; Broughton 2006).

In the phenomenological tradition, dreams are often discussed in the context of theories of the imagination, if only to remark that phenomenologically, they are clearly distinct from waking imaginings and daydreams and should rather, as is the case for hallucinations and illusions, be classified as perceptions (e.g., Husserl 1904/1905; Conrad 1968; note that this only makes sense if one does not read perception as a success-word or assume that perception is necessarily veridical). Dreams are experienced as reality; in dreams as in wakefulness, but unlike in waking fantasy and daydreams, we feel, simply, present in a world (Uslar 1964; Globus 1987: 89).

The hallucination view of dreaming finds its strongest expression in Revonsuo’s claim that

there is nothing in the experience itself, in the actual qualitative character of the experience, that necessarily distinguishes the dream experience from a corresponding perceptual experience in the waking state (Revonsuo 2006: 82)

and that

the qualities of dream experience are identical with the qualities of waking experience. (Revonsuo 2006: 84)

This claim is central to the virtual reality metaphor of dreaming, according to which consciousness itself is essentially dreamlike in that even in wakefulness, perceptual experience is a kind of online hallucination (see also Metzinger 2003, 2009). Again, the idea is that dreams are hallucinatory because dreaming feels exactly like perceiving, but unfolds independently of an appropriate external stimulus source, and because both feel different from imagining or daydreaming.

The description of dreams as hallucinations, virtual realities or world-analogues, popular both in the phenomenological tradition and in contemporary, empirically informed philosophical treatments of dreaming, is complemented by the scientific literature. According to Llinás & Ribary (1994; Llinás & Paré 1991), waking perception is a dream-like state modulated by the senses. Hobson (1988, Hobson et al. 2000) suggests that the vivid, hallucinatory character of dreaming results from the fact that in REM sleep, the visual and motor areas are activated in the same way as in waking perception, the sole difference being that dreams rely on internal signal generation rather than on an external stimuli. Recently, Horikawa and colleagues (2013) were able to use neuroimaging data gathered during sleep onset to predict with 60% accuracy the types of objects described in the corresponding mentation reports. They interpret their results as supporting a “principle of perceptual equivalence”, according to which perception and dreaming share a common neural substrate. However, attempts to analogize dreaming and waking experience may be premature. Nielsen notes that while existing findings largely support the “reality simulation perspective” of dreaming, it is currently unknown to what extent subtle perceptual activities (such as visual search) occur in dreams. He argues that improved methods of reporting dreams and specially trained subjects might be needed to make progress on this question (Nielsen 2010: 595).

There is also some controversy in the psychological literature as to whether dreams should be regarded as hallucinations. Aleman & Larøi (2008: 17) argue that because the concept of hallucination is often used in clinical contexts, classifying dreams as hallucinations might ultimately be more misleading than helpful. By contrast, ffytche (2007; ffytche et al. 2010) argues that an integrative neurophenomenological model spanning a wide range of visual disorders involving hallucinations should take dreams into account and that both waking hallucinations and dreams should be distinguished from waking imagery because of their phenomenal character.

2.5 Dreams and illusions

Saying that dreams are hallucinations is not, however, the only way of making sense of the claim that dreaming has the same phenomenal character as waking perception. An alternative is to say that at least certain kinds of dream imagery are illusory in the philosophical sense of an experience in which an external object is perceived as having different properties from the one it actually has (cf. Smith 2002; Crane 2011. If we apply this to dreaming, it means that dreams do not arise completely independently of a contemporaneous external stimulus source, but rather involve distorted perceptions of external stimuli and bodily sensations occurring during sleep. The debate on whether dreaming is hallucinatory or illusory thus hinges on the putative sources of dreaming.

An early precursor to the view that at least some aspects of dreaming are illusory is the ancient practice of using dreams to diagnose illness, as practiced for instance in the shrines at Epidaurus. The underlying idea was that during sleep, we are more sensitive to bodily ailments than in wakefulness, thus enabling the first and clearest signs of illness to manifest in dreams. This is not quite the same, of course, as saying that certain kinds of dream imagery involve a misperception of bodily changes or that dreaming as such is caused by bodily sensations. Still, because this view associates the content of dreaming with a heightened sensitivity to the sleeping body, it is diametrically opposed to the claim, widely accepted in the contemporary literature, that during REM sleep, the processing of external and peripheral bodily stimuli is almost completely blocked (e.g., Hobson et al. 2000; on diagnostic dreams, see Galen On Diagnosis in Dreams; van de Castle 1994).

Claims about the external or bodily sources of dreaming resurfaced in modern philosophy. Aristotle (On Dreams) had already thought that at least some dreams are caused by indigestion. Hobbes, who generally adopts the Aristotelian view that dreams arise from continued movements of the sensory organs during sleep, claims that “dreames are caused by the distemper of some inward parts of the Body” and that this might even help explain different types of dreams. For instance, “lying cold breedeth Dreams of Feare, and raiseth the thought and Image of some fearfull object” (Hobbes 1651: 91). While this is not quite the same as saying that dreams are illusory, appealing to the external causes of dream sensations is at least a necessary condition for saying that dreams involve distorted perceptions. By contrast, proponents of the hallucination view typically emphasize that dreams unfold completely independently of external sensory stimuli (cf. Metzinger 2003; Revonsuo 2006)

Appeals to the bodily sources of dreaming became especially popular in the 19th and early 20th centuries. Here, claims about the external (as opposed to wholly internal, or brain-based) sources of dreaming are also more clearly connected to the claim that sensory and in particular bodily experiences in dreams are distorted perceptions of external objects. The idea would then be that those types of dream imagery that count as misperceptions of external objects are illusory. All (or at least subgroup) of bodily experiences in dreams might then be redescribed as involving a distorted perception of the sleeping body. In his Philosophy of Sleep, Macnish (1838) argues that dreams are caused by an excitement of the inner organs, for instance through fever or indigestion, and suggests that dreams can be controlled by changing one’s sleeping position. Bergson (1914) echoes this view, claiming that dreams of flying or floating occur when we become aware, while dreaming, that our feet are not touching the ground. Similar attempts to associate changes in sleeping position with specific dream contents, such as flying, were undertaken by Scherner (1861), Vold (1910/1912), and Ellis (1911).

There is, of course, an important distinction to be drawn between the claim that external stimuli can occasionally be incorporated in dreams and the claim that dreams generally arise in response to or are caused by external or bodily stimuli. While most would allow the former, the latter is more contentious, because it suggests that the very process of dreaming is caused by external stimuli. The latter claim, which is a claim about the typical sources of dreaming, was defended by Wundt, who argued that the

ideas which arise in dreams come, at least to a great extent, from sensations, especially from those of the general sense, and are therefore mostly illusions of fancy, probably only seldom pure memory ideas which hence become hallucinations. (Wundt 1896: 179)

There is also an important difference between the claim that external or bodily stimuli are the causally enabling conditions for certain types of dreams to arise and the claim that dream contents can be satisfactorily explained by appealing only to their external or bodily sources. This was already pointed out by Silberer (1919), who acknowledges that many dreams have somatic sources, but denies that this is enough to explain the unique kind of processing underlying dream formation. It is at least as important, according to Silberer, to understand the psychic sources of dreaming.

