Disability and Justice

First published Thu May 23, 2013

Among the topics in philosophy and disability, justice has received the lion's share of attention. This is in part because justice, often regarded as the “first virtue of social institutions” (Rawls 1971, 3), is central to the evaluation of social policies and public institutions. But it is also because disability has been seen by political philosophers and disability scholars as posing serious challenges to contractarian and contractualist theories of justice: to theories based on hypothetical agreement, mutual advantage, or reciprocity.

Disability also presents difficult issues as a social or group identity – as a central part of the way an individual understands, presents, or values herself. This aspect of disability has been made salient by the civil rights movement that established disability as an important category in antidiscrimination law. Theories that assess justice in terms of the distribution of resources or opportunities have been criticized for failing to take adequate account of such identities. But the embrace of social identity as a component of justice can be equally problematic.

Disability is of particular interest for justice because of the way in which it juxtaposes two basic and powerful senses of injustice: first, the treatment of some people as moral, social, or political inferiors on the basis of irrelevant characteristics; second, the creation, perpetuation, or simple failure to correct disparities between individuals in income, wealth, health, and other aspects of well-being on the basis of morally irrelevant factors. These two broad categories of injustice – roughly, disrespect and distributive inequity – correspond closely to Nancy Fraser's influential distinction between recognition and redistribution (1995) as alternative responses to the problem of injustice. Recognition seeks to secure equal respect for individuals to whom it has been denied; redistribution seeks to correct unfair disparities in advantages of various kinds. The relationship and comparative importance of these two forms of injustice have been the subject of considerable discussion (Anderson 1999; Fraser 2001, 1996; Honneth 1992).

This entry is organized as follows: Section 1 will discuss disability in therms of these two broad types of injustice. Sections 2 and 3 will examine the implications of different models of disability for the distinction between redistribution and recognition. Section 4 will then examine the treatment of disability in contemporary theories of distributive justice. It will explain how the environmental and social character of disability has been largely overlooked by contractarian and egalitarian theories, not so much because of their distributive focus, but because of their narrow focus on one aspect of disability – functional limitation – to the neglect of exclusionary attitudes and practices. Section 4 will conclude by discussing recent efforts to rectify this neglect, describing several ways in which distributive justice theorists have sought to take account of environmental and social barriers and to address claims for recognition. These efforts include broadening the metric for just distributions to encompass respectful relationships and social practices; arguing that a just distribution on such broader metrics can be attained more effectively and appropriately by modifying the physical and social environment than by redistributing resources among individuals; and adopting outcome standards that do not require strict equality on any metric but rather the reduction or elimination of disrespectful inequalities. Section 5 will discuss a major issue in the recognition of disability: the relationship of disability identity to various approaches to justice, where “identity” is understood as a part of an individual's self-understanding or self-presentation.

1. Disability, Recognition, and Redistribution

A tenet of the disability rights movement is that the two types of injustice mentioned above – disrespect and distributive inequity – are related. People with disabilities have long been treated as moral and social inferiors. Routinely, they have been denied jobs for which they are highly qualified because they have been considered incompetent, or because employers have not been comfortable with their presence in the workplace. Often, people with certain disabilities have been consigned to segregated institutions and facilities because they have been regarded as incapable of making decisions or caring for themselves, or because others in the community did not want to interact with them.

These forms of disrespect and distributive inequity are associated with very concrete material inequalities. In 2009, almost 20 years after the passage of the Americans with Disabilities Act, the employment-population ratio of people with disabilities in the U.S. was 19.2%, compared to 64.5% for persons without a disability (Bureau of Labor Statistics, U.S. Department of Labor, 2010). Based on data from 1996–1999, researchers estimate that 47.4% of working-age adults who experienced poverty for a year or more had at least one disability (Fremstad 2009).

The economic disparities are largely the result of exclusion and stigmatization; of what Fraser calls “misrecognition” (2007). At the same time, the distributive injustice faced by people with disabilities heightens their exclusion and stigmatization. As Gideon Calder (2010, 62) asserts, “in particular, internally diverse ways, people with disabilities have been on the end of a kind of pincer movement between Fraser's two impediments to parity; maldistribution and misrecognition.”

If the forms of injustice facing people with disabilities are similar to those facing other stigmatized minorities, the corrective measures in the case of disability may appear to blur the distinction between recognition and redistribution. Whereas securing equal recognition for racial, religious, or sexual minorities generally does not require significant financial outlays, some of the actions and policies necessary to secure the equal respect or recognition of people with disabilities cost money, and therefore involve redistribution of resources. That is, the costs of avoiding discrimination on the basis of race or sex are usually negligible, non-existent, or even negative, in so far as employers benefit in the long run from ending discriminatory practices. In some cases, just treatment for people with disabilities requires significant additional resources and expenses.

These costs need not be understood as compensation for the alleged deficits of people with disabilities. They would have to be acknowledged even if disabilities are seen merely as physical or mental characteristics differing from those of a majority of the population. In any society whose physical structures and social practices are designed for average or typical members, people with disabilities will be disadvantaged just because of their minority status.

A similar point has been made by feminist scholars, who have pointed out the “structural discrimination” of workplaces and public settings designed exclusively for men. The expenses of additional restrooms, stalls, or pumping stations do not compensate women for their deficiencies; they accommodate differences ignored in a society that saw a woman's place as in the home (Wendell 1996; Wasserman 1998, 178–179).

Disability scholars and activists have also argued that the costs of including people with disabilities in all aspects of social, political, and economic life have been greatly exaggerated and are rarely a significant factor in rectifying injustice.[1] Where those costs are substantial, they usually reflect past injustice – the expense of installing ramps in a new building is trivial; the failure to have done so is an injustice, to which the greater costs of retrofitting are attributable.

Moreover, the treatment of stigmatized groups as social and political inferiors, even if officially repudiated, is embodied in the structures and practices of the society. As feminists have long pointed out, job requirements and workplaces have been designed for men, and often place women at significant disadvantage (Wendell 1996, 89). Physical structures and social practices have also been designed solely for “able-bodied” people, and disability scholars have pointed out the disadvantages created by such structural bias – a claim that underwrites the demand for reasonable accommodation that is now a standard feature of disability discrimination law.

And yet the rectification of such structural injustice may raise more difficult issues for people with disabilities than for women, because there is greater uncertainty and potential for disagreement about the extent of the changes that are required to treat people with disabilities as social and political equals. The range and variety of physical and mental differences within a society raise issues of distributive justice that have no obvious analogue for other stigmatized groups. A “gender-neutral” environment can be readily conceived, and achieved at modest cost. In contrast; disability scholars and activists have not specified what it would mean to achieve an “ability-neutral” environment – one that was no more advantageous to people with some physical and mental characteristics than others. And it seems likely that questions about the extent to which justice requires particular environmental features would arise even in a society with no history of invidious attitudes or practices toward people with disabilities, as it does for people with minority religious practices (see Sec. 2).

Justice for people with disabilities, then, appears to raise some issues of distribution that justice for some stigmatized groups does not. Yet the need for redistribution hardly reduces the importance of recognition in achieving justice. Indeed, the complex, disputed relationship between the two makes disability a significant challenge for theories of justice.

2. Models of Disability and Their Implications for Justice

“Disability” is typically defined in terms of two elements: (i) a physical or mental characteristic labeled or perceived as an impairment or dysfunction, and (ii) a significant personal or social limitation associated with that characteristic. The relationship between these two elements – and the role of the environment in mediating them – is a core issue in the conceptualization of, and social response to, disability. The medical model treats disability as an individual physical or mental characteristic with significant personal and social consequences. In particular, it sees the limitations faced by people with disabilities as resulting primarily or solely from their impairments. By contrast, the various social models see disability as a relationship between individuals and their social environments: physical and mental characteristics are limiting only or primarily in virtue of social practices that lead to the exclusion of people with those characteristics. This exclusion is manifested not only in deliberate segregation, but in built environments and social practices that restrict the participation of people regarded as having disabilities (see SEP entry on Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience).

In their extreme forms, which treat the impairment or environment (respectively) as the sole cause of personal and social limitation, the medical and social models have few, if any, defenders. Rather, they mark the limits of possible relationships between impairment and limitation. Almost all writers on disability acknowledge some role for both the impairment and the environment in causing limitations; the disagreement largely concerns the assessment of their comparative contribution, and their interaction. Most scholars who embrace some version of the social model acknowledge that impairments – generally but not universally understood as deviations from species-relative statistical norms – can be sources of discomfort and limitation even in the absence of disadvantaging social practices. These scholars would argue, however, that such adverse effects are far less damaging than social exclusion, are greatly magnified by hostile environments, and could be significantly reduced by more inclusive environments. The medical model is less often explicitly defended than unreflectively adopted – by health care professionals, bioethicists, and philosophers who ignore or underestimate the contribution of social and other environmental factors to the limitations faced by people with disabilities. Even among these groups, however, there is a growing awareness of the environmental contribution to disability and a partial embrace of the social model (Cureton and Brownlee 2009).

To the extent that it is held by anyone in unalloyed form, the medical model of disability would not deny that disability raises issues of justice; indeed, that model might give support to the view that the disadvantages perceived as inherent to disability raise some of the most urgent claims of justice (Barclay 2011). But the model would tend to see the justice required in terms of medical correction or material compensation – though it might also support social and environmental measures seen as alleviating some of the “sequelae” of impairment. In contrast, the social model strongly favors social reconstruction over medical intervention or cash subsidies. Its prescription is not narrowly distributive: social reconstruction is not a good allocated to specific individuals with disabilities. It is, rather, a public good – more accessible structures and more inclusive practices can be enjoyed by a wide variety of people with and without disabilities. But such reconstruction also helps to achieve a fairer distribution of tangible and intangible goods, particularly social and economic opportunities.

