Giambattista della Porta

First published Tue May 19, 2015

To most modern readers, it would stretch definitions to include someone like Giovan Battista Della Porta (1535–1615) in an encyclopedia of philosophy. In a typical assessment of Porta’s Magia Naturalis, Wayne Shumaker writes:

Occasionally [Porta] shows that he has actually experimented, as in writing about the lodestone or burning-glasses. On the whole, however, the treatise is backward-looking. (1972: 120)

Yet philosophy in Porta’s time encompassed a far wider range of topics than it does today, including cosmology, meteorology, and physics; biology and human psychology; and moral philosophy and politics. As a prolific writer on topics then associated with more or less alternative currents to Aristotelian natural philosophy (Henry 2008), Porta became one of the most famous and popular figures in the intellectual life of the second half of the sixteenth century and beyond.[1] Porta thus ranks amongst the many rather unorthodox praeternatural philosophers in the traditional categories of the peripatetic curriculum. In the rich intellectual ferment that eventually generated the scientific revolution of the following century, Porta constitutes a highly interesting transitional figure because he engaged with the world of objects, craft and chemical substances. From this “scientific underworld” occupied by the “professors of secrets” emerged a naturalized concept of human beings and innovative ideas about science (Smith 2009), which Porta amply (and critically) reflects. His impressive number of texts are written in very different literary genres, ranging from learned Latin treatises to stage plays—mannerist comedies written in Italian, some of which resonated widely and seem to have influenced Shakespeare (Clubb 1964, 2008). The wonders Porta produced onstage and in his laboratory had a decidedly histrionic character, and perhaps this alignment of theatre and nascent science provides one of the more coherent perspectives on Porta’s many different intellectual endeavours (Kodera 2012).


Verso of Frontispiece from G. B. Della Porta, De Distillationibus libri IX. Argentorati: Zetzner 1609, courtesy Universitätsbibliothek Wien.

The frontispiece to the De Distillationibus libri IX (1609), with Porta’s portrait, gives a good impression of his many divergent scientific interests, ranging from physiognomies, astrology, ciphers, and the art of memory to distillation, optics, magnetism, alchemy, cross-breeding and the embellishment of (mostly female) bodies—as well as practical jokes.

1. Life and works

Born into a noble Neapolitan family in 1535, Porta published his Magiae naturalis libri IIII in 1558. The immediate success of this book firmly established Porta’s reputation as a learned magus and professor of secrets in the European world. The book saw sixteen Latin editions; six Italian, seven French and two Dutch versions appeared by 1588 alone (Balbiani 2001), although in 1583 the book ended up on the Madrid Index of Prohibited Books due to Porta’s naturalistic approach to witchcraft. A second version in 1589 was enlarged to 20 books and purged of the infamous recipe for witch’s unguent. Due to severe difficulties with ecclesiastical censorship (the Roman Holy Office had begun legal proceedings against Porta in the early 1570s), he remained under life-long surveillance by the inquisition (Valente 1997).

Early in his life, Porta apparently founded an academy of secrets dedicated to the study of natural phenomena. Its members could only be appointed if they had discovered a hitherto unknown segreto (Badaloni 1959/60). The meetings seem to have been held in Porta’s Neapolitan palace. There also exists some intriguing archaeological evidence for special subterranean meeting rooms under Porta’s villa in Vico Equense, then a village just outside Naples (Balbiani 2008). After 1558, Porta travelled widely, stopping in Apulia, Calabria, Lombardy, Venice, and Paris. In Spain he seems to have visited the court of Philip II, a renowned patron of alchemy who sought miraculous medicines for himself and his family’s ailments. The Magia Naturalis is, unsurprisingly, dedicated to this important patron. Porta presented Philip II with another book on ciphers (De furtivis litterarum notis vulgo de ziferis libri IV 1563), followed by L'arte del ricordare (1566), a treatise on the art of memory (a Latin version appeared in 1602 under the title Ars reminsicendi). In 1579 and during the following years, Porta was repeatedly invited to Rome by Cardinal Luigi D'Este (1538–1586), ostensibly to pursue his research into the secrets of nature, but perhaps more importantly to enjoy some protection in his household during his trial before the inquisition. 1580 found Porta overseeing the construction of a parabolic mirror in Venice, where he met Paolo Sarpi (1552–1623).