Methodologically, there is also an important difference between the largely anecdotal observations made by many proponents of the “Leibreiztheorie” (or somatic-stimulus theory) of dreaming and systematic and controlled experiments. Weygandt (1893), for instance, used experimental manipulations during sleep to systematically investigate the influence of breathing, blood circulation, temperature changes, urge to urinate, uncomfortable sleeping position and visual or auditory stimulation during sleep on dream content (see Schredl 2010 for details). Methodological considerations also influenced the philosophical debate on dreaming. Singer (1924) argues that sensory stimulation during sleep and its effect on dreams can be used as a test case for psychophysical claims about the association between sensations and stimulus intensity. Such claims, he argues, are potentially threatened by the description of dreams as involving sensations. He suggests a protocol for solving this question experimentally. If dreams are sensations, he argues, then a stimulus such as a hornblast should increase the frequency of dreams in nearby sleepers as well as the frequency of sound in their dreams, and it should decrease the range of quality and intensity of these dreams. If this were found to be the case, psychophysical claims about the correlation of sensations with stimulus intensity would be compatible with saying that dreams involve sensations.

Indeed, a number of newer studies have found evidence for the integration of external stimuli such as light flashes, sounds, sprays of water applied to the skin (Dement & Wolpert 1958), thermal (Baldridge 1966), electrical (Koulack 1969), and verbal stimuli (Berger 1963; Breger et al. 1971; Hoelscher et al., 1981), and of blood pressure cuff stimulation (Nielsen et al. 1995; Sauvageau et al. 1998) in dreams. Two recent studies suggest that interindividual differences in dream recall frequency might be related to different levels of sensitivity to auditory stimuli, with meaningful stimuli inducing more complex cognitive processing and heightened reactivity in participants with high as compared to participants with low dream recall frequency (Eichenlaub et al. 2013; Ruby et al. 2013). This suggests that Singer’s (1924) prediction was at least not wholly off the mark.

While proponents of both the hallucination and the illusion view can claim that dreaming is subjectively indistinguishable from standard waking experience, proponents of the illusion view sometimes also appeal to the external and bodily sources of dreaming to explain the phenomenological differences between dream and waking experience. Several philosophers tried to explain the absence of movement in dreams by appealing to the inertia of the sleeping body during sleep. According to Bradley (1894), dreams of being unable to move are not related to the absence of motor intentions in dreams. Rather, the absence of appropriate bodily feedback prevents us from executing our motor intentions in our dreams. Similarly, Gregory (1918) argues that dreams involving frustrated effort or thwarted intentions arise when the dream fails to provide the requisite imagery. Because background sensations of touch and movement are lacking in dreams, “the situation will seem right to the dreamer but it will feel wrong” (Gregory 1918: 127). Dreams of frustrated effort follow suit.

Appeals to the external and bodily sources of dreaming have fallen into disfavor in the contemporary literature, both in philosophy and in scientific dream research. REM sleep is commonly described as a state in which external stimulus processing and the outward enactment of internally experienced dream behavior is almost completely blocked: dreams, on this view, rely exclusively on internal signal generation and unfold in a state of near-complete physical paralysis (Hobson et al. 2000).

It is interesting to note, in this context, that these claims about the functional dissociation between dreams and environmental and bodily stimuli are shared both by proponents of internalist conceptions of conscious experience and by proponents of externalist or sensorimotor theories of perception. For instance, Revonsuo writes that

the contents of both perceptual and bodily awareness are, during REM dreaming, totally dissociated from the corresponding states of the physical body. (Revonsuo 2006: 92; emphasis added)

Similarly, Noë (2004: 213) takes “it as settled that when we dream there is no dynamic exchange with the environment (although this might turn out not to be true)”, suggesting that “neural states alone are sufficient for dreaming.” Unlike Revonsuo, he denies, however, that this shows neural activity alone to be sufficient for perceptual experience. He points out that there are phenomenological differences between dreaming and wakefulness, noting that dream imagery lacks, for instance, the stability of waking perception. He then argues that this difference can be explained by appealing to the lack of dynamic interaction with the environment in dreams. So while the two disagree about the phenomenology of dreaming, a corresponding debate on the internal as opposed to external or bodily sources of dreaming no longer exists in the contemporary philosophical literature.

2.6 Dreams as imaginative experiences

The most important rival to the hallucination view of dreaming in the contemporary philosophical literature is the claim that dreams are imaginative experiences (Gendler 2013). This is typically construed as an alternative to the claim that dreams involve percepts (i.e., hallucinations or illusions; McGinn 2004), the claim that they involve real beliefs (Sosa 2007), or both (Ichikawa 2008, 2009). The claim that dreams involve imagery rather than percepts comes in different strengths and in different variants, and it means different things in the context of different theoretical accounts. A first way of understanding the imagination view of dreaming is to regard it as a claim about the phenomenology of dreaming. If we assume, as is common in the phenomenological tradition, that imagining is distinguished from standard waking perception in that imagining does not involve the experience of being in a world, and if we additionally assume that dreaming is a form of imaginative experience, then the sense in which we feel present in our dreams might be analogous to cognitive absorption or fictional immersion of the type experienced in waking fantasy, but also in reading a novel or watching a movie (McGinn 2004). An example is Sartre’s (1940; see Hering 1947; Globus 1987 for critical discussion) claim that dreams are experienced as fictions. Yet, he argues that because the reflective quality of waking consciousness is absent in dreams, dreaming is a case in which the fictional world has closed upon itself: the imaginary world of dreaming captures us so completely that the very concept of reality is lost in dreams. Any appearance of reflexive consciousness disrupts and terminates the ongoing dream. This is why Sartre also takes prolonged lucid dreams to be impossible.