Some critics accuse social model theorists of assuming that any disadvantage caused by the social environment is ipso facto unjust (Samaha 2007). This assumption would reflect an oversimplified view of the relationship between causing disadvantage and creating injustice. The fact that social structures or practices cause disadvantage does not imply that there is a duty of justice to correct or compensate for the disadvantage. That will depend on the costs of alleviating it, and – under most theories of justice – a comparison with the advantages and disadvantages that would result from alternative social arrangements. Thus, for example, choosing to spend the bulk of a municipal arts budget on a concert hall rather than an art museum may disadvantage those who cannot hear. But that disadvantage, although caused by a social decision, is not necessarily unjust. That will depend, inter alia, on the availability of non-auditory forms of aesthetic experience and the comparative costs of building the museum instead. To take another example, placing ramps and elevators in new high-rise buildings is relatively inexpensive and beneficial to most users, whereas placing them in 19th century walk-ups is difficult and expensive; holding public meetings or events in buildings with ramps and elevators has negligible costs, whereas moving an existing business from a building that lacks them to one that has them may be very expensive (Samaha 2007; Wasserman 2001).

The difficulty of inferring injustice from socially caused disadvantage is clear in contexts where greater social provision secures incremental advantage. In such contexts, the question of how much is just will not always have an obvious answer. For example, it would at least marginally benefit wheelchair-users to have additional restricted parking spaces, but we could hardly infer an injustice from the fact that an institution provided N rather than N + 1 such spaces. Intuitively, the allotment should be proportionate to the number of wheelchair users in the community or at the facility, but that number may be uncertain, and a range of spaces would likely satisfy any proportionality requirement.[2] In deciding how many spaces are enough, we would receive no guidance from the indisputable fact that any disadvantage or advantage in this context would have social causes.

Conversely, the fact that social arrangements do not cause or contribute to a disadvantage does not insulate it from claims of justice – the failure to alleviate that disadvantage may be unjust on plausible accounts of justice. Thus, although many “natural” disasters like Hurricane Katrina owe much of their destructive impact to social arrangements, it is plausible that the state's duty to support the victims of hurricanes and tsunamis is not contingent on its responsibility for causing or exacerbating them (Wasserman, 2001).[3] Indeed, as we discuss below, various forms of luck egalitarianism do not distinguish between disadvantages caused versus merely not corrected by society's institutions, provided that the relevant disadvantages are equally severe and equally unchosen by those disadvantaged.

Nevertheless, the causal claims made by social-model theorists are relevant to justice in several ways. First, as suggested above, for most theories of justice, the mere fact that the social environment can be modified in ways that alleviate the disadvantages associated with impairment places demands for their alleviation within the scope of justice - as claims that a theory of justice must consider and weigh. Second, the fact that those disadvantages are caused by social arrangements is relevant for those theories that regard society as having a stronger duty not to create or aggravate disadvantages than it has to prevent or correct them (Wasserman 2001). Finally, alleviating the disadvantages attributable to prejudice or stigma will enjoy priority on any theory of justice that treats disadvantage resulting from prejudice or stigma as a greater injustice than innocently-created disadvantage.[4]

Beyond a shared concern with the social causation of disability, different versions of the social model emphasize different features of the exclusionary structures and practices (see SEP entry on Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience). The minority group model regards people with impairments as a stigmatized minority group. It holds that the main reason people with disabilities encounter special hardships is that they face discrimination akin to that faced by racial or ethnic minorities. The human variation model holds that many of the challenges faced by disabled people do not result from deliberate exclusion, but from a mismatch between their characteristics and the physical and social environment. These two versions of the social model differ mainly in emphasis. The discrimination stressed by the minority group model generally leads to, and is expressed in, the societal failure to accommodate people with stigmatized differences. Yet the failure to fully accommodate people with various differences, from extreme height to intellectual impairment, does not necessarily arise from stigma. But often, disparities in access that were initially caused by resource or technological limits are maintained by stigma. For example, an employer's initial purchase of communications technology inaccessible to blind or deaf employees may be explained by the fact that accessible technology had not been developed at the time of purchase. But those historic facts can hardly explain the employer's refusal to include modestly priced accessibility features when purchasing upgrades a decade later.

Both versions of the social model require the removal of barriers and practices serving to exclude people with disabilities, and the reconstruction of the environment to more fully include them. Under a minority-group model, these measures are dictated primarily by a demand for recognition, and for the correction of past misrecognition – the deliberate and negligent exclusion of people with disabilities from every aspect of social, political, and economic life. The human variation model also treats reconstruction as a form of recognition, but with a different emphasis: to recognize people with disabilities not as members of as a “discrete and insular” minority created by exclusionary practices, but as individuals who simply differ as a matter of degree from population norms for one or more physical or mental characteristics. The purpose of reconstruction is not so much to end specific exclusionary practices as to create a more inclusive physical and social environment.

The demand for greater inclusiveness is less categorical than the demand to eliminate discrimination. Although any environment can be made more inclusive, none can be fully inclusive for everyone (Barclay 2010). This is not necessarily because, as Barclay, following Shakespeare (2006), claims, the inclusionary features required for one impairment often conflict with those required by another. Such conflicts may be minor, temporary, and remediable. The problem is more general: 1) for many characteristics, from height to mathematical aptitude, one “size” does not fit all; 2) providing different sizes increases fit for a wider range of variation, but at increasing cost (albeit less than often assumed); and 3) it is frequently impractical, and may arguably be unjust, to ensure that everyone is equally well-or ill-fitted; it may, for example, be too expensive to ensure that left-handed or extremely tall individuals suffer no inconvenience in being statistical minorities. Full inclusion, like universal design, is an ideal – one that cannot be fully achieved, and that must be compromised in the partial satisfaction of other legitimate claims.

Even if it would be impossible or unreasonable to achieve full inclusion through wholesale changes in the physical or social environment, modest changes could significantly increase inclusion at little cost. Some examples come from a study of environment modification for autistic individuals (Owren 2013). Many people with autism face significant barriers to taking part in routine social activities: they find such familiar stimuli as applause, light touching, and deodorant as highly aversive; they must be explicitly instructed about social expectations because they cannot “read” most facial expressions or social clues. The study's author recognizes that the “neurotypical majority” cannot be expected to give up applause, light touching, or even deodorant, let alone nuance in communication:

What would be lost? Large parts of what may be some of the most treasured areas of communication: the art of innuendo, the double meaning at the heart of much comedy, irony, the implied meaning at the heart of so much poetry, … flirtation and “feeling each other out before committing to something that cannot be retracted (23-24).

At the same time, the author points out that the majority could often gain from more modest accommodations. “Many neurotypicals might profit from being more explicit and from others being more explicit, as can be illustrated by the extensive focus in couples therapy on getting partners to state their needs and expectations more explicitly, not relying on other to pick up on ‘vaguely described, implied, or unspoken behavioral expectations’.” (92). The author suggests (111) that it may be feasible to develop “best practices”: “strategies for enhancing accessibility and reducing sensory issues in a larger scale” without unduly burdening the majority:

One strategy might be to incorporate into Universal design the practice of providing access to low stimulation areas in mainstream settings. Another might be to create more public acceptance of autistic behaviors like stimming [5], which seem to help many autistic people reduce the impact of aversive sensory stimuli. … (111)

Such strategies clearly involve tradeoffs, but those tradeoffs would involve small economic and social costs for a majority to achieve large gains in inclusion for a minority. The claim that it is impossible to achieve, or even understand, full inclusion for people with autism does not deny that there is significant injustice in their current state of social isolation.

Clearly, the human variation model would not attribute all the problems of environmental fit to deliberate or negligent exclusion.[6] It would regard some of the most manifestly inadequate provisions for people with disabilities as arising from a complex mix of contempt, fear, indifference, financial pressure, technological limitation, and bureaucratic inertia. It would see the exclusion of people with disabilities as differing more in degree than kind from the exclusion of people who do not speak the majority language, lack a formal education, or possess obsolete skills. Although it may be easier to “correct” a lack of education or job training than a physical or psychiatric disability (but not always), the latter as well as the former can be understood in terms of a poor fit between the resources of the individual and the demands of the social environment.

The challenges for social models of disability for justice may seem greatest for intellectual and psychiatric impairments, as well as for complex physical impairments such as fibromyalgia, multiple chemical sensitivity, and other conditions that radically and unpredictably affect energy, stamina, and functioning (Wendell 1989, 1996; Davis 2005). First, these conditions strikingly display both aspects of impairment, as markers for stigma and as sources of functional limitation (see SEP entry, Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience): cognitive and psychiatric impairments evoke some of the strongest prejudice and all present some of the most difficult functional limitations, e.g., on the capacities to engage in practical reasoning, to recognize the intentions and attitudes of other people, or to function at all in common environments or under typical work schedules. Second, some theorists contend that these conditions pose more of a challenge for the social model than even the most severe physical disabilities, in part because the measures required for greater inclusion are not as concrete or tangible, and may demand greater imagination to envision and implement.[7]

Although significant practical work has been done in educational and workplace inclusion, philosophers have been daunted by the challenge of social reconstruction for cognitive disabilities. Thus Jonathan Wolff, who generally favors such reconstruction – which he calls “status enhancement” – as the most respectful intervention, asks “What would it mean to change the world so that people with cognitive disabilities and other people were equally able to find a worthwhile place in the world? Can we even imagine what this would be?” (2009a, 407). Many rights and privileges are thought to require a certain level of cognitive capacity, e.g., the right to vote or contract (Wikler 1979). Similarly, most jobs are structured to require regular hours, uninterrupted activity, undivided attention, and general sociability.