Having sold parts of his Neapolitan palazzo in the preceding year, Porta returned to Naples in 1582 and began researching the philosopher’s stone at the behest of Cardinal D'Este. In the following two years he published two treaties on agriculture (Pomarium 1583, Olivetum 1584) and his richly illustrated Humana physiognomia (1584). In 1586 Porta was probably again summoned before the Neapolitan Inquisition, perhaps together with Luigi Tansillo (1510–1568), an influential poet (and a close acquaintance of Giordano Bruno (1548–1600)). Porta was instructed to abstain from publishing on divinatory and magical arts and write comedies instead. That same year Porta returned to Rome under the protection of Cardinal D'Este, who died a couple of years later. In 1588 and back in Naples, Porta published a physiognomony of plants (Phytognomonica) and a translation of the first book of Ptolemy’s Almagest. The following year saw the publication of the second, much enlarged edition of the Magia naturalis and the comedy Olimpia, which may have been staged in the presence of viceroy Don Juan de Zuñiga (1551–1608). In 1590, Porta met Tommaso Campanella (1568–1639); in the next year he published the tragicommedia Penelope, followed in 1592 by the comedy Fantesca as well as Villae, an extensive account of his travels through Europe. The Venetian Inquisition prohibited the publication of the Italian version of the Human Physiognomony. The ban was reinforced in 1593, when De refractione, a treatise on optics, came out. In 1596 Trappolaria—another comedy—was printed. Now famous across all Europe, in 1598 Porta dared to defy the inquisitional ban and published Della fisionomia del’ huomo under the pseudonym Giovanni de Rosa. For the following three years Porta seems to have kept a deliberately low profile; his tragicomedies Fratelli rivali and Cintia came out only in 1601. Porta then had the Latin version of his treatise on the art of memory printed, as well as Penumaticorum libri tres (on the vacuum and how to lift up liquids) and Curvilinearum elementorum libri duo (on optics), two treatises that reappeared in enlarged versions as I tre libri spiritali (1606) and Elementorum curvilineorum libri tres (1608). In 1603 Porta outlined a naturalized form of divinatory astrology and physiognomics in the Coelestis physiognomonia. Federico Cesi (1585–1630), a young Roman nobleman with a passion for natural philosophy who founded the famous Academia dei Lincei, visited Porta in 1604. Sorella was published in the same year. Between 1606 and 1607 the comedies Astrologo, Turca, Carnbonaria and Moro were published. The short treatise De destillatione (1608) became another of Porta’s bestsellers, but this success was overshadowed by the death of Gianvincenzo Porta, his brother and collaborator. De munitione, a treatise on military fortifications and on firearms, came out in 1608; in the following year two comedies (Furiosa and Chiappinaria) were published. 1609 also marked the beginning of Porta’s dispute with Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) (another famous member of the Academy of the Lynx) over who had first invented the telescope. The Lincei reopened in 1610, due to the death of Cesi’s father, who had disapproved of Federico’s scientific endeavours; Porta’s discovery of the telescope was acknowledged by the Academy, and he became director of its Naples branch (which, however, never opened) (Freedberg 2002). The Holy Office prohibited the publication of Porta’s treatise on palmistry, De ea naturalis physiognomoniae parte quae ad manuum lineas spectat. In 1611 Porta opened the academy of the Otiosi, an institution dedicated to letters and to science; some of his plays may have been staged there. Porta seems to have worked simultaneously on the telescope and the philosopher’s stone. These endeavours resulted in the draft for his last and largely unfinished work on (more or less) natural magic, the Criptologia and the Thaumatologia, which was to be dedicated to Rudolf II. (Needless to say, it was never to obtain an imprimatur by the ecclesiastical authorities.) The tragedy Gregorio (1611) and, in the following year, the comedy Tabernaria (1612) were published; in 1613 Porta was honored by the Lincei with a medal cast by Francesco Stelluti (1577–1653). Another comedy, Fratelli simili, and the tragedy Ulisse were published in 1614. In February 1615 Porta died in the house of his daughter Cinzia: there are no records of Porta’s wife, whose name is unknown (for Porta’s biography in general, see Romei 1989; Piccari 2007).

