Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience

First published Fri Dec 16, 2011; substantive revision Mon May 23, 2016

Philosophers have always lived among people who could not see, walk, or hear; who had limited mobility, comprehension or longevity, or chronic illnesses of various sorts. And yet philosophical interest in these conditions was piecemeal and occasional until the past hundred or so years. Some of these conditions were cited in litanies of life's hardships or evils; some were the vehicle for inquiries into the relationship between human faculties and human knowledge [see SEP entry on “Molyneux's Problem”]. But the treatment of disability as a subject of philosophical interest is relatively new.

The lack of attention to “disability” or “impairment” in general may have a simple explanation: there were no such concepts to attend to until 19th century scientific thinking put variations in human function and form into categories of abnormality and deviance. Once such categories were established, it became possible to talk, and generalize, about “the disabled,” and philosophers have done so for various purposes (Hacking, 1990; Davis, 2002, Ch. 4)). The resurgent political philosophy of the second half of the last century, preoccupied with eliminating or reducing unearned disadvantages, tended to treat disability as a primary source of those disadvantages, to be addressed with medical correction or government compensation. Somewhat later, social philosophers began to see disability as a source both of discrimination and oppression, and of group identity, akin to race or sex in these respects.

In some ways, disability looks much like sex or race as a philosophical topic. It concerns the classification of people on the basis of observed or inferred characteristics. It raises difficult threshold questions about the extent to which the classification is based on biology or is socially constructed. And yet the strong philosophical interest in some of the characteristics on which the disability classification is based appears to accord them a significance that many would deny to the distinguishing characteristics of sex or race.

Consider, for example, the question of how well-being is affected by the characteristics on which the disability classification is based. There is little interest now in the question of whether, in a world without discrimination, blacks or women would do better or worse on various metrics of well-being than whites or men. In contrast, there is considerable interest in this question when the subject is people with disabilities.[1] Some philosophers and disability scholars claim that the answer is no different than in the case of race or sex: to the extent that disability reduces well-being, it is because of the stigma and discrimination it evokes. In contrast, other philosophers claim that disability is fundamentally different from race and gender in that it necessarily reduces well-being: even in a utopian world of non-discrimination, people with blindness, deafness or paraplegia would be worse off than their able-bodied counterparts. This is but one example of the many ways that disability generates philosophical debate about some of our most familiar ethical, political, and epistemological concepts.

This introductory entry will outline the prevailing definitions and models of disability, and discuss the epistemic and moral authority of the experiences and self-reports of people classified as disabled.

1. Definitions of Disability

The definition of disability is highly contentious for several reasons. First, it is only in the past century that the term “disability” has been used to refer to a distinct class of people. Historically, “disability” has been used either as a synonym for “inability” or as a reference to legally imposed limitations on rights and powers. Indeed, as late as 2006, the Oxford English Dictionary recognized only these two senses of the term (Boorse, 2010). As a result, it is hard to settle questions about the meaning of “disability” by appeal to intuitions, since intuitions may be confused by the interplay between older, ordinary-language definitions and newer, specialized ones.

Second, many different characteristics are considered disabilities. Paraplegia, deafness, blindness, diabetes, autism, epilepsy, depression, and HIV have all been classified as “disabilities.” The term covers such diverse conditions as the congenital absence or adventitious loss of a limb or a sensory function; progressive neurological conditions like multiple sclerosis; chronic diseases like arteriosclerosis; the inability or limited ability to perform such cognitive functions as remembering faces or calculating sums; and psychiatric disorders like schizophrenia and bipolar disorder. There seems to be little about the functional or experiential states of people with these various conditions to justify a common concept; indeed, there is at least as much variation among “disabled” people with respect to their experiences and bodily states as there is among people who lack disabilities. Indeed, some have questioned, in part because of this variation, whether the concept of disability can do much philosophical work (Beaudry, 2016).

At the same time, defining “disability” solely in terms of social responses like stigmatization and exclusion does not distinguish disability from race or sex (Bickenbach, 1993)—a result that some disability scholars might welcome, but that begs, or obscures, an important question. The challenge of distinguishing “disability” from other concepts, without taking a simplistic or reductive view of it, has been taken up by various specialized definitions.