How much should a society modify these requirements or restructure these activities to include people with various intellectual, psychiatric, and complex physical disabilities? A total relaxation of such requirements would impose large, even “unduly burdensome” costs. However, many modifications to promote the inclusion of people with significant cognitive impairments would also benefit people with typical cognitive function: simplified task explanations, warning labels, news copy, and jury instructions. Many accommodations employers are already making to increase flexibility and reduce stress, from individually-tailored schedules to telecommuting, would ease the entry of people with these disabilities into the workplace. Philosophers need to pay more attention to practical and policy work that applies social models of disability to people with intellectual, psychiatric, and complex physical impairments (e.g., Biklen 1992; Block 2006; Connor, et al. 2008; Hehir 2002).

As discussed later in this Entry, there is sharp disagreement about whether individuals with the most severe intellectual impairments qualify as subjects of justice. But even if individuals with the most substantial intellectual impairments are regarded as subjects of justice, what justice demands for them, and of them, may be uncertain or disputed. Nussbaum (2009) contends that the equal citizenship of those individuals requires that they be enabled to exercise such political rights as voting and jury service through appropriate surrogates. Wasserman and McMahan (2012) question whether those rights could be meaningfully exercised by surrogates for individuals with the most severe intellectual disabilities.

Some philosophical intimation of a social model approach to cognitive disability can be found in Dan Wikler's 1979 essay, “Paternalism and the Mildly Retarded.” Wikler held that the category of cognitive disability was socially constructed by the competence thresholds set for important social activities, such as signing a contract or voting in an election. But although society chooses, in this sense, who will be cognitively impaired, it does not have unlimited flexibility, since there can be significant social costs in altering those thresholds. The issue, Wikler concluded, was ultimately one of justice; of fairly distributing the burdens of setting thresholds that will be too high for some or too low for others. Yet Wikler questioned whether justice would require, or even permit, the kind of modifications necessary for significantly greater participation. Writing two decades later, Wolff cited Wikler in stating, “the fact is that what makes much of modern life possible now relies on binding and enforceable contracts that in turn assume a certain level of intellectual competence. To change the world so that such a bar is lowered would have tremendous costs” (2009a, 407).

This pessimism has prevailed in the years since Wikler wrote, and there has been little philosophical attention to practical possibilities for the inclusion of people with cognitive impairments. Although there have been interesting discussions of this issue in the context of education (e.g., Howe 1996; Ladenson 2005; Veatch 1986), the general issue has tended to be dealt with in summary fashion. (Exceptions include Hartley 2009a; Silvers and Francis 2009; Wong 2007, 2009.) Thus, for cognitive disabilities, Wolff emphasizes “targeted resource enhancement” rather than status enhancement, arguing for an entitlement scheme that gives people with cognitive disabilities maximum possible control over an individual budget for personal assistance and social support (2009a, 407–413). He does regard some forms of status enhancement, notably antidiscrimination measures, “as essential,” but he accepts Wikler's conclusion that broader changes in social practice carry “intolerable costs” (413).

In their influential book From Chance to Choice, Buchanan et al. (2000) repeat the assertion that there would be excessive social costs in reconstructing society to permit the full participation of people with significant cognitive impairments. They compare the reconstruction of society for greater inclusion with a family decision to play only the card games that a young child can understand; they contend that just as adults will tire of a constant game of Go Fish, the society will be “dumbed down” if it refashions itself to fully include people with cognitive impairments.

Although the meaning of inclusion is debatable, and different forms of inclusion will have differing value for different people, the card-game analogy oversimplifies the challenge. To present inclusion as a zero-sum allocation is to dumb down the incredibly complex task of rearranging society to respect and nurture all its members. The analogy assumes that every activity must be done by everyone, which is plainly false. A more apt analogy to organized social activity would be an assortment of games that can be played by different combinations of people in different ways. Some games could be played by everyone; others could be modified to include cognitively impaired people in a way that preserved the interest of non-disabled players; some would be beyond the reach of people with certain cognitive impairments. But even the most cognitively gifted individuals could not participate in all games – the sheer amount of training and practice required to master some of them, and the considerable time and energy many of them require, would preclude participation in many or most. Indeed, society may function better if people have varying aptitudes for, and interests in, different activities. (A similar criticism of the card-game analogy is offered by Wong (2007), who recounts how her brother with Down enriched rather than impoverished family life.)The fact that a smaller set of activities may be available to people with cognitive impairments need not present a problem, if it does not result in their social isolation or deny them intellectual challenges (Parens & Asch 2000, 25–26 [quoting Philip Ferguson, personal correspondence]). But ensuring their participation may require society to refashion itself in significant ways.

It is by no means clear, however, that such refashioning would impose the “intolerable costs” feared by Wolff. Social inclusion does not require, for example, that individuals with significant cognitive impairments be able to make binding contracts in every domain of law and business; it requires that competence standards be graduated to reflect the complexity of specific tasks so that those individuals are not categorically excluded – ironically, a suggestion made more than two decades ago by the authors of the card-game metaphor (Buchanan and Brock 1989). Social model theorists know full well that impairments – physical as well as cognitive – differ from skin color in that they are sometimes relevant to what people can do, as are such other attributes as education and income. But that feature of impairment hardly precludes social reconstruction. Indeed, the most effective rebuttal to the card-game metaphor may be found in the practical work that already has been done in educational and workplace inclusion (e.g., Biklen 1992; Block 2006; Hehir 2002; McGuire, et al. 2006).

Justice for people with psychiatric disabilities has received far less attention than justice for people with intellectual disabilities. This may be in part because the threshold issue of what constitutes a mental disability or disorder is far more controversial than the question of what constitutes an intellectual disability. Although there are different ways of defining intellectual disability (see SEP entry on Cognitive Disability and Moral Status), and continuing debate over the meaning and measure of intelligence, there is general agreement that human beings vary significantly in how well they can perform cognitive tasks. There is no similar agreement about the mental functions implicated in psychiatric disability. Thomas Schramme (2010) argues that the lack of agreement results from a lack of clarity about the very notion of mental function. More broadly, some critics have questioned the very notion of “mental illness,” claiming that it falsely medicalizes problems of living that all people face or conflates social and biological judgments (Szasz 1960; Bolton 2008).

We can, however, apply a social model to psychiatric disability without resolving these conceptual and definitional issues or reaching agreement on the objectivity of psychiatric diagnosis and classification. We can recognize that those labeled as “mentally ill” are among the most stigmatized people in our society, and that their stigmatization causes grave harm. We can also recognize that modestly greater flexibility in workplace requirements and social expectations would greatly facilitate the participation of many or most individuals so labeled (Goering 2009).

A similar claim can be made concerning complex physical disabilities. Although perhaps less stigmatized than people with psychiatric disabilities, people with conditions such as fibromyalgia and multiple chemical sensitivity are needlessly excluded. There are modest costs associated with more inclusive, “chemical free” environments, for example, but they are costs well worth playing to enable to access and participation of a significant group of people. We must, of course, balance competing demands on limited resources. But if we regard social inclusion as an important good, we will give it significant weight. Because we valued the healthy development of young children, we incurred significant costs to shift from lead to latex paint. A similar kind of tradeoff is appropriate if we seek to obtain the inclusion of people with various disabilities. Although we cannot specify the balance to be struck, it seems less important to allow perfume in workplaces and public accommodations than to permit people with multiple chemical sensitivities to go to work, concerts, plays, and restaurants.

3. Justice, Reconstruction, and Reasonable Accommodation

As suggested in Sec. 1, the disabling impact of social arrangements may be relevant to the type and scope of interventions that justice requires. In stressing the impact and the malleability of the environment, social-model theorists have shifted the focus from claims for correction and compensation to claims for reconstruction. In doing so, they have framed the problems of justice posed by disability in terms of the more general problem of fairly accommodating human variations.

Consider a society with much greater height variation than our own. Even if very tall or short stature was neither stigmatized nor functionally limiting, that society would, on any plausible theory of justice, be obliged to construct its public spaces, buildings, and vehicles to accommodate them. They would be treated unjustly if the construction of the physical environment took no account of them, especially if the failure to do so caused them significant disadvantage. Of course, the extent to which their height differences needed to be taken into account would depend on the distribution of height in the society, as well as on its level of resources and competing needs. No plausible theory of justice would require that the built environment be equally accommodating to all heights, if such a thing were possible, but all would condemn some environments as unjustly restrictive. What this case suggest is that the demand for a more inclusive environment should not be seen in terms of compensating individuals, tall or impaired, for their internal deficits, but of accommodating as wide as possible a range of human variation.

Even if environmental reconstruction should not be seen as compensating for deficits, a question remains about the extent to which it should be seen as a matter of redistribution or recognition. This question is raised by the legal requirement of “reasonable accommodation.” Under the ADA and ADAAA, accommodations include ramps, elevators, texts in multiple formats, sign-language interpreters, flexible work schedules, and job coaches or assistance. The failure to make reasonable accommodation for disabled employees or users of public facilities constitutes, with some notable exceptions, discrimination (ADA, 1990). There is no reference to that concept in the laws banning discrimination on the basis of race, sex, or age; the term was introduced in cases addressing claims of religious discrimination (see, e.g., Karlan and Rutherglen 1996). Like practitioners of minority religions, but unlike women, people of color, or older people, people with disabilities must be “reasonably accommodated.”