2. Works on Magic

A large part of Porta’s philosophical speculation is contained in the two versions of his Magia naturalis (1558, 1589), crystallized in the persona of the natural magus. Porta seeks to avoid all religious topics, as well as even the remotest hint of ceremonial magic; other than in the third book of Heinrich Cornelius Agrippa of Nettesheim’s (1486–1535) De occulta Philosophia, for instance, there are no instructions for prayers, fasting, or invocations (Klaassen 2013). Porta’s magic is thus less a way to improve one’s own mind or to communicate with divine forces, and more a means to manipulate objects and human beings with crafty tricks. Porta developed this secular approach to magic in the face of ecclesiastical prosecution, for it seems that he was condemned for exercising ceremonial magic (Zambelli 2007). Porta’s magus is a decidedly male figure who unites the physical dexterity of the trickster, the experience of the alchemist, the erudition of the humanist, the astrologer’s command of mathematics, and the intuitive knowledge of the psychic medium in order to embody a superhuman, ideal man capable of manipulating everything and everybody. The magus must be talented, rich, educated, and hard-working; magic is the most noble part of philosophy for Porta (Magia 1558: bk. 1, ch. 2). Instead of a priest or metaphysician in quest of the divine—as in Pico della Mirandola or John Dee—(Harkness 1999), Porta’s magus is thus depicted as an artifex (a craftsman or mastermind) who knows how to manipulate the natural and occult properties of certain bodies. Here, the attractive power a magnet exercises on iron is taken as a paradigm: the speculation is that all bodies have an inherent property to attract certain other bodies (Copenhaver 1991, 2007). According to Porta, these qualities are occult because their workings cannot be grasped by our intellect. Yet he infers that occult properties derive from formal, not material causes—partly because a very small quantity of matter often may have an enormous effect (Magia 1558: bk. 1, ch. 8).

Magic is therefore a specific science of natural objects (animals, herbs, stones), the servant or minister of nature; in Porta’s characteristic definition of natural magic, just as a peasant prepares the soil to help nature produce its marvelous effects, so the natural magus prepares matter in a special way to allow its natural (but nevertheless occult) properties to appear. Structurally, this magic is a form of applied Platonist metaphysics—in Ernst Cassirer’s words, an emanatist form of physics (“emanatistische Form der Physik” Cassirer 2002 [1926]: 128). In reasoning highly reminiscent of Marsilio Ficino’s (1433–1499) cosmology in the De via coelitus comparanda and the De amore, Porta maintains that in the strict hierarchical order of Creation the transcendent forms are directly affiliated with God; they are projected into the world in various manifestations, first into the Angels (or daemons), subsequently into the soul, and ultimately into qualities (qualitates) via the elements, again of celestial origin, as their instruments shape matter (Magia 1558: bk. 1, ch. 4).

Porta’s tacit refusal to acknowledge the Aristotelian border between sub- and supralunar worlds in cosmology is a salient feature in his account of the hierarchy of being. This erosion of boundaries easily leads to the assumption that the seemingly erratic movements of objects in the sublunar sphere are actually less random than they might appear, because they are governed by secret, divine principles. Conversely, the direct causal nexus between divine powers and created forms accounts for those objects’ potential to operate in seemingly miraculous, but actually natural, ways (Magia 1558: bk. 1, ch. 5). Centrally related are the doctrine of universal animation and the belief that the superior celestial influx is mirrored in material objects; these forces may be channeled at will into inferior creatures on earth.

Knowledge of such procedures allows the magician to exercise considerable power in ordering and disposing bodies to reveal new and amazing features. Generally, an object’s visible traits, or signatures, are indicative of its occult powers and those powers’ relationship to other objects, both higher and lower in the hierarchy of being. This idea is also central to Porta’s doctrine of physiognomonics (discussed below) .