More recently, the claim that dreaming is phenomenologically like imagining and daydreaming rather than perceiving has been taken up by McGinn (2004, 2005a,b) and Ichikawa (2009). Both also argue that imagery and percepts are sharply distinguished, claiming that imagining and perceiving are different kinds of mental states that cannot be meaningfully placed on a continuum. Indeed, because dreaming is often thought to blur the distinction between imagining and perceiving, showing that dreaming is phenomenologically unlike perceiving and resembles waking imagination is an important goal for any attempt to argue that imagining and perceiving themselves are categorically distinct. McGinn (2004) proposes a number of criteria for distinguishing dreams and waking mental imagery (or what he calls images) on the one hand from percepts on the other hand. He claims, for instance, that images can be willed while percepts cannot; that nothing new can be learned from images, but only from percepts; that the boundary and foreground-background structure of the visual field results from anatomical constraints, but that nothing comparable is the case for images; that percepts are more determinate than images and that the visual field is saturated and detailed, whereas images are gappy; that images (but not percepts) are attention-dependent; that percepts are characterized by presence, whereas imaginary objects are posited as absent; that the identity of imagined objects is not recognized or inferred, but given; that you can see and think of two different things at the same time, whereas the same is not true of images; and that percepts are only occluded by other percepts, but not by images. Dreams fall on the side of imagery, according to McGinn, not because they are in every respect like waking imagery; yet, he thinks there are enough differences between dreaming and perceiving to reject the view that dreams are a hybrid between imagining and perceiving, concluding that dreams are essentially imaginative experiences. Why exactly, then, should dreams be described as imaginative experiences? Instead of discussing all of the supposed differences between dreams and percepts, I focus on those that are commonly taken to be the most relevant and the most controversial.

A particularly important issue for the imagination view of dreaming is whether dreams, like waking imaginings, are subject to the will (Ichikawa 2009). Historically, it has been commonly taken for granted that imagination involves “a special effort of the mind” (Descartes 1641: VI, 2) and that unlike perception, which is taken to be wholly passive, imagining is an activity that is at least in principle under our control (Wittgenstein 1967: 621, 633). Because dreams, however, do not seem to be under voluntary control, but rather happen to us, they present an important challenge for the imagination view. Here, imagination theorists claim that dreams, though typically not under voluntary control, are nonetheless subject to the will and the product of unconscious authorship (McGinn 2004; Ichikawa 2009). On this view, rare instances of lucid control dreams show that dreams are generally amenable to direct and deliberate control in a way that percepts are not (Ichikawa 2009).

Dreams are also taken to be unlike percepts in that they lack saturation (McGinn 2004) and the determinacy of waking perception (James 1890: 47; Stone 1984). In scientific dream research, the vagueness of dream imagery is one of three main subtypes of bizarreness (together with incongruity and discontinuity; see Hobson 1988; Revonsuo & Salmivalli 1995). Perhaps relatedly, dream characters are often identified not by their behavior or looks, but by just knowing (Kahn et al. 2000, 2002; Revonsuo & Tarkko 2002). The question of whether we dream in color is also thought to be relevant to the issue of whether dreaming resembles imagining or perceiving. In his review of historical studies on color in dreams, Schwitzgebel found that while contemporary studies tend to support the view that we dream in color, studies from the 1930–1960s tended to support the claim that we dream in black-and-white (Schwitzgebel 2011: 5; cf. Schwitzgebel 2002). He suggests different interpretations of this shift in opinions about colored dreaming. The rise first of black-and-white and then of color television may have led to a change from colored to black-and-white and back to colored dreaming. Alternatively, dreams may have been either black-and white or colored all along, with media exposure only changing the way people report their dreams. A final possibility is that dreams are neither black-and-white nor colored. Again, media exposure changed only reports of colored dreaming, but on this view, dreams themselves are indeterminate with respect to color, perhaps in the manner of fictions or daydreams. Schwitzgebel’s main point, here, is that reports of colored dreaming are unreliable: based on the available evidence, it is impossible to determine whether or not we actually dream in color (see Windt 2013 for critical discussion). This argument is importantly related to his general skepticism about the reliability of introspection (Schwitzgebel 2011; Hurlburt & Schwitzgebel 2007).

Ichikawa (2009) argues that the imagination view of dreaming provides a better explanation of the available evidence on dream color than the percept view. If dreams, like visual imagery, are indeterminate with respect to color, this would explain why dream reports are influenced by fiction-based experiences and media exposure. An empirical prediction, according to Ichikawa, is that media exposure will change not only reports of dreaming, but also reports of waking daydreams. A potential problem for this view, however, is that a number of follow-up studies (Schwitzgebel 2003; Schwitzgebel et al. 2006; Murzyn 2008; Schredl et al. 2008; Hoss 2010) have not found evidence for saying that dreams are indeterminate with respect to color. The available evidence suggests that a majority of participants report dreaming in color, and a small percentage describe grayscale or even mixed (i.e., partially colored, partially grayscale; see Murzyn 2008) dreams or dreams involving moderate color saturation (Rechtschaffen and Buchignani 1992). For this reason, it would seem that the evidence on color indeterminacy is too inconclusive to translate into an obvious explanatory advantage of the imagination view as compared to the percept view.

Another challenge for the imagination view is how to explain the emotional character of dreaming. Dreams are sometimes described as hyperemotional, in that a majority of dreams involve strong (and often negative) emotions (Merritt et al. 1994; Nielsen et al. 1999; Hobson et al. 2000). By contrast, proponents of the imagination view claim that dream emotions are only “muted versions of themselves” that lack the “sting” of real emotions (McGinn 2004: 111) and that “dreams don’t involve emotions, except in the way that fictions do” (Ichikawa 2009: 119). A particular challenge is how to deal with nightmares, which can be a cause of genuine suffering to those who experience them frequently (Blagrove et al. 2004; Germain & Zadra 2009; Nielsen & Levin 2009).

Despite these objections, the imagination view also has a number of advantages. By assimilating dreams to a commonplace mental state, such as waking fantasy and daydreaming, rather than a rare occurrence, such as hallucinations, it provides a more unified account of mental life (Stone 1984). It also has consequences for Cartesian dream skepticism. If dream pain does not feel like real pain, for instance, there is a fail-safe way to determine whether one is now dreaming: one need only pinch oneself (Nelson 1966; Stone 1984; but see Hodges & Carter 1969; Kantor 1970). As suggested somewhat sarcastically by Locke,

if our dreamer pleases to try, whether the glowing heat of a glass furnace, be barely a wandering imagination in a drowsy man’s fancy, by putting his hand into it, he may perhaps be wakened into a certainty greater than he could wish, that it is something more than bare imagination. (Locke 1689: IV.XI.8)

Austin thought the phenomenological differences between dreaming and wakefulness to be so obvious that

it is just because we all know that dreams are throughout unlike waking experiences that we can safely use ordinary expressions in the narration of them; (Austin 1962: 42)

by contrast, claims about the subjective indistinguishability of dreaming and wakefulness are, according to Austin (1962: 48), absurd. A problem with this latter view is, of course, that many philosophers have embraced this alleged absurdity, suggesting that appeals to intuitive obviousness are not particularly reliable where the phenomenology of dreaming is concerned.