For the human variation model, reasonable accommodation requires changes in the physical and social environment, from installing ramps to modifying work schedules and altering the location of meetings and classes. Often, such changes require little more than flexibility and imagination. But some of these changes can be expensive; at some point, the cost may make further change unreasonable. On this approach, the legislative understanding of such accommodation as a matter of distributive justice is reflected in the qualifying use of “reasonable” and the exemption of accommodations that would impose an “undue” burden or hardship on the entity required to make accommodations (Wasserman 1998).

But it is also possible to see reasonable accommodation as a requirement of equality for people with disabilities without recourse to a theory of distributive justice (e.g., Crossley 2004; Karlan and Rutherglen 1996). Accommodating religious practices may be expensive in various ways, but no one regards doing so either as compensating religions for their deficits or as achieving a just distribution of resources among religions. Indeed, the first rationale would appear to violate the state's constitutionally-mandated neutrality among religions. Rather, because the state is required to treat religions and their adherents as legitimate and valuable, it disfavors rules and practices that interfere with religious observance. Whether or how non-believers should receive the same kind of constitutional deference is a matter of dispute (see Tebbe 2011). Somewhat similarly, a state that regards people with disabilities as legitimate and valuable citizens will disfavor arrangements that interfere with their participation. Treating people with disabilities as equals, like treating religions as equally legitimate, may require unequal provisions. In the case of disability as well as religion, how much additional provision is required is indeterminate, not for lack of a complete theory of justice to specify the amount or proportion, but because the demands of equal respect are indeterminate.

Consider, for example, the question of how much it is reasonable for a small business to spend on an elevator or ground-floor space to be able to employ a talented IT technician with emphysema. To answer that question, we might do better to decide what respect for that person demands, based in part on current social practice and convention, rather than to consult a comprehensive but abstract theory of distributive justice. In any case, it may be unreasonable to expect a determinate answer; it may be appropriate to rely on a fair procedure to select among a range of plausible outcomes. But by the same token, the utter lack of accommodation in many workplaces and public facilities is clearly unjust on any plausible theory of justice.

The debate over the accommodations available for a minority group may often reflect a complex mix of claims concerning redistribution and recognition. For example, people in wheelchairs are sometimes provided restaurant access only through the service entrance. The restaurant owners often claim that such access is quite reasonable, since the service entrances already have ramps – a distributive consideration; disability advocates claim that however convenient it may be for the owners, such access treats wheelchair users as second-class customers – a claim of misrecognition. In this case, it may seem that the recognition claims clearly trump the conflicting distributional claims. But this will not always be the case.

Again, resolving such conflicts may involve the same kind of judgment employed in debates over accommodating minority religious practices. It may be that some jobs cannot be made available to people whose Sabbath falls on Friday or Saturday, because (in light of demographic considerations) the essential functions of those jobs require working on those days. But although the “essential function” standard appears objective and determinate, it is often subject to distributive considerations, e.g., about staffing requirements and business volume. A refusal to sustain the slightest loss of revenue to accommodate any minority religion might be a distributive injustice; a willingness to sustain greater losses to accommodate Jewish and Adventist employees than Muslim ones might involve misrecognition as well--the failure to treat Islamic practice as having the same value as other religious practices. Similarly, the violation of the ADA involved in refusing to display the same flexibility for disabled as pregnant employees arguably constitutes both distributive injustice and misrecognition.

The uncertainty about the distributive character of reasonable accommodation suggests that in the case of disability, it may often be difficult to sharply distinguish claims for redistribution and recognition.[8] Recognition may require redistribution, and redistribution should aim at securing recognition. Asch (1989) has gone even further, arguing that recognition must precede redistribution; that if people with disabilities were recognized as equals, capable of significant contributions to others, society would be more willing to adopt appropriate measures for redistribution and reconstruction.

4. Disability in Contemporary Theories of Justice

The resurgence of philosophical interest in justice is often dated to the publication of John Rawls' A Theory of Justice in 1971. Although that was only two years before the passage of the Rehabilitation Act of 1973, embodying a social model of disability (see SEP entry, Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience), it was well before the academic reconceptualization of disability as a social phenomenon. For the 25 years after A Theory of Justice, many justice theorists tacitly accepted the medical model (e.g. Dworkin 1981; Daniels 1985). They treated disability as an individual physical or mental limitation causing serious disadvantages of various kinds. Disability thus posed a problem for justice theories based on mutual advantage, hypothetical agreement, or material or social equality. People with disabilities did not appear to offer reciprocal advantages; they complicated the task of reaching a hypothetical agreement on the basic structure of society; and they made the goal of equality seem impossibly demanding.

By the late 1990s, some mainstream political philosophers were becoming acquainted with social models of disability, and some disability theorists were gaining a hearing among political philosophers. Some philosophers sought to modify distributive theories of justice to take account of the social and environmental character of disability; others cited the failure of those theories to take appropriate account of disability as one reason to reject exclusively distributive approaches.

Before describing these developments, it is useful to distinguish two types of distributive theories. Modern social contract theories, notably Rawls' (1971), seek to determine the fair terms of social cooperation to which individuals (generally with limited knowledge of their own situations) would agree; they argue that certain distributive principles would be among those terms (Rawls' “difference principle” may be the most familiar). Rawlsian theories are procedural in one sense: they regard any distribution as just if and only if it is consistent with the distributive principles that would be chosen by those individuals. Disability-oriented criticism of these theories has focused on their assumptions about the individuals who are eligible to make a hypothetical contract or participate in the cooperative scheme it establishes. Critics have argued for the eligibility of people with disabilities or their representatives to participate in the contract-making processes and resulting cooperative scheme, rather than about the validity of the principles or rules yielded by that process (Richardson 2006; Silvers and Francis 2005; Stark 2007). The second type of theory is primarily interested in outcomes; in the kind of end state a just society should strive for: either equality on some outcome metric or the reduction of certain kinds of inequality. Here, disability-informed criticism has favored outcome metrics that take account of the social contribution to disability-related disadvantage, and standards for just distributions that are oriented toward disrespectful inequalities (Anderson 1999; Nussbaum 2006a; Wolff 2009b).

4.1 Disability and Contemporary Social Contract Theories

Within social contract theories, a distinction is often drawn between contractarian/Hobbesian and contractualist/Lockean accounts (see SEP entry on Contractarianism). One way to characterize this distinction is in terms of the parties' motivation and interaction. In the former, they are narrowly self-interested and hard-bargaining; in the latter, their self-interest is tempered or balanced by their commitment to justifying themselves to others, and they proceed by deliberating rather than by bargaining. This distinction is often formulated in terms of a distinction between (merely) rational agents, and “reasonable” agents.

A Rawlsian approach might seem more congenial than a Hobbesian approach to people with disabilities. It derives the basic structure of society from a hypothetical choice situation, the Original Position, in which a veil of ignorance precludes reliance on the contractors' actual limitations – limitations that a Hobbesian contractor might ruthlessly (albeit rationally, if not reasonably) exploit (cf., fn.10). But even if Rawlsian contractors do not know their specific limitations, they do know that they, or the individuals they represent, are not permanently disabled. Rawls stipulated that the idealized society whose “basic structure” was the subject of hypothetical agreement was restricted to members who would be “fully-cooperating” over the course of their adult lives. Rawls assumed that this restriction would exclude people with severe and permanent physical and mental disabilities (Rawls 1993, 18–20). He did not defend that assumption, nor provide for the representation of those people in the process by which the basic structure of society is to be determined. Instead, he consigned their fate to the later, legislative phase. Rawls also restricted participation in the Original Position to those with two “moral powers”: the capacity to form and revise one's own conception of the good; and the capacity for a sense of justice, the capacity to act on and apply fair terms of cooperation (ibid.). It is doubtful that these powers can be attributed to people with the most severe intellectual and psychiatric impairments – although some philosophers and disability scholars have argued that a just society should treat all human beings as having the potential to develop such functioning (Wong 2007, 2009).

Disability scholars have been particularly critical of these eligibility conditions for the Original Position. In the Original Position, the members of a political community or their representatives select the principles of distributive justice governing the basic structure of their society behind a “veil of ignorance” – not knowing their personal attributes and social status (see SEP entries on the Original Position and John Rawls). If the deliberators in the Original Position do not believe that they could be representing, or could turn out to actually be, people with “severe and permanent” disabilities when the veil is lifted, they will have no prudential reason to choose a basic structure for their society that will maximize the inclusion of those people. It is striking that few commentators have questioned this restriction, given the increasing incidence of “severe and permanent” disabilities arising from life-saving and life-extending technology. If people with such disabilities are assumed incapable of full cooperation, the provisions that will be made for them are more likely to be geared to their physical comfort than their social and political participation. Those provisions in turn will help determine whether people with disabilities can adequately contribute to a fair cooperative scheme. If they are assumed to be generally dependent and unproductive, they are likely to be denied the very provisions that would enable them to contribute and produce – a circle that may be vicious (Nussbaum 2006a).

Several philosophers sympathetic to the Rawlsian framework have suggested modifications that would give people with disabilities a greater and more direct role in the social contracting process. Some have argued that the “full cooperation” requirement, and the kind of reciprocity it involves, can be liberally interpreted so as not to exclude most people with significant physical disabilities (Hartley 2009b; Stark 2009). Henry Richardson has gone even further, maintaining that “Rawls' arguments making use of the device of the [Original Position] do not essentially depend on any reciprocity premise” (2006, 427). He examines modified versions of the Original Position that drop the assumption that no one has severe and permanent disabilities. He contends that with such modifications, the Original Position can yield principles more sensitive to disability concerns about the continuous nature of abilities, the stigmatization resulting from false dichotomization, and the exclusion of severely disabled human beings.