All things in the universal hierarchy of being are moved by the (irrational) forces of attraction and repulsion they feel for one another. Porta provides an impressive description of the macrocosmic animal, the male and female aspects of which mingle in a harmonious and well-coordinated way, which he expeditiously plagiarized (Magia 1589: bk. 1, ch. 9; Ficino 1989 [1489]: lib. 3, ch. 26). At a deep level—and in a characteristic form of circular reasoning—the cosmology of natural magic thus depends on the workings of a decidedly erotic cosmology itself modeled on human forms of sexuality (Kodera 2010).

Porta’s magic is parasitically dependent on manipulating the affective structures of love and hatred that bind together the universe. The principle of universal affective correlations formed the backbone of Renaissance natural magic in general. Porta credits this doctrine to Empedocles (Magia 1558: bk.1, ch. 9), who held a reputation as a magus amongst Porta’s contemporaries (Kingsley 1995). These ideas were not only embraced by many of the preternatural philosophers, but were already found in the preface of the De mirabilibus mundi ascribed to Albertus, one of Porta’s favorite sources for many of his more eccentric segreti (such as those mentioned in footnote 1 of this article). The postulation of an affective structure permeating the whole of creation from top to bottom was vital to account for the phenomenon of action at a distance (actio in distans), which Aristotle had expressly ruled out in his Physics (7. 2, 244a14–245b5, see Henry 2008). A side effect of this universal connectedness of all things is that the world as a whole becomes animated (Hankins 2007). The magician capitalizes on the natural forces of love, hate, attraction and repulsion inherent to the universe to act as a matchmaker, and he produces marvelous offspring: many of the magus’ activities are akin to husbandry. (Again, this is an idea also found in Ficino’s De vita). Porta’s Magia 1589 (bk. 2 and 3) contains long chapters on the production of monsters in the vegetable as well as animal worlds.

A central topic for Porta is various technologies for attaining vision of the miraculous. He supplies numerous recipes for drugs and magical lamps designed to distort our perceptions, (Magia 1589: bk. 8, ch 2), some of which also have a strong theatrical orientation, including his witches’ unguent, lenses, telescope and camera obscura) (Reeves 2008). For the most part, Porta’s mirrors were not subjects for speculation, as they had long been in metaphysics, theology, magic and the divinatory arts. Neither were they tools to produce “objective or scientific data” (Daston and Galison 2007; Smith 2009). Porta’s experiments with lenses and mirrors (such as the improved form of the camera obscura) fit more coherently into the perspective described above: these devices function as generators of marvels, with the objective of stirring spectators’ imaginations (Dupré 2007; Thielemann 2009). The resulting images take on a form of existence that, like a phantasm, is halfway between “real” and “imaginary” (Giglioni 2011).

In the next section, we see some of the more inconvenient aspects of Porta’s theory of magic discussed here—its circular reasoning and anthropomorphism—reappear in Porta’s ideas on physiognomonics (Simon 1980; Védrine 1986).

3. Works on Physiognomonics

Physiognomonics, a proto- or pseudo-science on the rise in the sixteenth century, sought to identify the visible affinities between all physical things. Physiognomonists like Porta detected such affinities everywhere, from plants and animals to the bodies and faces of humans, and even further up the ontological scale to the appearance of the planets. Porta’s physiognomonics provides cartographies of the outward appearance of physical bodies aimed at predicting the soul’s hidden inclinations or dispositions (past, present or future). Porta’s massive effort to map the exterior appearances of all animated bodies runs in tandem with the contemporary medical approach towards cartographies of human bodies (as well as landscapes), exemplified most notably by Andreas Vesalius (1514–64) in his revolutionary anatomical studies.

Within its own historical context, physiognomonics was viewed as a rational science as good as, or perhaps even better than, the new anatomy, since it could be used for universal description and as a means to identify character traits. In the circular reasoning characteristic of his theory of magic, Porta’s physiognomonic assessments are based on resemblances in external appearance: for instance, men with a dark, Saturnine complexion evocative of dangerous animals are rendered very likely to go to prison (De ea naturalis physiognomoniae parte quae ad manuum lineas spectat ch. 12). This example highlights the aesthetics structuring Porta’s physiognomonics: beautiful bodies are also morally good. There is a direct association between beauty, virtue, success and health, as these traits all originate from a good temperament, that is, from a harmonious mixture of the elements. A monstrous body, on the other hand, indicates ill health, bad luck, and dubious moral inclinations.