It is also important to note that the imagination view of dreaming is not committed to the claim that dreaming literally feels like imagining or that imagining is categorically distinct from perceiving. In the Leviathan, Hobbes describes dreams as “the imaginations of them that sleep” (Hobbes 1651: 90), and imagination as a “decaying sense” (Hobbes 1651: 88). This need not, however, be taken as a phenomenological claim. In particular, he uses the concepts of imagination and fancy to describe perception as well, noting that sensations seem to be caused by external objects, not by pressure on and movement of the sensory organs. Consequently, “their appearance to us is Fancy, the same waking, that dreaming” (Hobbes 1651: 86). O’Shaughnessy (2002) classifies dreaming as an “imagining-of consciousness” (O’Shaughnessy 2002: 430) because consciousness is conceptually tied to wakefulness: consciousness involves knowledge of the external world, reactivity to external stimuli, and perceptual awareness, all of which are lost in dreams. Yet, it is not clear that he thereby takes dreaming to feel different from waking perception, or that he thinks there is a necessary distinction between conscious experiences (in the phenomenological sense) in dreams and wakefulness. By avoiding such claims, this weaker version of the imagination view also avoids many of the challenges to stronger versions discussed above.

In the scientific literature, the imagination view of dreaming is complemented by cognitive theories of dreaming. According to Foulkes (1978), dreaming is a form of thinking with its own grammar and syntax. Yet, he allows that

the pictures are sufficiently perceptlike generally to lead us to believe, until the moment of our awakening, that we actually are seeing real events. (Foulkes 1978: 5)

Domhoff’s neurocognitive model of dreaming (2001, 2003) draws from findings on the partial or global cessation of dreaming in lesion patients (cf. Solms 1997, 2000) to emphasize the dependence of dreaming on visuospatial skills and on a specific network involving the limbic, paralimbic and association areas of the forebrain. It also integrates evidence that dreaming develops gradually and in tandem with visuospatial skills in children (Foulkes 1993a, 1999; but see Resnick et al. 1994) and results from dream content analysis supporting the continuity of dreaming with waking concerns and memories (the so-called continuity hypothesis; see Domhoff 2001, 2003; Schredl & Hofmann 2003; Schredl 2006). Nir and Tononi (2010) recently used findings on the relation between dreaming, visuospatial skills and memory to argue that dreaming “might turn out to be the purest form of imagination” (Nir & Tononi 2010: 97). Yet, they explicitly allow that dreams often have a vivid, hallucinatory quality and regard their claim about the imaginative character of dreaming as one about the flow of information processing in dreams, which they expect to be top-down, as in waking imagery, rather than bottom-up, as in perception. A number of researchers have also begun to consider dreaming in the context of theories of mind wandering (Schooler et al. 2011) and suggest that there is an overlap between the brain areas involved in dreaming and the default-mode network, a network of brain areas associated with stimulus- or task-independent thought (Pace-Schott 2007, 2013; Domhoff 2011; Wamsley 2013; Fox et al. 2013). The philosophical implications of this comparison between dreaming and waking mind wandering are only just beginning to be explored (Metzinger 2013 a,b).

2.7 The problem of dream belief

Aside from claiming that dreaming involves imagery rather than percepts, the second important strategy for defending the imagination view is to argue that dream-beliefs are not real beliefs, but propositional imaginings. Sosa (2007: 4) defends a version of the imagination view according to which dreams involve percepts, but believing and intending in a dream does not entail in actuality having any such beliefs or intentions. Ichikawa (2009) defends the stronger position that dreaming neither involves percepts nor beliefs.

Denying that dream-beliefs have the status of real-beliefs only makes sense before the background of a specific theoretical account of what beliefs are and how they are distinguished from other mental states, such as delusions or propositional imaginings (see Schwitzgebel 2014 for an introduction). For instance, Ichikawa (2009) argues that dream beliefs do not have the same functional role as real beliefs because they lack connection with perceptual experience and fail to motivate actions. For this reason, he thinks that interpretationist or dispositionalist accounts of belief speak against the view that dreams involve real beliefs. If we observe a person lying asleep in bed, there are no grounds upon which we could ascribe to them a particular belief, allegedly held within a dream. A more sweeping denial of dream belief involves the claim that dream-beliefs contradict commonsense assumptions about what it means to have a belief. For instance, dream beliefs are often inconsistent with longstanding waking beliefs, and occasionally, treating them as real beliefs would require the ascription of two contradictory beliefs to the sleeping subject. I cannot, it seems, both believe that I am being chased by a lion and that I am lying peacefully in bed at the same time (Sosa 2007: 5). Moreover, dream-beliefs are apparently acquired and discarded without any process of belief revision (Ichikawa 2009: 112–113). Similar arguments have been used to deny that dream-thoughts, judgments, affirmations, assertions, or wonderings are real instances of their kind (cf. Malcolm 1959; Sosa 2007).

This analysis of dream-beliefs has consequences for skepticism. If dream beliefs are propositional imaginings, then we cannot falsely believe, while dreaming, that we are now awake, but can only imagine that we are. Indeed, on this version of the imagination view, we cannot believe anything at all while dreaming—and so we also cannot have any false beliefs, including the false belief that we are now awake (Sosa 2007). If successful, this inability to have beliefs while dreaming, or so the argument goes, would protect us from dream deception.

It is not at all clear, however, that this line of reasoning can allay Descartes’ worry. As Lewis points out, a person might

in fact believe or realize in the course of a dream that he was dreaming, and even if we said that, in such case, he only dreamt that he was dreaming, this still leaves it possible for someone who is asleep to entertain at the time the thought that he is asleep. (Lewis 1969: 133)

And for the same reason one could, of course, entertain the erroneous thought that one is now awake. The question then becomes whether beliefs are strictly necessary for dream deception or whether other mental states such entertaining, thinking etc. might be sufficient. For instance, as Reed (1979) argues, dreams can still count as deceptive even if they do not involve strongly appraisive beliefs, but only minimally appraisive instances of taking for granted. It has also been argued that if dream-beliefs fall short of real beliefs, this makes the specter of dream deception more, rather than less, worrisome. Ichikawa (2008) argues that on the imagination view of dreaming, we mistake dream-beliefs for real beliefs and thus are deceived as to the status of our own mental states. Because we cannot reliably distinguish dream-beliefs from real ones, and because knowing that p requires knowing that one believes that p, one can have no reflective knowledge if the imagination view of dreaming turns out to be correct. In order to escape this persistent vulnerability to skepticism, the imagination theorist would have to deny not just that dream beliefs, but also that wonderings, thoughts, affirmation etc. are real instances of their kind. This however places a considerable burden on the imagination theory, and while one might want to accept that dream beliefs are too defective to count as real ones, the same might not be true for mere instances of thinking or wondering.