In response, Martha Nussbaum (2006b, 490–498) concedes that Richardson's proposed reconstruction of Rawls would largely avoid the exclusionary features of the OP to which disability scholars have objected. But she argues that this reconstruction is a more radical departure from Rawls than Richardson acknowledges. She suggests that the theory loses its contractual character if it dispenses, per Richardson, with the reciprocity requirement and the assumption that the contractors have roughly equal physical and mental powers.

Rawls' “moral powers” condition has posed further problems. Harry Brighouse (2001) observes that modifying the cooperation requirement still excludes those whose cognitive impairments preclude their possession of the two moral powers. Sophia Wong (2009, 2007) argues that those powers can be acquired by people with severe intellectual impairments, with adequate social support. Leslie Francis (2009) and Anita Silvers (Silvers and Francis 2009) contend that many individuals with severe cognitive impairments can collaborate with others to construct individualized, authentic conceptions of the good. Silvers and Francis (2005) and Christie Hartley (2009a) also maintain that people with severe intellectual impairments can be represented adequately in a contracting process that consists in trust-building more than hard bargaining, even if they cannot participate in it personally.

Others have argued that exclusion from the Original Position need not adversely affect people with disabilities or treat them with disrespect. Adam Cureton (2008) argues that the exclusion of people with severe disabilities from the Original Position is just part of its idealization, and does not diminish the urgency or priority of their claims. Cynthia Stark (2007) proposes lifting the full-cooperation requirement to include people with disabilities at the second stage of Rawlsian deliberation. At the second stage, the society's constitution is established and where the hypothetical decision makers acquire some knowledge about the resources, development level, and other characteristics of their society.

The plausibility of these responses to Rawls depends to some extent on which version of the Original Position we consider. Rawls made a change in his presentation of the Original Position in his Restatement (2001) that is especially pertinent to people with cognitive disabilities. He emphasized that the participants in the Original Position are representatives of people in the future society, not people living in the future society denied knowledge of their social position. If representatives were made to take into account the possibility that those they represent might be disabled, this might help to ensure that the interests of the disabled were represented. It would only do so, however, if the contractors have the ability to imagine the very different embodiments of people with a variety of disabilities, an ability feminist critics of Rawls have questioned with respect to men representing women (Young 1990; Benhabib 1992; Okin 1994). The strictly representational role of participants in the Original Position would also avoid the conflict of interest faced by cognitively unimpaired individuals representing themselves and cognitively impaired individuals.

More generally, philosophers have varied widely in their optimism about the prospects for including people with disabilities in contractarian or contractualist deliberations. On the one hand, Lawrence Becker (2005) suggests that even selfish, hard-bargaining contractarians (his “tough crowd”) would accept an expansive notion of “reciprocity,” one that would ensure adequate provision for people with disabilities in the scheme of social cooperation they adopt. Their acceptance of reciprocity would arise from recognition of the needs and vulnerabilities they and their loved ones have or will likely acquire. That recognition places a premium on social provisions for health. “Even for the tough crowd, health is now ripe for inclusion in the list of basic goods. And it may be that a robust social commitment to health will address questions of justice for the disabled – as long as we are careful to include fundamental aspects of psychological health (i.e. those associated with active rational agency …” (2005, 35). Members of the tough crowd may not be so careful, however. Indeed, some may not even regard “active rational agency” as a matter of health as they more narrowly construe it, with an emphasis on physical survival and comfort.

In contrast to Becker, Eva Kittay (1999) holds that even the most liberal interpretation of Rawls' scheme will not be sufficiently responsive to the egalitarian concerns that motivate his theory. Rawls' assumption that the participants in the original position are or represent fully productive members of society neglects the fact of pervasive, inevitable human dependency. “[T]hose within relationships of dependency fall outside the conceptual perimeters of Rawls' egalitarianism” (1999, 79). Richardson (2006), as noted, argues that the Rawlsian framework can dispense with even the reciprocity requirement and accommodate Kittay's and Nussbaum's concerns about exclusion, stigmatization, and inadequate provision.

Another debate within contractarian theories that has particular relevance to disability concerns the scope of justice itself: Is justice concerned only with the distribution of social goods, or also with the rectification of “natural inequalities” (Pogge 1989, 44–47)? Pogge (1995) argues that in the Original Position, it would be irrational for parties to ignore the contribution of natural advantages to the well-being (understood in terms of the fulfillment of the two “higher-order interests”) of prospective citizens, since from that standpoint, it is just as bad to be disadvantaged by uncompensated disabilities as it is to be disadvantaged (to the same degree) by a small share of social primary goods. But Pogge claims that attempting to eliminate those inequalities would go beyond the scope of justice. Some philosophers argue, however, that many natural inequalities are within the scope of justice, and that health care to mitigate them is a requirement of justice (Daniels 1985; Buchanan, et al. 2000).

Other philosophers and disability scholars would deny that the inequalities associated with impairments can be regarded as “natural” (Amundson 1992; Wasserman 2001). In questioning the very notion of “natural inequalities,” they join a broader philosophical debate about whether it is possible to draw a coherent distinction between natural and artificial or social inequalities (see Lippert-Rasmussen 2004; Nagel 1997; Pogge 2004a, 2004b).[9]> Even if such a distinction can be plausibly drawn, it may turn out that many or most inequalities in abilities are artificial: as with of obsolete skills, those inequalities may be largely attributable to the physical and social environment (Bickenbach 1993).

4.2 Disability, Outcome-Oriented Theories, and the “Currency” of Justice

Other distributive theories of justice take a less procedural approach; they are more directly concerned with the kinds of outcomes a just society should pursue. These theories differ in the outcome metrics they adopt; in what has been called the “currency” of distributive justice (Cohen 1989). Some adopt a resource metric (Dworkin 1981b); still others, a metric based on opportunities for welfare (Arneson 1989) or access to advantage (Cohen 1989). Finally, capability theories assess outcomes not only by the goods or resources that people have, but also by what people are able to do with what they have (Nussbaum 1990; Sen 1980). Such outcome-oriented theories may be more or less demanding, depending on whether they require equality or merely priority for the worst-off, and on whether they support equality of a sort that may not require the significant redistribution of goods or resources.

The most prominent outcome-oriented approach has been called “luck egalitarianism” (see, for example, Arneson 2000; Dworkin 2003). According to the dominant characterization of that position, its central claim is that all injustices are analyzable as unfair inequalities in the distribution of “brute luck” – an advantage or disadvantage that is not attributable to an individual's fault, choice, or assumption of risk. “Option luck,” in contrast, refers to an advantage or disadvantage an individual acquires through the foreseeable consequences of his or her actions. The stronger versions of luck egalitarianism (e.g., Dworkin 81b) deny that the inequality resulting from option luck generates any claims of justice. On those versions, only some disabilities generate justice claims – those that resulted from brute bad luck – whereas others, which may involve the same or greater disadvantage, do not, simply because they resulted from a free choice (e.g., reckless pastimes or an unhealthy lifestyle).

Some philosophers have taken these implications as a reductio ad absurdum of luck egalitarianism (Anderson, 1999), and they would no doubt be rejected by many writers on health care, who have questioned the moral and policy relevance of individual responsibility (Cavallero 2011; Feiring 2006; Galvin 2002; Wikler 1987). The greater concern for disability scholars may be with the conflation of disadvantages resulting from unchosen impairments with disadvantages resulting from unchosen social conditions under the one heading of “bad brute luck.” The bad luck for people with disabilities is not primarily in their physical or mental variations, but in the poor fit between those variations and the social environment. The brute bad luck of a person with a disability is to find herself in a disabling environment (Fine and Asch, 1988).[10] For example, much of the bad luck in lacking the ability to walk is in living in a built environment designed for people who do, rather than people who move around in wheelchairs. As we will see in discussing the capabilities approach, though, this view on the locus of misfortune can be accommodated by some forms of luck egalitarianism.

4.3 The Appropriate Metric for Distributive Justice

The implications of outcome-oriented theories for disability, and the extent to which they address the need for recognition and respect, depend on two features of those theories. The first is the metric, or “currency” of justice they adopt – welfare, resources, primary goods, or capabilities (Cohen 1989). The second is the distributive standard they impose – strict equality, priority for the worse off, or merely some minimum for everyone (sufficientarianism). We will consider these two features in order, although they are sometimes intertwined.

Rawls and other social contract theorists adopted a broad outcome metric for assessing the comparative advantage of the individual in a society – a metric that includes opportunities, basic rights, and the social bases of self-respect. This breadth is intended to achieve neutrality between competing substantive conceptions of the good; for example, Rawls' “social primary goods,” such as income and wealth, were chosen for their utility in promoting widely differing conceptions. For many disability scholars, the difficulty in this approach does not concern its neutrality, but its failure to take account of the environment in which those goods must be utilized, which may profoundly affect their value to those receiving them. Two persons might be alike in their share of social primary goods, but differ in the use to which they can put those goods, if one person is disabled and the other is not. As we shall see below, the capabilities approach takes into account this objection, when the difference between the uses to which each person can put her primary goods is construed as the result of differences in “internal resources,” or the rate at which the individual can convert resources to “functionings.” As Richardson (2006) argues, however, the adoption of primary goods as an outcome metric may be an inessential feature of the Rawlsian framework. Those willing to embrace a “thicker,” less neutral theory of the human good can substitute an outcome metric like capabilities. Such a metric would take greater account of what one's endowment and environment permit one to do with the resources one has.