Two common features stand out in most official definitions of disability, such as those in the World Health Organization (2001; 1980), the U.N. Standard Rules on the Equalization of Opportunities for People with Disabilities, the Disability Discrimination Act (U.K.), and the Americans with Disabilities Act (U.S.) : (i) a physical or mental characteristic labeled or perceived as an impairment or dysfunction (in the remainder of this entry, we will refer to such characteristics as “impairments,” without assuming the objectivity or validity of that label) and (ii) some personal or social limitation associated with that impairment. The classification of a physical or mental variation as an impairment may be statistical, based on the average in some reference groups; biological, based on a theory of human functioning; or normative, based on a view of human flourishing. However classified, impairments are generally seen as traits of the individual that he or she cannot readily alter. Just what makes a condition a trait or attribute of an individual is obscure and debatable, but there seems to be agreement on clear cases (Kahane and Savulescu, 2009). Thus, poverty is not seen as an impairment, however disabling it may be, nor is tasteless clothing, even if it is a manifestation of impaired fashion-sense rather than scarce income. On the other hand, diseases are generally classified as impairments, even though they are rarely permanent or static conditions. Diseases that are not long-lasting, however, such as the flu and the measles, do not count as impairments.

The notion of a limitation is broad and elastic, encompassing restrictions on such “basic” actions as lifting one's arm (Nordenfelt, 1997; compare Amundson, 1992: actions “at the level of the person”); on more complex physical activities such as dressing and toileting; and on social activities like working, learning or voting (see Wasserman, 2001).

The characterization of both features is disputed. Several scholars have challenged the prevailing view of impairment as objective and biologically grounded (Shakespeare, 2006; Davis, 2002; Tremain, 2001; Amundson 2000). There is also disagreement about the conceptual and practical need for two categories of limitations, one involving personal activity, the other social or political participation—“disability” and “handicap,” respectively (Wright, 1983; Edwards, 1997; Nordenfelt, 1997; Altman, 2001). But the most controversial issue in defining disability is the relationship between the two. At one extreme are definitions that imply, or are read to imply, that biological impairments are the sole causes of limitation. The definitions in the World Health Organization's 1980 International Classification of Impairment, Disability, and Handicap, and the Disability Discrimination Act (UK) have been interpreted this way. At the other extreme are definitions that attribute the limitations faced by disabled people solely to “contemporary social organization,” such as the definition given by the Union of the Physically Impaired Against Segregation (UPIAS, 1976). Such definitions appear to treat impairments merely as “evocative” causes—as conditions that are subject to exclusion and oppression. They have been criticized for ignoring disadvantages that cannot be attributed to social attitudes and practices (Terzi, 2009, 2004; Shakespeare, 2006). But in characterizing disability in terms of exclusion, these definitions need not deny that impairments have undesirable aspects, such as pain or discomfort—merely that those aspects are not within the scope, or part of the meaning, of disability.

In-between are definitions which assert that individual impairment and the social environment are jointly sufficient causes of limitation. Perhaps the best-known example is the WHO's International Classification of Functioning, Disability and Health (ICF, 2001), which emphasizes that disability is a “dynamic interaction between health conditions and environmental and personal factors.” Such interactive definitions predominate in current law and commentary on disability; even the ICIDH and DDA can be interpreted as compatible with this approach. The ADA is generally seen as adopting an interactive approach to disability, although it contains an amalgam of definitional features.

2. Models of Disability

These different understandings of the relationship of impairment to limitation inform two contrasting approaches to disability, often described as opposing models: the medical and social. The medical model understands a disability as a physical or mental impairment of the individual and its personal and social consequences. It regards the limitations faced by people with disabilities as resulting primarily, or solely, from their impairments. In contrast, the social model understands disability as a relation between an individual and her social environment: the exclusion of people with certain physical and mental characteristics from major domains of social life. Their exclusion is manifested not only in deliberate segregation, but in a built environment and organized social activity that preclude or restrict the participation of people seen or labelled as having disabilities.

In their extreme forms, the medical and social models serve to chart the space of possible relationships between impairment and limitation more than to reflect the actual views of individuals or institutions. (A variety of more formal models, described in Altman, 2001, graphically represent the causal complexity of disability.) The medical model is rarely defended but often adopted unreflectively by health care professionals, bioethicists, and philosophers who ignore or underestimate the contribution of social and other environmental factors to the limitations faced by people with disabilities.