Finally, it is interesting to note that a similar debate exists regarding the status of delusions (see Currie 2000; Currie & Ravenscroft 2002; McGinn 2004; Bayne & Pacherie 2005; Bortolotti 2009, 2013; Gendler 2013). A theory of dream belief will ultimately also have to clarify how dream beliefs relate not just to real beliefs, but also to wake-state delusions.

3. Dreaming and theories of consciousness

3.1 Dreaming as a model system and test case for consciousness research

An important reason for thinking that dreaming is relevant for theories of consciousness is that dreaming involves a profound alteration in the conditions under which conscious (in the sense of phenomenal) experience arises. Moreover, as compared to other altered states of consciousness (such as waking hallucinations or illusions) and pathological wake states (such as psychosis or neurological syndromes), dreams occur spontaneously and regularly in healthy subjects. For this reason, many regard dreams as a test case for general theories of consciousness, arguing that any theoretical account of consciousness that strives towards empirical plausibility should be able to accommodate dreaming as well.

A first proposal for using dreaming as a research model system in consciousness research was developed by Patricia Churchland (1988). Drawing from scientific dream research, she appeals not only to the existence of robust phenomenological differences between wakefulness, dreaming and dreamless sleep, but also to the fact that there are behavioral criteria for the objective identification of the states of waking, dreaming and sleep, possibly even enabling the use of animals models. The research program is further strengthened, according to Churchland, by progress on the identification of the neuronal generator producing shifts between these states. Churchland (1988: 286) also uses evidence on dream bizarreness to argue that consciousness lacks a homogeneous underlying organizing principle and is not, as often thought, a single, unified natural kind.

A second proposal for using dreaming as a research model in consciousness research is defended by Revonsuo. Unlike Churchland, he assumes that the structure of phenomenal experience is deeply similar in dreaming and in wakefulness. Based on his review of the scientific literature, he argues that

the dreaming brain brings out the phenomenal level of organization in a clear and distinct form. Dreaming is phenomenality pure and simple, untouched by external physical stimulation or behavioural activity. (Revonsuo 2006: 75)

According to Revonsuo, dreaming not only involves phenomenal consciousness, but also, as he puts it (Revonsuo 2006: 75–82) the full range of phenomenal contents, including perceptual contents, color experiences, and pain. On this view, the differences between dreaming and waking experience are of a fairly superficial kind, related only to the absence of a stable external stimulus source. For this reason, he takes the analysis of dreaming to shed light on the basic, state-independent structure of conscious experience. According to Revonsuo, this consists in the immersive character of dreaming: “dreaming depicts consciousness first and foremost as a subjective world-for-me” (Revonsuo 2006: 75). The example of dreaming, for Revonsuo, is an important motivation for introducing the “world-simulation metaphor of consciousness”, according to which consciousness itself is essentially simulational and dreamlike, thus supporting Revonsuo’s favored internalist conception of conscious experience. Because of his endorsement of biological realism, which is the claim that consciousness is a biological phenomenon that is literally located in the brain (Revonsuo 2006: xvii), he also thinks that the investigation of the neural basis of dreaming might help locate the phenomenal level of organization in the brain—once more defending a view that is at odds with Churchland’s reductive account.

A possible problem for both views is their reliance on background assumptions about the phenomenology of dreaming and its association with REM sleep, which are, as we have seen, both quite controversial (cf. section 2.3). As Windt & Noreika (2011) argue, persistent disagreement on these issues hampers the integration of dreams into a general theory of consciousness. In the absence of a well worked out theory of dreaming and its sleep-stage and neural correlates, proposals for using dreaming as a model system run the risk of being premature and oversimplified. Note also that Revonsuo’s account would be threatened by positions according to which dream imagery is illusory or imaginative. The former view would challenge his claim that dream imagery arises independently of external sensory stimulation, and the latter would challenge his claim that dreaming has the same phenomenal character as waking perception. Both claims, however, are crucial for his attempt to show that dreaming offers particularly clear support for the “world-simulation metaphor of consciousness”.

Recent accounts appealing to generative models and predictive processing (Clark 2013b; Hohwy 2013) might suggest a new, unified account of perception, dreaming and imagination. This type of account strives to accommodate internalist intuitions by confining the vehicles of phenomenal experience to the brain. At the same time, it acknowledges the existence of phenomenological differences in stability, detail and coherence between dreaming and wakefulness of the kind that are often pointed out by proponents of enactivist or sensorimotor theories of perception (Noe 2004). The key claim of predictive processing accounts is that perception is the outcome of a process of hypothesis testing such that the brain routinely optimizes its models of the hidden (external) causes of incoming sensory stimuli in order to generate predictions of its next expected states. Predictive processing accounts locate the material vehicles of conscious experience within the brain, while also affording a strong role to embodiment and sensorimotor skills in perception, because they suggest that agents can improve their predictions by engaging in active inference and systematically altering their sensory inputs (Clark 2013a). Clark argues that on such a model,

systems that know how to perceive an object as a cat are thus systems that, ipso facto, are able to use a top-down cascade to bring about the kinds of activity pattern that would be characteristic of the presence of a cat. […] Perceivers like us, if this is correct, are inevitably potential dreamers and imaginers too. Moreover, they are beings who, in dreaming and imagining, are deploying many of the very same strategies and resources used in ordinary perception. (Clark 2013a: 764)

On the one hand, this suggests that dreaming, but also imagination and hallucination depend on the same mechanism as veridical perception, namely hypothesis-testing and generative models; on the other hand, it may be a new way of making sense of how perception is directly world-revealing in a way often thought to be denied by internalist accounts and of how, via active inference, our brains become “porous to the world” (Clark 2013a: 767). Predictive processing accounts explain the occurrence of dream bizarreness by pointing out that because dreams are largely unconstrained by external stimuli and hence by prediction errors, representational accuracy, for instance of visual dream imagery, is lost during sleep (cf. Hobson & Friston 2012). Moreover, Fletcher and Frith (2008: 52) suggest that

the dream state arises from disruptions in hierarchical Bayesian processing, such that sensory firing is not constrained by top-down prior information and inferences are accepted without question owing to an attenuation of the prediction-error signal from lower to higher levels.

This view thus also offers an explanation of why bizarre occurrences in dreams are often met with uncritical acceptance.

Dreams have also been suggested as a test case for adjudicating between theories that claim that phenomenal consciousness can be divorced from cognitive access (e.g., Block 2007) and those that claim that cognitive access and reportability are necessary for the scientific study of consciousness (Cohen & Dennett 2011). Sebastián (2014) argues that because dreams are experiences, and because during (non-lucid) REM-sleep dreams, the dorsolateral prefrontal cortex as the most plausible mechanism underlying cognitive access is selectively deactivated, dreams provide empirical evidence for the claim that conscious experience occurs independently of cognitive access. A challenge for this view is to explain why dreams nonetheless are often reported upon awakening.