A failure to take adequate account of the environment may also be found in directly-egalitarian resource-based approaches. Dworkin (1981), for example, appears to take the social environment for granted in proposing a hypothetical division of resources into individual bundles. Giving people with impairments equal material shares in a society like our own would hardly satisfy the demands of equality in a physical and social environment designed exclusively for people with standard endowments. Dworkin is aware of the problem, but his solution is to adjust individual shares to include insurance payouts against poor environmental fit, rather than to redesign the environment to reduce inequalities in fit. To that degree, Dworkin appears to tacitly assume a medical model of disability, according to which limitations resulting from impairments are solely attributable to the impairment itself, and, if not correctable, compensable only by the redistribution of resources to people with such impairments. Such compensation may ensure survival, but it does little to enhance or equalize participation, and may in fact hinder participation if Anderson (1999) is right that compensating for disabilities expresses disrespect.

Several alternatives for assessing outcomes for purposes of political and social equality seem more responsive to the disabling role of the social environment. The most familiar and influential of these alternatives is the capabilities approach, developed in different ways by Martha Nussbaum (2006) and Amartya Sen (1980). Their accounts are concerned not only with the resources an individual has but also with what she can do with them; with her “capability” of engaging in a number of valuable “functionings,” such as forming intimate relationships and having rich sensory and aesthetic experiences.

Nussbaum's earlier formulations of the capabilities placed considerable emphasis on species-typical functioning. For example, she initially treated “the exercise of the five senses” as a necessary constituent of human flourishing. More recent formulations are more congenial to social models of disability, in part because of Nussbaum's encounter with disability scholarship. She now makes room for the social contribution to “natural” deficits (see Wasserman 1998; Terzi 2009), recognizing that most capabilities bear only a contingent, environmentally-mediated relationship to people's “natural endowment.” She abstracts from differences between people with impaired and normal limb function to find a common claim to the means of moving about from place to place. Such means may be architectural, vehicular, mechanical, or prosthetic; they may involve making places more accessible or making the individual more mobile. Similarly, a person lacking sight or hearing can achieve aesthetic satisfaction by other means; a person with intellectual impairments can participate in activities structured to include individuals of varying cognitive skills. An individual with emphysema could increase his capacity for affiliation and control over the material environment (two capabilities from Nussbaum's 2006 list) not only by measures to increase his lung capacity but also by measures to increase his access to social and business venues through better transit and architectural design.

Nussbaum's broader framing enables her to recognize the prospects for flourishing of people with severe impairments. The plausibility of the capabilities approach for disability critics of distributive accounts lies in the way the capabilities are individuated. A basis for individuation might be found in a comprehensive account of human nature and human flourishing, such as the Aristotelian account that informs Nussbaum's work. As Becker notes, however, such a comprehensive account would have limited appeal in justifying a distributive scheme in a pluralistic society (2005, 35). Despite its promise, considerably more work is needed to clarify her approach. Another feature of Nussbaum's theory that some disability theorists find congenial is her incorporation of recognition and respect into her set of basic capabilities. Thus, the capability for “affiliation” encompasses not only intimacy, but self-respect and dignity; the capability for “control over the environment” includes both the material and political environments.

Less ambitiously than Nussbaum, Jonathan Wolff (2009b) classifies equality-enhancing measures for people with disabilities by the extent to which they address recognition as well as redistribution. Thus, the individual limitations of people with disabilities can be addressed with either cash compensation or “personal enhancement,” medical, surgical, or rehabilitative measures to correct those limitations. “Targeted resource enhancement” offers an intermediate option, which tries to improve the fit of the individual and the environment with a range of restricted resources such as personal assistance and assistive technology. Finally, “status enhancement” alters the built environment and social practices to reduce the impact of individual differences in abilities on social equality. Wolff generally favors status enhancement as the most respectful intervention, because it shapes the environment to the needs of all members of society. It is also the most stable intervention, because it protects the social equality against sudden changes in individuals' levels of functioning.

Although Wolff does not adopt the device of hypothetical decision making to justify a preference for status enhancement, that preference could be underwritten by a suitably modified Original Position. As Richardson (2006) suggests, hypothetical decision makers who know that they may represent individuals with severe impairments are more likely to be concerned with capabilities than with primary goods, since the latter by themselves may be of limited value to those they represent. Further, those decision makers would recognize that capabilities often can be increased more respectfully, as well as more effectively, by status enhancements than by other measures.

Yet doubts remain about the extent to which concerns about recognition, respect, and social equality can be captured in any outcome metric of individual well-being, however broad. Thus, Christian Schemmel (2011) argues that the treatment of people as equals must be understood in terms of respectful relationships among individuals and institutions, and that the presence of such relationships cannot plausibly be regarded in what Pogge (2004a, 2004b) calls “recipient-oriented” terms, as components of individual well-being. The moral significance of respectful treatment is neither exhausted by, nor derivative of, its contribution to advantage. People may be euphoric about sugar-coated disrespect, or resentful about being treated only as an equal. Nor can respectful treatment be fully analyzed in terms of basic capabilities or essential constituents of well-being. As Schemmel argues (2011, 19), people may need some forms of affiliation to flourish but do not necessarily require social and political equality for their own well-being. The plausibility of these claims depends to some extent on how narrow or broad a conception of well-being one adopts. A conception that encompasses virtually all that a person has reason to care about will more easily accommodate social equality and respectful relationships.

Fraser herself (2007, 319) has concluded that her “bivalent” framework “belongs to the family of capability approaches.” Under her overarching principle of participatory parity, “justice requires social arrangements that permit all (adult) members of society to interact with one another as peers” (1996, 31). Those arrangements require both adequate material resources and institutional conditions expressing equal respect and permitting equal opportunity for social esteem. She distinguishes this principle from other members of the capability family in that participatory parity “focuses chiefly on the capabilities for social interaction, rather than on the capabilities for individual ‘functionings’” (2007, 319; see Armitage 2006; Danermark and Gellerstedt 2004; Robeyns 2003). Her distinction suggests that however broadly capabilities are framed, however many aspects of social life they encompass, their reliance on a metric of individual well-being will limit their ability to capture the importance of recognition as a form of justice. Recognition fundamentally concerns the relationships between people, not their individual good or well-being.

4.4 The Appropriate Standard for Distributive Justice

Two approaches seek to moderate the ambitions of distributive justice in ways that may be congenial to disability scholars. One takes the end-state of justice not as equality or priority but sufficiency: it requires that every member of society reach some minimum, in the appropriate “currency” – welfare, resources, opportunities for welfare or resources, or capabilities. This approach, labeled “sufficientarian” by one critic (Arneson 2006), is suggested but not endorsed by Nussbaum, and it serves to make capabilities a less demanding metric for distributive justice. (Nussbaum notes that certain capabilities must be distributed equally if anyone is to have a sufficient level of them, e.g., voting rights.) The requirement that a just society ensure that every citizen reaches a minimum level of each capability may be far less demanding than the requirement of equal capabilities. One way of setting the minimum appeals to the requirements for participation in a democratic society (Gutmann 1987; Anderson 1999).

Although sufficientarian approaches claim to make the demands of justice less oppressive, they have been criticized as demanding too much and too little. They demand too much if the minimum for every capability must be met in the face of recalcitrant impairments or environments. They demand too little if attaining the minimum could still leave the individual with a miserable life (Arneson 2006; Wasserman 2006; Wolff and de-Shalit 2007). Those approaches have also been criticized for lacking a mechanism for prioritizing capabilities (Wolff and de-Shalit 2007) and for assessing whether the minimum has been reached for any one capability (Riddle 2010). Clearly, the extent to which justice is achievable on such approaches for people with severe disabilities will depend on where the minimum is set, how its satisfaction is assessed, and how the capabilities are defined.

A second approach would replace equality on a specific metric of advantage with social equality or equality of respect (Anderson 1999; Miller 1999; Norman 1997, 1999). This approach would involve a more radical departure from luck egalitarianism than a sufficiency account, since it does not lower the standard for a just distribution so much as propose a non-distributive standard for justice. That standard would see justice in terms of recognition rather than, or as well as, redistribution. Although this approach may demand strict equality of a sort, it is a sort that does not appear to set determinate distributive requirements. A society of social equals, abounding in mutual respect, can arguably tolerate significant disparities in welfare, resources, opportunities, or capabilities.

Moreover, equality of respect appears to differ, formally, from equality of luck, advantage, resources, or any other “atomistic” good. The former is satisfied just in case a pattern of relationships is instantiated such that any two individuals relate to each other as equals (in the appropriate sense). The latter, in contrast, is satisfied just in case a pattern of distribution is instantiated, so that all individuals have equal shares of the relevant goods or capabilities. That distribution can be just even if its recipients lack mutual respect; if, for example, they are resentful of others they consider less deserving. In its limited concern with material equality and its emphasis on social equality, equality of respect has strong affinities with Fraser's own “principle of participatory parity” (see Fraser 1996 in the Other Internet Resources).

The general question of how to reconcile the demands of equal respect and distributive fairness has taken center-stage in a recent debate over the expressive significance of different measures to remediate the disadvantages associated with disability. Pogge (2002) and Anderson (1999) have claimed that it is disrespectful to attribute a person's disadvantage to features of his or her natural endowment because it treats her as needy, deficient, or inferior. For this reason, they argue against justifying redistributive measures to achieve inclusion on the grounds that they correct natural inequalities in skills, talents, or the ability to convert resources into welfare. Instead, they contend that such measures can and should be justified as redressing discrimination, and conversely, that failures to achieve inclusion should be recognized as unjustly discriminatory.