A variety of social models are embraced by disability scholars and activists in and outside of philosophy. The “British social model” associated with the UPIAS (1976) definition quoted above appears to deny any causal role to impairment in disability. As suggested, however, that denial may best be seen as limiting the scope of “disability” to the effects of exclusion and discrimination (Beaudry, 2016), or as rhetorical, countering the prevailing emphasis on biological causes of disadvantage. More moderate versions of the social model maintain the emphasis on social causes while insisting on the interactive character of disability (e.g., Bickenbach 1993; Altman, 2001). Taking the poor fit between atypical embodiment and standard environments as their starting point, they treat disability as an interaction between biological and social causes, denying causal priority to either.

Implicit in the UPIAS definition of disability are two ways that society imposes limitations on disabled people, corresponding to two distinct strands of the social model. When the UPIAS claims that society “excludes” people with impairments, this suggests the minority group model, which sees people with impairments as a minority subject to stigmatization and exclusion. On this view, the main reason people with disabilities encounter hardship is because they suffer discrimination along the same lines as racial or ethnic minorities. Accordingly, civil rights protections and anti-discrimination laws are the proper responses to disability (e.g., Hahn, 1997 and Oliver, 1990). Perhaps the most familiar expression of the minority-group model is found in the preamble to the Americans with Disabilities Act, which describes people with disabilities as “a discrete and insular minority”—an explicit invocation of the legal characterization of racial minorities.

The UPIAS also asserts that “contemporary social organization” fails to “take into account” people with disabilities. This suggests the human variation model, according to which many of the challenges faced by disabled people do not result from their deliberate exclusion, but from a mismatch between their characteristics and the physical and social environment. On this view, disability is “an extension of the variability in physical and mental attributes beyond the present—but not the potential—ability of social institutions to routinely respond” (Scotch and Schriner, 1997). This view of disabilities as human variations is closely related to the view that disability is a universal human condition (Zola, 1989) or shared human identity (Davis, 2002, Ch. 1). The claim that disability is universal can be taken as nothing more than a prediction that we will all acquire familiar disabilities at some time in our lives. But that claim is better construed as one about the nature of disability; as maintaining that all human beings have physical or mental variations that can become a source of vulnerability or disadvantage in some settings.

These two versions of the social model are not incompatible, differing mainly in emphasis. The discrimination stressed by the minority group model generally leads to, and is expressed in, the societal failure to accommodate people with various differences. In some contexts, it is appropriate to analogize people with disabilities to racial minorities; in others, it is important to reject a dichotomy between disability and normality and treat impairments as continuous variations. If one goal of social policy is to remove discrimination and its enduring disadvantages, another is to encompass the full range of human variation in the design of the physical environment and social practices.

Although the social model, in one version or another, is now the dominant legislative, social-science, and humanities paradigm for understanding disability, stronger versions, particularly the British Social Model, have been subject to extensive criticism. Some argue that an adequate conceptualization of disability requires a recognition of impairments as an objective basis for classification, to distinguish disability discrimination from other types of discrimination (Bickenbach, 1993). Several critics argue that extreme versions of the model implausibly deny or understate the role of impairment itself as a source of disadvantage (Anastasiou and Kauffman, 2013; Terzi, 2009, 2004; Shakespeare, 2006). Others, however, contend that this criticism is misplaced, because the British Social Model does not deny the importance of impairments but rather seeks to restrict the notion of "disability" to social exclusion and oppression (Beaudry, 2016).

Another objection is that the social as well as the medical model both rest on a false dichotomy between biological impairments and social limitations. There are two versions of this objection. One maintains that disability is a complex phenomenon, in which biological impairment and social exclusion are deeply interwoven and difficult to tease apart (Martiny 2015; Anastasiou and Kauffman, 2013). The other version of this objection rejects the treatment of impairment as a (strictly) biological phenomenon. “Impairment,” the argument goes, is no less a social construction than the barriers faced by people so classified. Claims that there is a stable biomedical basis for classifying a variation as an impairment are called into question by shifting classifications; by the “medicalization” of some conditions (shyness) and “demedicalization” of others (homosexuality). Moreover, the social environment appears to play a significant role in identifying and, arguably, in creating some impairments (dyslexia) (Cole, 2007; Shakespeare, 2006; Davis, 2002, Ch 1; Tremain, 2001; Amundson, 2000). What counts as an impairment may depend on which variations appear to be disadvantageous in familiar or salient environments, or on which variations are subject to social prejudice: Less-than-average height may be more readily classified as an impairment than greater-than-average height because the former is more often disadvantageous in environments designed for people of average height, or because it is generally seen as less desirable. For such reasons, it is difficult to establish the objectivity of the impairment classification by appeal to a clear and undisputed biomedical norm. Amundson (2000) goes so far as to deny that there is any biological basis for a concept of functional normality—a claim emphatically rejected by Boorse (2010).