A truly universal science, physiognomonics provides its master not only with a key for decoding the ciphers written into human faces (by relating them to the shapes of animals) or a manual for reading the lines engraved into the palms of our hands, but also (as Porta suggests) with diagnostic methods for understanding all of creation, from plants to stars. In this manner, physiognomonics may be described as the art that establishes a metonymic relationship between inorganic bodies and psychological qualities (Caputo 1990).

One important aspect of Porta’s physiognomonics is that it is not merely descriptive: bodies may be mapped and their future predicted, but they are nevertheless in a constant state of flux, transition, or mutability. Their essences are not exclusively determined by an invisible substantial form (soul) derived from unchangeable forms—and, in the case of human beings, immortal—as in previous traditions, but (more than ever) result from external circumstances. These environmental influences are decisive for the fate of individuals whose expressions and appearances are unstably shaped. A characteristic quotation illustrates Porta’s understanding of physiognomonics:

Through this art, we have helped many friends avoid dangers and ascend to honours. Shortly before I wrote these things, I counselled a friend of mine to avoid the company of a certain ugly and unlucky man, an advice he did not want to hear, as his acquaintance had promised him riches; at the end of the day, they were caught by the governor producing counterfeit money in a hide-out and shortly afterwards both ended on the gallows. (Coelestis physiognomonia, bk. 1, ch. 2)

It has often been noted that Porta opens perspectives on the sinister tradition of eugenics, not uncommon currency in European intellectual culture since its articulation in Plato’s Timaeus (90), where a handsome body is stipulated as the abode of a beautiful soul. Apart from the elemental influences altering body and mind, which can be reduced to qualities perceived through touch (such as hot/cold, dry/moist), Porta mentions nutrition, climate, and age as determinants of an individual’s mental and physical shape. Disease may also alter an individual’s mental disposition: as an example, Porta mentions fevers—since they dry up the brain, they may cause the patient to become more intelligent. Disease may even instill a capacity for divination. Alterations in outward appearance bear significant consequences for an individual’s behaviour and habits. (De humana pysiognomonia bk. 6, ch.1)

From the perspective of religious orthodoxy, the crucial question Porta addresses only with (well-advised) trepidation is whether a change in exterior form can also cause alterations to the soul—i.e., in the substantial and indelible form of humans (De humana pysiognomonia bk. 1, ch. 20). Here, Porta takes the position, more common to medical physiologists, that it is a physician’s intervention rather than moral philosophy that cures our bodies and minds. On this view, the body becomes a potential stage for medical intervention into the mental realm (Kodera 2010: ch. 8).

According to classical medicine, diseases are caused by an imbalance between body fluids—the temperaments. The concept of the temperaments or humoural mixtures in the human body was originally developed to describe physiological body states:

The four humours were real body fluids, to which largely hypothetical origins, sites and functions were ascribed. (Siraisi 1990: 105)

In late Antiquity and in the Middle Ages, the temperaments were understood to fall under the reign of the stars, which influence the generation and corruption of bodies in the sublunar sphere. In an important conceptual step, Porta turns the tables, contending that rather than being controlled by the stars, the medical humours are actually universal descriptors structuring the entire cosmos. With this move in a naturalistic direction, Porta strove to eclipse the astrological elements of his theory. Even though in the Coelestis physiognomonia he had declared astrology a vain discipline, Porta added an important qualification to this dismissal: astrology is an erroneous art, but only as long as divination from the stars is not based on the perceptible features of heavenly bodies. Hence, a fine physiognomonist will swiftly derive the relevant temperamental features from the visible appearance of the planets. In this way, all natural bodies remain substantiae signatae, cosmically predisposed substances bearing inscriptions of universal signs. The astrological system of categorization was restricted to the medical temperaments, thus associating celestial bodies with a system of signs that pertained to medicine and hence to a lower level in the hierarchy of being. Instead of governing the lower bodies, the stars become subject to the same laws as earthly bodies (Coelestis physiognomonia, proemium). In following the Neoplatonic cosmology outlined above, the attendant levelling of celestial hierarchies constitutes a break with Peripatetic cosmologies.