Barclay (2010) challenges the argument that a claim for redistribution treats the claimant as deficient or inferior. Such claims need only recognize that some traits are less suited than others for specific environments – a contingency that does not imply the intrinsic superiority or inferiority of a given endowment. She thus questions those (e.g, Daniels 1985; Buchanan, et al. 2000) who claim that certain characteristics or traits are universally valuable, such that an individual who lacked them would be deficient in any environment. Although she tends to see the environment as fixed rather than malleable, Barclay argues that the project of achieving inclusion is best seen in terms of maximizing individuals' environmental fit. Achieving that fit may require expending more resources for some individuals than others in any given environment. The demands made by very tall or left-handed people for greater accommodation do not presuppose their inferiority, only their minority status (see Sec. 2, infra). These comparisons suggest that the demands for accommodation of people with such statistically atypical features differ merely in degree, not kind, from those made by people with various impairments.

5. Justice and Disability Identities

There are many categories or groups into which people can place themselves, and be placed, on the basis of their varying characteristics. The salience and appeal of these categories depend on social and historical context as well as individual preferences and values. Identity and identity politics become important as members of historically excluded groups challenge their status and work for inclusion. Many women gained a sense of group identity in opposing laws that limited voting and other political rights to men; racial identities have been forged in the fight against segregation. Although people with disabilities are not always understood as sharing an identity, their awareness of membership in an oppressed group has been shaped by exclusionary laws and customs, from “ugly laws” prohibiting people with physical deformities from appearing in public to the state-sponsored involuntary sterilization of “mental defectives.” A sense of group identity has been further encouraged by welfare, social security and other laws that place people with various disabilities in a single category, even if they define that category in different ways.

The importance of disability as a social category was increased by the movement to establish civil rights for people with disabilities. As in the case of other stigmatized groups, the characteristics used as a ground for exclusion became a basis for mobilization and a source of pride. The social model of disability, which informed the movement for disability rights, emphasized what people with various impairments have in common – their stigmatization and exclusion – and thereby promoted the emergence of disability as a powerful social identity.

One of the principal criticisms of distributive justice is that it fails to take account of such important social identities; that it treated individuals in isolation from their race, sex, sexual orientation, and (dis)abilities – ascriptions and affiliations that play a vital role in how they regard themselves and respond to the world. Critics like Fraser argue that the importance of social identity cannot be adequately captured in any metric of individual advantage. An effective social response to stigmatized identities requires both recognition and transformation – changes in cultural framing and social perception that are poorly served by redistribution. An emphasis on redistribution is often self-defeating, exacerbating stigma and reinforcing the impression of the stigmatized group as deficient (Fraser 1995, 1997; see Olson 2001). Yet as we will discuss, some ways of transforming social identity have significant dangers as well.

For proponents of recognition, one issue is whether justice requires not only respect for individual members of society, but also respect for their group or cultural identities. Must a just society recognize “group-specific cultural identity” or merely “the status of group members as full partners in social interaction” (Fraser 2001; 23, 24)? Are these separate requirements, or does respect for an individual entail respect for her social or cultural identities? These questions have been addressed primarily with respect to religious, ethnic, racial, and sexual minorities. Very little work has been done on the question of what a disability identity would look like and what sorts of recognition claims it would implicate.

A somewhat parallel issue has been raised in distributive justice – must society allocate resources, broadly construed, to support the group and cultural identities of its members? That support could be based on the claim that such identities are a constituent, perhaps an irreducible one, of the well-being of the individual members of society. This claim has been suggested by justice theorists who argue for the importance of culture as a “context of choice” for individuals (e.g., Kymlicka 1989). An individual deprived of a culture through which he has experienced and interpreted the world will find it far more difficult to flourish. As we will discuss, however, it is doubtful that disability in general, or particular impairments, play such a comprehensive role in the lives of many people with disabilities.[11]

We begin by describing the different characteristics of an individual's “identity.” One sense of this term is that of numerical identity over time: what makes some person at time t1 the same person as the person at time t2? (see SEP entry on “Identity Over Time”). This is a metaphysical question and not our interest here. A different sense, the one at the heart of discussions about disability and identity, refers to those characteristics that make one the person one is, as judged both by oneself and by others. This includes narrative, or biographical, and practical identity, and is less about criteria for sameness over time and more about the essential features of one's self- (or social) conception.

The sense of individual identity most directly relevant to respect is that of practical identity. Following Korsgaard (1996; 2009), we understand a practical identity to be a description under which a person values herself, where valuing oneself involves treating oneself as a source of reasons. For example, someone who identifies as a mother in this sense values herself under the description “mother” and for that reason treats the fact that she is a mother as a source of (normative practical) reasons. Moreover, to “drop” this identification is not like dropping a desire or short-term goal; it involves changing one's sense of who one is as a person and what gives one's life value.

On this view, a person's practical identities should be normatively significant for other people as well. Excluding cases in which an identity is in some sense morally objectionable, it is plausible that others ought to respect that identity. It is plausible because respect arguably involves treating others' identities as sources of reasons, since others derive many of their reasons from their practical identifications. Respect for another's identity consists in part in refraining from doing certain actions: in not obstructing an individual's ability to enact her identity in her choices or to work to change it if she so desires.

Respecting a person's choices about identity falls under the broader moral requirement of respect for personal autonomy, one of the foundational principles that undergird our moral relations with others. It is also a political tenet of liberal societies, whose laws and policies do not require individuals to organize their lives around any particular identity, but rather give them the latitude to make of their identities what they will (Appiah 2005; Appiah and Gutmann 1996; see also the entry on identity politics). This can be seen as a part of liberalism's broader commitment to neutrality about conceptions of the good (e.g., Rawls 1993).

These issues become especially charged if we move from individual to group identities, bringing us closer to the question of disability identities. As K. Anthony Appiah points out, though individual identity is different from group identity, it nevertheless has a collective or social dimension (Appiah 2005, 21). For example, Palestinians living in the West Bank have a distinct collective identity. This is different from, though certainly compatible with, some specific West Bank resident having as part of his individual identity being a Palestinian.[12] It is important to bear this distinction between individual and collective identities in mind, because the latter, to a greater extent than the former, is imposed or “ascribed” by the larger society rather than chosen by the individual.

Being disabled, like being a member of a minority race, subjects one to particular treatment. But one can experience that treatment without feeling compelled to regard one's disability or minority status as part of one's individual identity. Often, having a disability identity ascribed to one, like having a racial identity ascribed, consists in part in being the object of, and provides an excuse for, discriminatory, demeaning or degrading treatment of various sorts. This is so both for people whose impairments are immediately observable and to those whose impairments are hidden, but subject to exposure by a temporary change in appearance, e.g., a person with epilepsy who has a seizure in public (Schneider and Conrad 1985). And since this social identity is often part of one's individual identity, such treatment is likely to be injurious to the self-respect of the one with this identity, and in that sense constitutes an instance of misrecognition. Ironically, the fact of being unfairly stereotyped can itself shape the identities of those who are treated in this way, as Appiah notes, even if initially they did not identify strongly with the group in question. But whether or not stereotyping has this effect, being subject to it is offensive, and it can have other consequences as well, including the denial of basic rights of equal citizenship.

Desirable change with respect to social identities is possible in at least two ways. First, even if some important aspects of one's self are not chosen – say, the fact that one has paraplegia or deafness – how central they are to one's self-conception, how much they matter to one's interests and plans, is to some extent within one's voluntary control. On some views, notably Korsgaard's, reflective endorsement of an identity is a necessary condition of its being normative for the agent, i.e., providing reasons for her. At the same time, the extent to which one's identifications are voluntary depends on the constraints of the social environment. One cannot simply decide to make one's disability a less salient feature of one's biographical identity, especially if one's disability is not “hidden.” If the identity is ascribed, and emphasized, by the larger society, it may be difficult to reduce its importance in one's own practical reasoning. But one still has some choice about whether to accept or resist that emphasis.

Second, there can be a change in the valence of the label, as there has been with the term “queer”: what was once a negative label, accompanied by unjust treatment of various sorts, can be transformed into a positive label and championed as a source of self-respect and pride for those who share in the collective identity. John Lawson discusses how special education for disabled children, once seen as a major factor in the creation of a negative, second-class identity, can be transformed into “sites for the positive promotion of disability as a cultural identity” (Lawson 2001, 203–21). Neither sort of change – in identification or valence – can be accomplished without struggle, personal as well as political, but partial success is sometimes achievable.

Even if disability is not and does not have to be a central component of every disabled person's identity, this does not negate the significance of disability as an organizing principle of political action. But when the social and political recognition of disability becomes the objective of political action, as it is in identity politics, it gives rise to the “dilemma of difference” (Minow 1990). Consider special education for children: On the one hand, labeling a child “disabled” risks stigmatizing and isolating the child. In this sense, to be “different” is to be inferior. Alternatively, being labeled “disabled” is a way for parents to secure attention to the child's particular ways of learning and functioning. In this sense, to be “different” is to be entitled to appropriate educational assistance.

The dilemma may not be insurmountable. The movement for universal design in education aims to refashion classrooms and teaching practices to encourage the participation of all students. To the extent that the movement is successful, it will minimize the need for “special education” (Biklen 1992; Gartner and Lipsky 2002; Lipsky and Gartner 1996). Law and public policy must think creatively about ways to solve this dilemma so that the stigma they seek to eliminate is not in effect reinforced. Success in resolving the dilemma of difference may reduce the importance of disability identity for justice. If disability is simply a characteristic to be taken account of in social arrangements, it could become as significant or insignificant as height or aptitude.