The disputed objectivity of the impairment classification is adduced by Tremain to argue that impairments “must no longer be theorized as essential biological characteristics (attributes) of a ‘real’ body on which recognizably disabling conditions are imposed” (2001, 632). Rather, she argues that being classified as having an impairment is an integral part of the social process of disablement. Such criticism parallels the debate among gender theorists about whether we can distinguish sex from gender on the ground that gender is socially constructed whereas sex is not. [See the SEP entry on “Feminist Perspectives on Sex and Gender.”]

Thus, some critics conclude that it is at best oversimplified and at worst futile to distinguish biological impairments from social limitations, or to attempt to separate and compare the biological and social contributions to the disadvantages of people with disabilities But even those who believe that the impairment classification can be defended in biomedical terms recognize that impairments are not merely biologically-defined atypicalities but also markers for discrimination—discrimination that may be reinforced by the conviction that it is a response to objective biological attributes. Anita Silvers (2003) has argued that a it is both possible and desirable to construct a neutral, value-free model of disability, using strictly descriptive criteria to identify atypical forms and functions, thereby allowing scholars with conflicting views to debate their normative and policy significance.

2.1 Models, Decisions, and Policies

The medical and social models suggest (although they do not imply) different views about the impact of disability on well-being, and different views about how disability is relevant to reproductive decisions, medical interventions, and social policy. Those who accept a social model of disability regard the association between disability and well-being as highly contingent, mediated by a variety of environmental and social factors. They question conceptions of well-being that give a central role to the possession or exercise of the standard array of physical and mental functions, as those conceptions imply, or are often taken to imply, that well-being is precluded or diminished merely by the absence or limitation of those functions. [see SEP entry (forthcoming) on “Disability: Health, Well-Being, and Personal Relationships”] As a result, they generally see the disadvantages of disability not only as externally caused, but as less formidable than they appear to people who view disability in largely biomedical terms. These differences are reflected in the conflicting assessments of life with disabilities found in the bioethics and public policy literature on the one hand, and disability scholarship on the other (contrast Brock, 2005 with Goering, 2008).

The different models of disability also seem to favor different responses to disability. The medical model appears to support the correction of the biological condition or some form of compensation when that is impractical; the minority group model appears to favor measures to eliminate or compensate for exclusionary practices and recognize their injustice; the human variation model appears to favor reconstruction of the physical and social environment to take into account a wider range of differences in human structure and function. Importantly, such reconstruction may also be supported by the minority group model as an antidiscrimination measure, since that model views exclusionary environments and practices as the characteristic form of discrimination against people with disabilities. The human variation model may just make explicit the appropriate social response to disability in a society without exclusion or discrimination.

But claims about the causes of disadvantage do not always yield straightforward prescriptions for their remediation (Wasserman, 2001; Samaha, 2007). In some cases, medical or surgical “correction” may be the most effective way to escape discrimination; if correction is not appropriate, that is because it reinforces discriminatory attitudes and practices. The proper response to the disadvantages associated with disability depends not only on causal attributions but also on moral judgments about responsibility, respect, justice. The debates over cleft lip surgery and breast reconstruction after mastectomy are not only about the comparative importance of biological and social factors in making the treated conditions disadvantageous. They also concern whether those interventions are justifiable uses of scarce medical resources, and whether they are complicit with suspect norms (Little, 1998), as in the case of skin-lighteners for people of color (Asch, 2006).

3. The Experience of Disability

Although it is subject to dispute and qualification, the distinction between biological impairment and social limitation is relevant to many normative and policy issues, especially those concerning the choice between measures that modify the disabled individual or alter his environment. In this section, we consider the role of that distinction in addressing the critical question of how the experiences of people with disabilities are relevant to those issues. The disability rights movement has long complained that the perspectives of people with disabilities are too often ignored or discounted. The slogan that served as the title for James Charlton's 1998 book, Nothing About Us Without Us (Charlton, 1998; Stone, 1997) has often been invoked to demand the inclusion of people with disabilities in policy making and research concerning disability. The slogan suggests that they have both a unique perspective to bring to those activities and a right to take part in them. But what is the “us” to whom the slogan refers? Do persons with different disabling traits have enough in common to claim that there is a “disability perspective” to bring to bear on policy and research?