Initially, Porta’s naturalized version of astrology was probably a mere maneuver for detouring around the ecclesiastical censorship on the divinatory arts; in the first edition of the Magia (1558) Porta had fully embraced astrological causation, as well as the decisive role of an auspicious astrological moment for magical operations, especially the confection of talismans as described by Ficino in the De vita. (Magia 1558: bk. 1, chs. 15–17; Trabucco 2002, 2005). However, close alignment of astrology with medical humours and physiognomonics is well in accordance with Porta’s larger aim of naturalizing the entire cosmos. In his circular reasoning, Porta’s cosmos becomes more and more anthropomorphic, as universal signatures are imprinted not only into human beings, but also share these physical traits with the stars, animals, herbs and even stones (as explained in Porta’s Phytognomonica).

4. The Book on Ciphers

Renaissance cryptographers in general had a penchant for mystery and the preternatural, as evident from Johannes Trithemius’ Steganography, for example. Trithemius, the Abbot of Sponheim, got in trouble with his ecclesiastical censors because he used a complex numerological series of demons’ names, arranged on Lullian wheels, for encryption (Arnold 1991). With their aura of mystery, ciphers qualified as a congenial topic for Porta’s general outlook as a peddler of marvels. The art of cryptography had the advantage of being perhaps less wicked than necromancy, while still attracting the attention of powerful political patrons. For someone aspiring to be the adviser and protégé of one of the more powerful worldly rulers, it was therefore a not unwise choice to write such a book.

Moreover, Porta considered himself a master physiognomonist endowed with a special talent to read the universal language inscribed on all bodies. When seen in the context of the doctrine of universal signatures, it comes as no surprise that Porta also wrote a book on ciphers: he also believed himself endowed with a special ingenuity for decoding all forms of texts. De furtivis litterarum notis is apparently the first text on this topic that not only explained various ways to encrypt messages, but also gave detailed instructions on how to decipher coded messages (Strasser 2008).

5. Art of Memory

In order to organize the memory, Porta recommends constructing a mental picture gallery populated with striking images of persons or groups of persons. He also mentions the important role of contemporary paintings and sculptures by the foremost artists of his time, including Titian, Rafael and Michelangelo. Porta maintains that restoring the memory is like refreshing the colors of a faded painting. Porta’s approach to the ancient art of memory is markedly iconic (rather than architectural), as typical for many medieval and early modern formulations of mnemonics (Bolzoni 2001). Especially in the Italian Arte del ricordare, Porta recommends graphic erotic fantasy, such as sodomitic intercourse, as the strongest memory aid; to illustrate his point, he gives examples from Ovid’s Metamorphoses and from Apuleius. In a manner clearly reminiscent not only of his recipes with hallucinogenic drugs but of his naturalist approach in general, Porta maintains that such erotic images—phantasmata—are so potent that they may even be able to destroy the memory.