3.2 Dreams, psychosis, and delusions

The second major research program for integrating dreaming into a broader theoretical context is the suggestion of using dreaming as a model of psychotic wake states. The analogy between dreaming and madness has a long philosophical history (Plato, Phaedrus; Kant 1766; Schopenhauer 1847). It is continued in Hobson’s claim that “dreaming is not a model of a psychosis. It is a psychosis. It’s just a healthy one” (Hobson 1999: 44) and Gottesmann’s (2006) suggestion of using dreaming as a neurobiological model of schizophrenia. There is now a lively discussion on the theoretical and methodological implications of dream research for psychiatry (see Scarone et al. 2007; d’Agostino et al. 2013; see Windt & Noreika 2011 as well as the other papers in this special issue) and a number of studies have investigated differences in dream reports from schizophrenic and healthy subjects (Limosani et al. 2011a,b).

Moving beyond the modeling approach, it may also be fruitful to compare dreams and specific wake-state delusions. Gerrans (2012, 2013, 2014) uses a detailed comparison between instances of character misidentification in dreams and delusions of hyperfamiliarity (such as the Frégoli delusion, in which strangers are mistakenly identified as family members, but also déjà vu) to support the claim that anomalous experience, and not just faulty reality testing, plays a role in delusion formation. Importantly, this approach allows him to take not just the similarities, but also the differences between dreams and wake-state delusions seriously. In particular, he suggests that a deeper understanding can only be gained by describing the involvement of the default mode network and its interaction with prefrontal systems in dreams and in wake-state delusions on a case-by-case basis. This humble approach to the comparison of dreams and delusions thus avoids many of the pitfalls of more general, and hence less well-defined, attempts to use dreaming as a model system of standard or altered wake states.

4. Dreaming and the self

The classical problem about the self in dreams concerns the identity between the dream and waking self. Locke (1689) raises the problem of personal identity in sleep in the context of his discussion of Descartes’ (1641) claim that, the self essentially being a thinking thing, we are conscious throughout sleep, and that this is true even when upon awakening, we cannot remember any dreams (for a general introduction, see Olson 2010; Uzgalis 2014). This conception of dreamless sleep is deeply confused, according to Locke, because it threatens to decouple conscious experience from memory. Contra Descartes, he argues that

No man’s knowledge here, can go beyond his experience. Wake a man out of a sound sleep, and ask him, what he was that moment thinking on? If he himself be conscious of nothing he then thought on, he must be a notable diviner of thoughts, that can assure him, that he was thinking: may he not with more reason assure him, he was not asleep? This is something beyond philosophy; and it cannot be less than revelation, that discovers to another, thoughts in my mind, when I can find none there myself […]. (Locke 1689: II.I.19)

By contrast, the proponent of the claim that we are conscious throughout sleep will have to additionally explain why, upon awakening, it does not always seem to us that we were, and why we are only sometimes able to remember dreams. Locke’s denial of unrecalled (but nonetheless conscious) thinking throughout sleep is closely related to his claim that personal identity depends on psychological continuity and memory rather than on unrecalled (but allegedly continuous and conscious) thinking. He invites us to imagine two men sharing one continuously thinking soul and alternating by turns between sleep and wakefulness (Locke 1689: II.I.12). He argues that if one man retained no memory of the soul’s thoughts and perceptions while it was linked to the other man’s body, they would be distinct persons. Despite the continuous presence of thinking, psychological continuity would, in this case, be violated.

Valberg points out that the dream argument, as raised in the context of Cartesian dream skepticism, raises a puzzle about the relation between the subject of the dream (i.e., the dream self) and the sleeping subject who is the dreamer of the dream and who recalls the dream upon awakening (Valberg 2007). He notes that there is no simple way of making sense of the claim that it is I who emerge from a dream or that I was the victim of deception in a given dream. Awakening involves a chasm, a transition between discrete worlds with discrete spaces and times. Here, it does not make sense to say that “the ‘I’ at these times [is] a single individual who crosses from one world to the other” (Valberg 2007: 69).

Vicarious dreams, or dreams in which the protagonist of the dream is not continuous with the dreamer, are particularly puzzling with respect to the identity of the dream self. They may even raise the question of whether the dream self has an independent existence (Rosen & Sutton 2013: 1047). While such dreams bear a superficial similarity to cases in which we imagine being another person, they cannot, according to Rosen and Sutton, be explained in the same manner. They point out that imagining that one is another person involves a process of explicitly framing the imagined person’s thoughts as diverging from one’s own. Here, one retains one’s own perspective in addition to the imagined one. By contrast, in nonlucid dreams, this type of explicit framing is missing and only the perspective of the dream’s protagonist is retained. For this reason, they take the analysis of perspective in dreams and its comparison to perspective in imagination and memory to be an important goal for future research.

Increasing attention has also been paid to the nature of self-representation in dreams. Metzinger (2003, 2009, 2013b; see also Windt & Metzinger 2007) analyzes dreams in the context of the self-model theory of subjectivity. The key claim of the theory is that no such thing as selves exist and that self-consciousness can be analyzed as a particular type of representational content. The theory introduces a set of interdisciplinary constraints for describing self-consciousness and the first-person perspective on the phenomenological, representational, functional and neuroscientific levels of description and attempts to accommodate a number of neurophenomenological case studies. Dreaming plays an important role in this context because in nonlucid dreams, according to Metzinger (2003, 2009), phenomenal selfhood is impoverished as compared to standard wake states. Dreaming involves the experience of a self in a world, but because of the cognitive and mnemonic deficiencies that characterize nonlucid dreams (cf. Hobson et al. 2000), dreamers fail to develop a stable first-person perspective and the phenomenal-functional property of agency is at best weakly instantiated. While dreamers can act upon desires or impulses, they do not experience themselves as a self in the act of deciding, attending or rationally thinking about certain events, and they cannot ascribe this property to themselves. Also, because of dream amnesia, dreams are only weakly integrated with the autobiographical self-model. Rather than being committed to a uniform characterization of phenomenal selfhood in dreams, the theory attempts to accommodate a considerable degree of variability in phenomenal selfhood in dreaming (Windt & Metzinger 2007). In particular, it predicts that lucidity results from a wake-like stabilization of the first-person perspective, enabling dreamers to not only experience themselves as the center of the dream world, but to form a stable conscious model (or what Metzinger 2003: 411–426 calls a “phenomenal model of the intentionality relation”) of their epistemic or agentive relation to the dream world and hence to realize that they are only dreaming.