Such questions are best approached in terms of the two aspects of impairments recognized by most disability theorists: as structural or functional atypicalities, and as markers for discrimination. These two aspects of impairment roughly correspond with two distinct types of disability experience:

  1. The experience of living with an atypical structure or function—factual or phenomenological information about living with different physical, sensory, cognitive, or affective functions than does the majority of the population.
  2. The experience of facing stigma and discrimination based on one's structural or functional atypicalities.

There may be more commonalities in one kind of experience than the other, and greater relevance to specific research or policy issues. Further, the epistemic and moral authority of statements made by people with disabilities about their experiences may vary with the kind of experience they describe.

3.1 Facts and Phenomenology

The first type of experience involves the particularities of living with atypical embodiment or functioning. Questions about this kind of experience are often framed as what-is-it like questions: “What is it like to” have moderate or profound deafness? use a wheelchair to move? be legally or totally blind? be unable to hold or manipulate objects with one's hands? have atypical speech? have a learning disability or a mood disorder? Such questions are sometimes requests for factual information about how one manages tasks with one's disability—“how do you do x if you are in a wheelchair?” In other cases, they are requests for self-reports about the phenomenological experience of being in a particular state—“what does it feel like to get around in a wheelchair?”[2]

People accustomed to their impairments may have little to report about “what it feels like” to have them, in part because absence of a function or a sense may not be something they experience as such, and because their atypical ways of functioning or sensing may not, in themselves, be affect-laden—it is what they do unself-consciously, until it is called to their attention. The experience of atypical functioning or sensing may be far more salient for someone getting to know a person with a disability than it is to the person herself. It may also be highly salient to a person who is recently impaired, trying to function without limbs or senses that she used to have. But the experience of loss and frustration becomes less salient with time, peer and professional support, as she gets more immersed in going about day-to-day life.[3]

Even when people with disabilities do report about what “it is like” to have their impairments, those reports may vary considerably. The most obvious reason is that there is tremendous variation in the sensory, physical and functional states of which “impaired” or “disabled” people are capable. A person who can see but not hear has very different sensory experiences from a person who can hear but not see, who in turn has very different experiences from a person who can see and hear but cannot move his legs. This point should be obvious, but it is worth stressing, because it underscores the fact that the labels “disabled” and “impaired” do not track a distinct phenomenological experience.

Moreover, even two people with the same impairment label might give different reports of how they do things or how they feel as they go about life with their impairment This could be due partly to differences in the character or extent of their impairment—not all people labeled “deaf” are deaf to the same extent. Further, their experience of life with an impairment may vary with the kinds of activity they engage in, and how they regard their impairments as affecting their opportunities for self-fulfillment. Opportunities in turn may be influenced by all the factors, unrelated to impairment, that affect everyone: the family and neighborhood in which one grows up or now lives; one's disposition or personality; the financial resources at one's disposal; or one's education, religion, sex, or race. Moreover, people's experience of living with an atypical function sometimes may be difficult to distinguish from their experience of stigma and discrimination.

Despite these differences, the experiences of living with diverse impairments have one thing in common—they are likely to be ignored, or given insufficient weight, in the design of the physical and social environment. Unlike new acquaintances, planners and policy makers may pay little attention to “what it is like” to get around with atypical functions. In constructing buildings, transit systems, and work schedules, they often fail to listen carefully to what people with various impairments say about their experiences of daily living. Those experiences cannot be adequately simulated by spending a day in a wheelchair or walking around with a blindfold—indeed, the confusion and disorientation that nondisabled people experience in simulating impairments is a very misleading guide to the way people with disabilities experience and negotiate the activities of daily living. Moreover, in learning about the experiences of living with atypical functions, planners and policy makers cannot take any single impairment as representative. The experiences of people with different impairments differ as much from each other as they do from the experiences of nondisabled people. As the human variation model emphasizes, the very diversity of impairments poses an important challenge for an inclusive society.

3.2 Stigma and the Social Construction of Disability

If “baby boomers” who have not learned electronic communication become a despised, as opposed to merely statistical, minority, and if, as a result, they become cut off from friends and acquaintances who rely on email and social media for long-distance communication, and who dismiss them as luddites and fogeys, they will learn something about the social construction of disability. They will learn even more if they cannot cross the “digital divide” or can do so only at considerable economic cost or cognitive strain, or if they are still regarded as luddites and fogeys even when they do. They will experience something of the stigma and discrimination that cut across impairments.