There are two other risks for an identity politics of disability. One involves the danger of assuming that the members of a particular marginalized group all share the same culture, be it African-American culture or disability culture. This assumption is not required by a mature identity politics, but it may be encouraged by efforts to mobilize diverse individuals around a single identity. Two considerations may help to resist this tendency. First, we must recognize that culture is a complex concept, and that defining it is no easy task. Second, we must recognize that on any plausible definition, people with the same disability (let alone different disabilities) need not share a common culture. There are some examples of a shared disability culture: Deaf culture is perhaps the best known. But many people who are deaf, particularly those who do not sign, do not identify as Deaf or take part in Deaf culture (Tucker, 1997)[13] And even for those who participate, Deaf culture does not appear to be the kind of “encompassing” or “comprehensive” culture claimed by Kymlicka, Margalit, and Raz to provide a “context of choice” for its members.[14]

The second, related risk involves privileging one identity over others. This is especially important for people with multiple or “intersectional” identities. People who are African-American and disabled, or female and disabled, or disabled and LGBT may sometimes feel a conflict between those identities. In one study, for example, African-American women with mobility impairments reported that they felt estranged from the disability-rights movement, partly because its leadership seemed predominantly white, and partly because some of its principal goals – to maximize independence – went against their more communal values, which emphasized family and co-dependence (Feldman and Tegart 2003). Also, some have noted that mainstream feminism's focus on independence and self-sufficiency has tended to exclude women with disabilities, who are perceived as lacking in these cardinal virtues (Crawford and Ostrove 2003; Wendell 1996). At the same time, disabled women are often particularly vulnerable to the injustices that motivate the feminist movement: they are frequently victims of sexual exploitation (Crawford and Ostrove 2003), encounter many obstacles to leaving dissatisfying relationships because of physical, psychological and financial dependency (Olkin 2003), and have median incomes below the poverty line and substantially lower than those of their male counterparts (Crawford and Ostrove 2003; Olkin 1999).

Fraser (2001, 23–24) highlights the risks of an “identity model” of recognition:

On that model, what requires recognition is the group-specific cultural identity. Misrecognition consists in the depreciation of such identity by the dominant culture and the consequent damage to group members' sense of self. Redressing this harm means demanding recognition. This in turn requires that group members join together to refashion their collective identity by producing a self-affirming culture of their own (23–24).

Fraser finds this model “deeply problematic.”

It puts moral pressure on individuals to conform to group culture. The result is often to impose a single, drastically oversimplified group identity, which denies the complexity of people's lives, the multiplicity of their identifications, and the cross-pulls of their various affiliations. In addition, the model reifies culture (24).

Under the alternative “status model,” which Fraser prefers,

what requires recognition is not group-specific identity but rather the status of group members as full partners in social interaction. Misrecognition, accordingly, does not mean the depreciation and deformation of group identity. Rather, it means social subordination in the sense of being prevented from participating as a peer in social life. To redress this injustice requires a politics of recognition, to be sure, but this no longer means an identity politics (24).

Some critics have argued that Fraser's grounds for rejecting the identity model do not require acceptance of her status model (Zurn 2003). But it is also possible to accept the latter without rejecting identity politics altogether. In some contexts, “producing a self-affirming culture” may be a necessary means to achieve status equality, whether or not it is also an end in itself. This might be the case in a society which stigmatizes certain identities and regards them as essential to the individuals to whom it ascribes them. Some disability advocates find such a context in contemporary Western societies. They see a “self-affirming” disability culture as a critical instrument in achieving social equality for people with disabilities in the face of deeply-entrenched institutionalized prejudice (Longmore 1995; Swain and French 2000).

In addition to these potential risks associated with emphasizing identity politics for persons with disabilities and other stigmatized minorities, there have been several major challenges in mobilizing people with disabilities around an affirmative group or cultural identity. The first, addressed by the disability rights movement, was getting people with disabilities to recognize that they have something in common with others who are differently impaired but also suffer stigma and exclusion because of their impairment. This has been difficult because people who are born with disabilities or acquire them in childhood come from widely dispersed socioeconomic, geographic and racial groups (Scotch 1988) and so are less likely to grow up with a sense of group identity. Another obstacle has been the overwhelmingly negative connotation of the label “disabled.” Indeed, the challenge for people with visual, motor, and psychiatric impairments has been to recognize that they share a “disabled” identity while denying that this makes them dependent, child-like, or powerless (Asch 1985; Scotch 1988); such a self-identity would quite literally disable one's capacity for political action.

It is instructive to compare how the medical and social models would address these challenges. The medical model suggests a disability identity that is both fragmented and negative. Because the medical model defines disability in terms of particular physical or mental impairments, the primary commonalities it recognizes among disabled people are strictly functional; it views the blind person and the deaf person as having very different problems. Although it could recognize the fact that such biomedically distinct conditions had similar social consequences – stigmatization and exclusion – it would treat those similar consequences merely as secondary effects of the two conditions. Even within a single impairment, a medical model encourages distinctions based on etiology. For example, it would distinguish blindness due to Leber's congenital amaurosis from blindness due to retinaopathy of prematurity, focusing on genetic testing for the former and treatment for the latter, and placing less emphasis on the shared challenges of living with blindness. Although this narrow focus may be appropriate for the purposes of clinical intervention, it obscures the recognition of disability as a social and political problem, except insofar as it raises perennial questions about how to distribute scarce health-care resources (Barnartt, et al. 2001). But if the political conversation about disability is limited to debates about resource allocation, it leaves power in the hands of the able-bodied majority. To make matters worse, it puts disabled people in the position of competing with one another for resources, and encourages distinctions based on whether one's disability is related to lifestyle choices (HIV contracted through sexual activity vs. blood transfusions) and how “severe” one's disability is regarded (e.g., the UK tax allowance scheme described by Oliver and Zarb 1989). Altogether, the medical model emphasizes the ways in which people with disabilities are dependent and divided, rather than empowered and united.

In contrast, the various social models suggest a more politically viable disability identity. The inclusion of people with a vast array of different impairments in U.S. and other national civil rights laws, and the creation of the U.N. convention on the rights of persons with disabilities, has helped to forge a shared disability identity. The emergence of disability studies as a recognized field of academic inquiry has also contributed. The minority group model promotes a trans-impairment identity by treating people with disabilities as a “discrete and insular minority” making claims on a hostile able-bodied majority. Though the minority group model has proven extremely useful in passing anti-discrimination laws, it may do so at the expense of emphasizing the differences between people with disabilities and people without them, rather than highlighting the many ways in which identity need not be tied to the presence or absence of an impairment. The human variation model tempers this emphasis, and resists essentialism about disability identity, by treating the group itself as socially constructed. It sees the category of “the disabled” as resting on an artificial dichotomy imposed on a continuum of variation. The conceptualization of disability as just one source of difference, and as a difference in kind more than degree, can undercut a sense of disability as the basis for a unique and exclusive identity.

The more the redesign of the physical and social environment is guided by a thoroughgoing human-variation model, the less dominant disability identity and identity politics may become for people with disabilities. A society in which disabilities lack the social and practical significance they currently have may be one in which the equality of people with disabilities can be fully recognized without having to treat disability as a salient feature of their identities.

It may be, though, that the physical, sensory, or psychic experience of a particular impairment turns out to be central and salient to how those with the impairment live – even in a society deeply committed to inclusion, participation, and non-discrimination. Perhaps communicating primarily gesturally and not vocally, or moving through the world with wheels and not on legs, or not reading certain kinds of conventional social cues makes the lives of people who are deaf, or paralyzed, or have autism sufficiently distinctive that they feel a strong affinity and connection with others who have the same impairment (See SEP entry on Disability: Definitions, Models, Experience for a discussion of this claim.) Disability theorists who adopt different social model approaches might profitably consider how different views about group and individual identity apply to people with disabilities.

6. Conclusion

The issues of disability and justice and disability and identity both require further philosophical study. Perhaps it would be useful to start by asking not about the resources necessary for functioning in a society, but instead about the activities that are essential or valuable for social participation and individual flourishing. Such an inquiry admittedly poses a challenge for neutrality among competing conceptions of the good, a neutrality that has been a tenet for many liberal political philosophers since Rawls. That challenge can be addressed by critically examining what count as reasonable conceptions of the good, an examination that could both narrow the range of conceptions and broaden their characterization of valuable activities. Such an examination may be implicit in some of the capabilities approaches now being developed. But there are also critics of Rawlsian liberatlism who find the commitment to neutrality unduly constraining or impossible (Sher 1997; Galston 1995; Fishkin 1983). That commitment may be eroded as well by the increasing sway of “objective list” accounts of well-being, which appear to violate neutrality in specifying what counts as a good life.

If we are willing to narrow the range of reasonable conceptions of the good, or forego neutrality among them, we may be able to identify the broad categories of activity that are central to social participation and individual flourishing. We can then turn to the issues of how a just society can create or modify environments and practices in ways that permit all, or almost all, its members to engage in these activities. Rather than seeing the ramp, the flexible work schedule, the audio book, or the visual display of words spoken at a meeting as “accommodations” to individual deficits, they can be seen as the ordinary components of Gliedman and Roth's (1980) inclusive society. Theories of justice, and the policy-makers who might apply such theories to the society, can then squarely and forthrightly confront how much energy, imagination, and money they are prepared to expend for inclusion.


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Other Internet Resources


We want to thank the participants in the Workshop on Disability: Bioethics, Philosophy, and Public Policy (January 18–19, 2007) for enormous help in framing the issues discussed in this Entry. In addition, we have received invaluable editorial assistance from Dorit Barlevy, Ari Schick and William Chin.

Copyright © 2013 by
David Wasserman <dtwasserm@gmail.com>
Adrienne Asch
Jeffrey Blustein <jblustein@ccny.cuny.edu>
Daniel Putnam <daniel.putnam@yale.edu>

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