While Descartes’ dream argument suggests that dreams simply replicate the phenomenology of selfhood that characterizes standard wake states (for a similar view, see Revonsuo 2005), the emerging picture is that the phenomenology of selfhood is in fact more variable in dreams than commonly assumed. The analysis of phenomenal selfhood in dreams may also shed light on different and potentially dissociable dimensions of self-consciousness. It has been suggested that precisely because important dimensions of phenomenal selfhood are missing in dreams, the analysis of self-experience in dreams can help identify the conditions for the emergence of minimal phenomenal selfhood, or the simplest forms of self-consciousness (Blanke & Metzinger 2009). Windt (2010; see also Metzinger 2013b) argues that in certain dreams, self-experience is reduced to pure spatiotemporal-self-location arising independently of the phenomenology of embodied selfhood, suggesting that neither body ownership nor the sense of agency are strictly necessary for self-consciousness. Moreover, if dreams can generally be described as involving the phenomenology of spatiotemporal self-location, this might give rise to a new definition of dreams as immersive spatiotemporal hallucinations during sleep (Windt 2010).

5. Immorality and moral responsibility in dreams

The question of whether dreams are morally significant is importantly related to the epistemological problem of whether I can rule out that I am now dreaming, but also to questions concerning the status of self-experience in dreams and the identity of the dream self. Augustine (Confessions) thought that dreams are not only subjectively indistinguishable from waking life, but also took them to be a cause of moral concern because of their vivid phenomenal character. In the Confessions, he considers dreams in which he engages in sexual acts. What worries him is that these dream images are not faint, as in waking memory, but rather involve pleasure as well as something resembling acquiescence or consent to the act. He famously concludes, however, that the moment of passing from sleep to wakefulness, or vice versa, makes such a great difference that he can return to a clear conscience upon awakening and rest assured that he was not responsible for the acts performed in his dreams.

Three types of arguments might support this conclusion (Matthews 1981). The first is related to the familiar problem of the identity of the dream and waking self (for a general discussion on the relationship between personal identity and ethics, see Shoemaker 2014): if the dream and waking self are not identical, then waking Augustine is not morally responsible for dream-Augustine’s actions. Second, one might think that because the actions performed in a dream do not really happen, they are morally irrelevant. And third, assuming that moral responsibility requires the ability to act otherwise, dreams provide no grounds for moral concern because we cannot refrain from having certain types of dreams. Matthews (1981) argues, however, that none of these responses is available to Augustine. According to Matthews, Augustine believed that in his dreams, he himself experienced genuine pleasure about and also genuinely consented to sexual activity. This rules out the first two arguments, because Augustine also, according to Matthews, thought consent and pleasure to be sufficient for moral responsibility even in the absence of a corresponding physical action. Moreover, Augustine apparently believed that under certain conditions, he could refrain from sinful acts in his dreams, thus blocking the third.

Similar issues have also been raised by a number of other authors. Mullane (1965) takes up Freud’s observation that we often do assume responsibility for the content of our dreams and argues that while we don’t have full control over our dreams, they are not completely involuntary either; rather, as is the case for blushing, considerable effort is required to attain control over our dreams. This is supported by findings on lucid dreaming. While lucid dreaming is a learnable skill, even practiced lucid dreamers are only rarely successful at controlling their dreams, and attempts at dream control often have unexpected results (Stumbrys et al. 2014). Mullane (1966) even argues that under certain conditions, dreams can be considered as actions; at least this question, according to Mullane, is a factual one and not a conceptual absurdity.

Taking lucid control dreams as one’s point of departure, the question of whether our dreams count as actions and whether this is sufficient for moral responsibility may seem oversimplified, perhaps requiring one answer for lucid dreams and another for nonlucid ones. This worry relates to the issue of whether we generally have control even over our nonlucid dreams, as discussed in the context of the imagination view of dreaming. Here, a first question is whether evidence on lucid control dreams provides sufficient grounds for claiming that we have the same type of control over our nonlucid dreams. A second question is whether we really have control even over our waking imaginings, as is widely accepted in the philosophical literature (see section 2.6). Drawing from research on mind wandering, Metzinger (2013a) has recently argued that episodes of mind wandering involve a cyclically recurring loss of mental autonomy, or the ability to deliberately control one’s conscious thought processes. Consequently, they cannot properly be considered as mental actions, but rather should be regarded as a form of unintentional mental behavior. Moreover, because mind wandering makes up a large part of waking mental activity (Schooler et al. 2011), Metzinger argues that rational mental self-control is the exception rather than the rule. If this is correct, then similar issues about cognitive agency and moral responsibility can be raised about dreams and waking thought.

6. The meaning of dreams and the functions of dreaming

6.1 The meaning of dreams

Since antiquity, different ways of interpreting dreams have been the main source of interest for laypeople and psychologists discussing dreaming (Artemidorus’ Interpretation of Dreams and Freudian dream theory are two particularly prominent examples). Historically, the epistemic status of dreams and the use of prophetic and diagnostic dreams was not just a theoretical, but a practical problem (Barbera 2008). Different types of dreams were distinguished by their putative epistemic value. Artemidorus, for instance, used the term enhypnion to refer to dreams that merely reflect the sleeper’s current bodily or psychological state and hence do not merit further interpretation, whereas he reserved the term oneiron for meaningful and symbolic dreams of divine origin.

The practice of dream interpretation was famously attacked by Aristotle in On Prophecy in Sleep. Here, he sharply criticizes the idea that dreams are of divine origin, but allows that occasionally, diagnostic or even prophetic dreams are caused by small affections, which are drowned out in wakefulness and have a more pronounced effect during the quiet of sleep, thus enabling the sleeper to perceive distant events. He adds, however, that such dreams occur mostly in dullards whose minds resemble an empty desert, thus rendering them more susceptible to the subtle movements of the perceptual organs during sleep. As Kroker (2007: 37) points out, this remark was not apt to encourage people to pay greater attention to their dreams. It is thus somewhat ironic that the earliest known systematic account of dreaming also encouraged the view that dreams, as occurrences in sleep, are unobservable and hence not a serious target of scientific research. Later philosophers went even further, typically regarding dreams, if not as a source of deception in Descartes’ sense, then as a source of superstitious beliefs (Hobbes 1651; Kant 1766; Schopenhauer 1847).

In the context of Freudian dream theory, dream interpretation once more takes a prominent role as the royal road to knowledge of the unconscious mind, and again, this is associated with claims about the psychic (as opposed to external or bodily: cf. section 2.5) sources of dreaming.

What we see, then, is that views on the epistemic status of dreams and the type of knowledge (e.g., knowledge about the future, diagnosis of physical ailments, or insights about one’s current concerns) dreams purportedly give rise to changed in tandem with views on the origin of dreaming, which were gradually relocated from divine origins and external sources, via the body, to the unconscious as in Freudian dream theory or the brain as in contemporary theories of dreaming.