The second type of disability experience, then, is of attitudinal barriers to ordinary activity that are facts of life for people with disabilities. According to the social model, which highlights these barriers, the “disability experience” that links people with cystic fibrosis to people with epilepsy, learning disabilities, or cerebral palsy is one of having to deal daily with the largely negative responses of others. These negative responses involve several elements. The most discussed is overt stigmatization and discrimination: being treated as a social outcast, losing out on jobs, friends, or partners, because other people do not want to interact with a person with a disability, or enduring grossly inadequate accommodation because reasonable accommodation is thought too costly or troublesome.

But there are also less overt ways that society makes living with a disability difficult. Simply being different from the majority of the population, in a way that the majority makes salient, can make people with disabilities feel isolated or alienated. This experience is similar to those not only of other stigmatized minorities, such as African-Americans or LGBTs, but of people with atypical characteristics who may not form a distinct political or cultural minority but are nonetheless constantly reminded of their difference. For example, people whose spouses have died and older adults who are single for whatever reason may feel excluded from social events intended for couples, or face the presumption that they have a (usually opposite-sex) partner (“And what does your husband do?”).

It is in the social construction of disability that we move from the particularity of any one disability toward the common social experiences of people with disabilities. Stigma, discrimination, and imputations of difference and inferiority are all parts of the social experience of disability. Being greeted at a party or a conference not by “hello” but by “do you need any help?” and having virtually every aspect of one's interests, tastes, and personality attributed to one's disability are also parts of the disability experience. As one writer describes it, if he cooks it is because he doesn't want to be seen in public; if he eats in restaurants it is because he can't cook (Brickner, 1976). Disability becomes a “master status,” preventing people from playing any adult social role and eclipsing sex, race, age, occupation, or family (Goffman, 1963; Gliedman and Roth, 1980). Many nondisabled people assume that people with disabilities won't make good partners and cannot or should not become parents (Safilios-Rothschild, 1970; Shakespeare, 1996; Asch and Fine, 1988; Wates, 1997). People with disabilities are perceived to be globally helpless based on their need for assistance with some facets of daily life (Wright, 1983), fueling the conviction that they are unable to render the help needed for successful partnership or parenting. Most nondisabled people, after all, are not told that they are inspirations simply for giving the correct change at the drugstore. Perhaps there would not even be a “disability experience” in a world without the daily indignities, barriers, and prejudices that characterize life with disability almost anywhere.

Just as there is great variation in how members of racial and sexual minorities experience stigmatization, however, disabled people's experience also varies. In claiming that the experience of stigma unites disabled people, we must be careful to acknowledge those differences. For example, a major source of variation is whether the disability is visible or invisible (Davis, 2005; Banks and Kaschak, 2003). Whereas visibly disabled people must deal with being instantly classified as “different” and inferior, people with invisible disabilities are often placed in the stressful and exhausting position of having to convince others that they are “really” disabled and not asking for special treatment. The alternative is to keep quiet and forgo needed assistance, which carries other costs, such as the stress of keeping a secret or trying to decide if a particular disclosure is safe (Schneider and Conrad, 1985; Davis, 2005).

In addition, disabled people who are also members of other stigmatized groups may experience a distinct kind of stigmatization that is “more than the sum of its parts.” For example, disabled women are disproportionately affected by society's obsession with body image: they must confront not only sexism and prejudice against disabled people, but a particularly virulent combination of the two that stigmatizes women who do not fulfill a narrow ideal of feminine beauty (Crawford and Ostrove, 2003) or are thought incapable of performing the stereotypically female role of nurturer (Asch and Fine, 1988). In a similar way, both African-Americans and disabled people are frequently stereotyped as dependent or ineffectual. And so African-Americans who are also disabled face a particularly high burden in overcoming these stereotypes.

Moreover, some would argue that to the extent that people with disabilities have distinct and common experiences, they are due to embodiment as well as stigmatization. A disputed but much-discussed strand of feminist philosophy holds that the experience of being female differs in important ways from being male, regardless of cultural position, discrimination, or political and economic power. On this view, women differ in some important ways from men because of the biology of femaleness and of childbearing, and those differences should be seen as gateways into philosophical and moral understanding (Whitbeck, 1972). Discussions of “race” are similarly complex: is the experience of “race” entirely socially constructed, or is there a biological component after all? (See generally APA Newsletter on the Black Experience, 2000). Debates about the experience of disability can be enriched by understanding these debates about other minority groups, even if disability differs in significant respects. On the one hand, the biological reality of many significant impairments affects the experience of those with the impairments. On the other hand, different impairments shape experience in very different ways. Clearly, “the experience of disability” is complex, and usefully compared to the experience of other stigmatized minorities.

3.3 Epistemic and Moral Authority

The first-hand experience of stigmatization may confer two sorts of authority on people with disabilities. The first is epistemic. There should be “nothing about us without us” because any discussion of, or research into, disability not informed by that experience would likely be inaccurate and misguided. For example, discussions of well-being that do not take into account the perspective of disabled people may assume that their level of happiness or satisfaction is much lower than it in fact is, or that it is lower mainly because of difficulties directly attributable to impairments rather than to attitudes and social barriers. This is but one application of the more general issue of first-person authority: the extent to which people have special or privileged knowledge of their own mental states and experiences [see SEP entry on “Self-Knowledge”]. Although this is a subject of great controversy in the philosophy of mind, there is widespread agreement that, at minimum, first-person ascriptions of mental states carry a defeasible presumption of correctness.

But there is an additional epistemic reason for according significant weight to the first-hand reports of people with disabilities. The observations and judgments of all stigmatized minorities are frequently discounted, but people with disabilities face a distinct handicap. There is a powerful, pervasive tendency among philosophers, social scientists, and laypeople to dismiss their self-appraisals as reflecting ignorance, self-deception, defensive exaggeration, or courageous optimism [see SEP entry on “Feminist Perspectives on Disability”, Sec. 3]. Giving those self-appraisals heightened attention and deference may be an appropriate and effective way to counteract or correct for that tendency.

Epistemic authority thus provides a good reason for encouraging disabled people to speak about their experiences and for nondisabled people to listen when they do. But there is another reason as well: people who suffer stigmatization, disrespect, and discrimination have a moral claim to be heard that is independent of the accuracy of their testimony. Even if someone lacking those experiences could convey them accurately and vividly, she would not be an adequate substitute for those who had the experiences. The experience of stigmatization, like the experience of other forms of oppression, calls for recognition, and thereby may impose a duty on those fortunate enough to have avoided such experiences to listen closely to those who have had them. To settle for second-hand accounts of those experiences or to ignore them altogether seems disrespectful to the victims. The conviction that the oppressed have a right to a hearing lies behind the recent proliferation of Truth Commissions and tribunals. It also helps explain the frustration of crime and torture victims denied an opportunity to tell their stories, even when their oppressors receive punishment without their testimony. Though few disability advocates would demand a tribunal for the routine indignities of life with disabilities in developed countries, most demand a far greater voice in the media depiction of people with disabilities, in research about them, and in policies concerning or affecting them.

At the same time, there are several dangers associated with placing too much emphasis on the moral privilege of victims of stigmatization. First, there is the danger of defining people by their oppression. The victims may not want to be spokespeople or witnesses, or not for very long; they may want to move on. It is important to recognize both the moral authority of victims to testify and their prerogative to decline that role.

Second, emphasizing the moral privilege of the stigmatized may obscure differences in the experience of stigmatization, and in the sort of authority it confers. As we have seen, there is tremendous variation in the ways that disabled people experience stigma, although certain broad generalizations may hold.

Third, in conferring privilege on those who experience particular forms of oppression, we may obscure or slight the shared vulnerability of all human beings. For example, Ruth Anna Putnam champions social improvements for women and other disadvantaged people but is wary of a particularist feminist theory of justice, which may fail to emphasize commonality of human experience and human need (Putnam, 1995). Might a similar wariness be warranted for disability? If, as Scotch and Schriner (1997) point out, we had a philosophy and public policy based on common human needs, we might be able to get rid of “special needs” and focus on multiple methods of meeting common ones, with no negative shadow cast on any of those varied methods.

Further, when only the marginalized are asked to share their “experiences,” the experiences of the dominant group are left unarticulated, unexamined, and unexplored. Once we argue that people with disabilities need to be heard in bioethics and policy debates as they describe the values and difficulties in their lives, we should also be arguing for experiential accounts of the dominant group. When dominants examine their own experiences, they might see similarities to as well as differences from those who have been marginalized. Both groups might benefit as a result.