Finally, it is important to note that the claim that dreams at least occasionally give rise to personal insights is not sufficient for saying that dreams are intrinsically meaningful or have a hidden meaning requiring special methods of interpretation. Hobson famously argues that dreams are the product of the random, brain-stem driven activation of the brain during sleep (Hobson 1988) and at best enable personal insight in the manner of a Rorschach test (Hobson et al. 2000; Metzinger 2003). A similar account is suggested by Dennett. He notes that even granting that dreams—or rather: dream reports—occasionally have seemingly symbolic content and narrative structure, this does not show them to be the product of authorial intentions. In Consciousness Explained (1991), Dennett introduces the “party game of psychoanalysis” to compare the production of dream narratives to a mindless, aimless game of question-and-answer, governed by simple rules. The point is that dreams might seem highly symbolic and meaningful without thereby being the product of intelligent and deliberate narrative processes (see McGinn 2004 for a defense of the contradictory view that dreams bear the marks of intelligent design). Dennett’s account also sits well with newer accounts involving predictive processing and hypothesis testing (see section 3.1). Finally, even if Hobson’s and Dennett’s accounts are successful in undermining the claim that dreams are inherently meaningful (in the sense of being messages, perhaps, from the unconscious, as in Freudian dream theory), it might still be the case that in certain settings and using certain methods, dream interpretation can be a personally meaningful source of insight and creativity, and Hobson himself has defended such a view (Hobson & Wohl 2005). Whether dream interpretation is a source of insight is at least in part an empirical question that is only beginning to be investigated systematically (see Edwards et al. 2013 for a recent review of the empirical literature and preliminary evidence supporting this claim).

6.2 The functions of dreaming

Asking about the epistemic status of dreams is importantly different from asking about the evolutionary functions of dreaming. Many different theories of the functions of dreaming have been proposed and the debate is still very much ongoing. A first important distinction is the one between the functions of the different stages of sleep and the functions of dreaming. Well-documented functions of REM sleep include thermoregulation and the development of cortical structures in birds and mammals, as well as neurotransmitter repletion, the reconstruction and maintenance of little-used brain circuits, the structural development of the brain in early developmental phases, as well as the preparation of a repertoire of reflexive or instinctive behaviors (Hobson 2009). According to protoconsciousness theory, REM sleep plays an important role in foetal development by providing a virtual world model even before full-blown consciousness is developed (Hobson 2009: 808).

Numerous studies have investigated the contribution of sleep to memory consolidation, with different sleep stages apparently promoting different types of memories (Diekelmann et al. 2009; Walker 2009). However, only a few studies have investigated the relationship between dream content and memory consolidation in sleep (for an overview, see Nielsen & Stenstrom 2005). While dreams rarely involve episodic replay of waking memories (Fosse et al. 2003), there is preliminary evidence suggesting that performance in a virtual navigation task improves following daytime naps, and that the effect is especially strong in subjects who report task-related mentation (Wamsley & Stickgold 2009, 2010; Wamsley et al. 2010).

It is also important to note that different theories on the functions of dreaming may be more or less tailored to certain types of dreams. Two prominent theories focus on bad dreams and nightmares. It has long been thought that dreaming contributes to emotional processing and that this is particularly obvious in the dreams of nightmare sufferers or in dreams following traumatic experiences (e.g., Hartmann 1998; Nielsen & Lara-Carrasco 2007; Levin & Nielsen 2009; Cartwright 2010; Perogamvros et al. 2013). Based on the high prevalence of negative emotions and threatening dream content, the threat simulation theory suggests that the evolutionary function of dreaming lies in the simulation of ancestral threats and that the rehearsal of threatening events and avoidance skills in dreams has an adaptive value by enhancing the individual’s chances of survival (see Revonsuo 2000; Valli 2008).

Finally, even if dreaming and general, and specific types of dream content in particular, were found to be strongly associated with particular cognitive functions, it would still be possible that dreams are mere epiphenomena of the periodic activation of the brain during sleep. They might, as (Flanagan 1995, 2000) puts it, be the spandrels of sleep. Yet, this would not prevent them from serving a derivative psychological function and from being personally meaningful experiences.

A particular problem for any theory on the function of dreaming is to explain why a majority of dreams are forgotten and how dreams can fulfill their putative function independently of recall. Crick and Mitchinson (1983) famously proposed that REM sleep “erases” or deletes surplus information and unnecessary memories, which, if true, would suggest that enhanced dream recall might actually undermine the effectiveness of the memory-erasing system. Another problem is that the ability to recall, and perhaps even to experience, dreams can be lost selectively and independently of other cognitive deficits (Solms 1997, 2000). This suggests that it is at least as important to understand which cognitive functions are independent of dreaming as to understand those that are not.

An evolutionary perspective can also be fruitfully applied to the specific phenomenology of dreaming. According to the vigilance hypothesis, natural selection disfavored the occurrence of those types of sensations during sleep that would compromise vigilance (Symons 1993). Hallucinatory sounds, but also smells or pains would, according to Symons, distract attention from the potentially dangerous surroundings of the sleeping subject. Consequently, the vigilance hypothesis predicts that they only rarely occur in dreams without causing awakening. By contrast, because most mammals sleep with their eyes closed and in an immobile position, vivid visual and movement hallucinations during sleep do not comprise vigilance and thus can occur in dreams without endangering the sleeping subject. If this is correct, then focusing on the stuff dreams are not made of may be at least as important for understanding the function of dreaming as developing a positive account.

7. Conclusions

Throughout this entry, it has become clear that there is an intimate connection among the questions asked about dreaming in different areas of philosophy such as epistemology, philosophy of mind, and ethics. But it has also become clear that scientific evidence from sleep and dream research can meaningfully inform the philosophical discussion, and that it has often done so in the history of philosophical theorizing about dreaming. It is an important constraint on any philosophical theory of dreaming—insofar as it takes itself to be applicable to real-world dreams—that it also be empirically plausible. Though this point has sometimes been outright denied (e.g., Malcolm 1956, 1959), it has increasingly come to be accepted by contemporary philosophers working on dreams. An important perspective for the future is that aside from being empirically informed, philosophical theories of dreaming should also strive to be empirically informative—for instance by clarifying the precise role that dreaming can play in the context of general theories of consciousness and subjectivity and by suggesting specific contrast conditions, such as the contrast between dreams and waking mind wandering, delusions, and hallucinations. Further integrating the fields of philosophy of mind and philosophy of cognitive science with scientific sleep and dream research consequently is an important goal for the future.


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I want to thank Regina Fabry and two anonymous reviewers for helpful comments and constructive criticism on an earlier version of this manuscript. And as always, I am greatly indebted to Stefan Pitz for his support.

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Jennifer M. Windt <jennifer.windt@monash.edu>

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