3.4 Whose Experience and Judgments?

The final danger in emphasizing the experience of stigmatization is that it will exclude the voices of many people classified as having disabilities but who do not see themselves as disabled or stigmatized. People with disabilities include millions who do not tend to speak in social model terms and who may not typically speak to their social, as opposed to their medical situation (although they do file discrimination complaints under the ADA when they think it appropriate). People who have back problems, cancer histories, Parkinson's disease, Type II diabetes, stroke, emphysema, forms of dementia, mood disorder, schizophrenia, substance abuse, or HIV do not typically count themselves as part of the “disability community.” The case for including such people is based in part on the shared experience of socially-mediated exclusion. For example, a person who has difficulty breathing because of emphysema and cannot visit friends because she cannot walk to a distant bus stop is disadvantaged by social organization in an analogous way to the person with paraplegia who can't meet friends in inaccessible restaurants.

Such inclusiveness, however, requires an acceptance of diverse attitudes and opinions. Even if the majority of people we would classify as having disabilities perceived societal mistreatment and institutional barriers to be more oppressive than their diagnoses, not all of them would share that view or agree on the best response. African-Americans have different views about affirmative action, and many women do not believe that the option of legal abortion is essential for women's full participation in society. Disability theorists can find it frustrating that most nondisabled people in bioethics dispute their claims about their experience, but those theorists must respond to whatever challenge to the social model is posed by people with disabilities who see their condition, and not society, as the major impediment to their living rewarding lives. Many people with both congenital and acquired disabilities have said that they don't want cures but do want societal change, but that hardly warrants the charge that Christopher Reeve wasn't speaking from his experience of disability when he argued that what he wanted was “cure” and not social change (Johnson, 2003; Shakespeare, 2006).

3.5 The Place of Disability Experience in Bioethics and Public Policy

Let us grant that a large number of people with particular impairments will say at least some similar things about life with those impairments, especially concerning stigma and discrimination. We are still left with complex questions about what uses to make of such experience in shaping public policy.

Clearly, one critical role is educational. Forty years ago plenty of well-meaning men wondered why women objected to having doors held for them, or to the exclusive use of male pronouns to refer to humans generally. Language, social conventions, and many aspects of life have changed because men listened to women's accounts of how seemingly innocuous acts felt, and of why those acts held not-so-innocuous implications for their self-realization and social participation. “Why is that person on crutches so offended when I ask him if he's traveling alone?” says the flight attendant who doesn't ask the same question of his nondisabled seatmate. Why doesn't the man who is blind let it go when a cab driver won't take his money? A nondisabled person may think it would be great not to pay the outrageous fare as the meter climbs in New York City traffic.

The educational value in explaining the daily experience of stigma goes far beyond “sensitivity training.” In making nondisabled people aware of how much of “the burden of disability” arises from routine, seemingly innocuous social interactions, people with disabilities can help to convince them that the direct or internal effects of their various impairments are not nearly as bad as imagined.

Taking the experiences of disabled people seriously may also have important implications for health policy. As is apparent in many bioethical and policy discussions, most nondisabled people, including health professionals, imagine the experience of disability to be far worse than reported by the disabled themselves (Basnett, 2001 and Gill, 2000). This gap is not explainable solely by the limited contact between the two groups. In developing a plan for Medicaid rationing in Oregon in the early 1990s, nondisabled people ranked treatments to sustain the lives of people with quadriplegia as of very low priority because of their presumed low quality of life (Menzel, 1992); people with quadriplegia complained that they had been left out of the surveys and that their appreciation of their lives had not informed the ranking process. Such serious policy errors might have been avoided by a recognition that people with disabilities had the same epistemic authority as nondisabled people to assess the quality of their lives.

The varied experiences of functioning with an impairment may have a more modest role to play in policy deliberations than the common experiences of stigma and discrimination. But that role is still an important one. In designing buildings, transit systems, and other public and private facilities, and in establishing norms of conduct in schools and workplaces, we need to know a lot about how people with atypical functions get around and get along. It is not enough to ensure that the width of a doorway exceeds the width of a standard wheelchair; it is also important to find out about the preferences of wheelchair mobilizers before and after they enter a building. This kind of information is no different from that routinely elicited from nondisabled people in designing facilities. But it requires the representation of people with a wide array of impairments, and it requires respectful attention to the minutiae of their daily lives.


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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]


We want to thank the participants in the Workshop on Disability: Bioethics, Philosophy, and Public Policy (January 18–19, 2007) for enormous help in framing the issues discussed in this entry. In addition, we have received invaluable editorial assistance from Dorit Barlevy, Ari Schick, and William Chin.

Copyright © 2016 by
David Wasserman <dtwasserm@gmail.com>
Adrienne Asch
Jeffrey Blustein <jblustein@ccny.cuny.edu>
Daniel Putnam <daniel.putnam@yale.edu>

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