6. Porta’s Place in the History of Philosophy

In most encyclopedias over the centuries, Giovan Battista Porta is remembered for particular inventions—for instance, the telescope (Reeves 2008; Saito 2011; Balbiani 2008). This tendency to decontextualize Porta’s (vast) oeuvre by treating it as a quarry of ideas actually dates back to his contemporaries: scholars and theologians as varied in temperament and intellectual inclination as Francis Bacon (1561–1626) and Athansius Kircher, S.J. (1602–1680) knowingly plagiarized Porta’s segreti, whether to show how to improve the human condition through the systematic investigation of nature or to demonstrate God’s wondrous omnipotence in nature (Vermeir 2012). William Gilbert (1544–1603) felt it necessary to take issue with the animistic theories that Porta used to explain magnetism (Kodera 2014), and Tommaso Campanella (at that time still a faithful disciple of Bernardino Telesio(1508/9–1588)) had already deplored Porta’s lack of method, which precluded the development of a new metaphysics of nature (Eamon 1995). His many difficulties with the inquisition—censors disapproved of his works on divinatory arts such as physiognomonics, the art of predicting character traits from the faces of humans—were compounded by the distrust of more orthodox intellectuals such as Jean Bodin (1529/30–1596), who would have loved to see Porta burn at the stake for naturalizing the Witches’ Sabbath (like Girolamo Cardano (1501–1576), Porta had divulged a recipe for the infamous witch’s unguent) (Magia 1558: lib.2, ch. 26; Ernst 1991; Balbiani 2001). Porta reacted to these challenges by attempting to abstain from metaphysical speculation and theology; there is good reason to believe that Porta’s naturalist stance was actually a consequence of ecclesiastical persecution (Trabucco 2002, 2005). Accordingly, he developed a strictly natural magic—natural in the sense that the formal principles driving the movement of things in the cosmos were taken as “occult”, with many causes of their often marvelous properties per se unknowable to us. Porta’s experiments thus prudently sought to eclipse all hint of religious topics, including God, the soul, and demons.

By eliding discussion of the metaphysical and religious implications of his experiments, Porta tends to direct attention to the physical preconditions and occult, yet natural, qualities that allow for spectacular manifestations of portentous qualities in physical bodies, whether human, animal or vegetable.[2] The infamous recipe for an unguent employed by witches is a good example of Porta’s approach: the nocturnal flights and orgiastic encounters with demons and the devil that represent witchcraft’s stock in trade are, according to Porta, in fact mere hallucinations caused by belladonna—a material substance with occult, but non-demonic properties (Balbiani 2001). This explanation rests on the extent to which the human soul is affected by the occult properties of natural substances. Like Pietro Pomponazzi (1462–1525), who with his De incantationibus had sought to naturalize all miracles, Porta seeks to bypass the question of “proper” miracles produced by divine intercession. Yet and in contrast to Pomponazzi, who sought to eliminate as much as he could of the preternatural, Porta continued to believe fervently in occult sympathies and, up to his last unpublished works such as the Thaumaturgia, tried to preserve as much of the Neoplatonic magical tradition as possible. For Porta, the visible and perceptible qualities of certain material dispositions become embodied signs of a larger and ultimately divine cosmic order to which all natural bodies, including human beings, are subject.

Porta’s account thus has the marked and unorthodox tendency to eclipse human agency aside from the figure of the natural magus, who by dint of his natural talent, erudition, and wealth is in a position to manipulate and command the natural properties of many substances and objects. Porta himself cultivated an image of being far keener on staging marvellous experiments or divulging (more or less credible) secrets than on investigating, say, theoretical foundations of natural causation. His approach geared to the naturalization of the human being—body and mind—is perhaps the most suitable focus for studying his thought; here his ideas can be linked not only to contemporaries of his such as Giordano Bruno but also to the tradition of libertine philosophers leading up to Marquis de Sade (1740–1814).

When measured against the sophisticated metaphysical backdrop of Neoplatonic Renaissance magic, Porta’s theoretical approach appears disappointingly simple and rather epigonic—or, as Borelli (2014) has argued, unsystematic and thereby unfettered by doctrinal ballast and open to innovation. Upon closer scrutiny, a very complex picture emerges. When one considers Porta’s numerous literary and scientific texts, he must be ranked among a highly influential group of philosophers/scientists/magicians including Marsilio Ficino, Giovanni Pico della Mirandola (1463–1494), Pietro Pomponazzi, and Agrippa von Nettesheim (see Agrippa 1991). Under shifting historical circumstances and in various ways, these “preternatural philosophers” shared a deep interest in the marvelous and the demonic arts.

Within this tradition, Porta was a relative latecomer; he dedicated his endeavor to a “sublime science” that catered to a courtly environment increasingly subject to absolutist leadership (Daston and Park 1998). Indeed, Porta managed to attract the attention of the most powerful patrons in the occult arts and alchemy, among them Emperor Rudolph II and Philip II of Spain. When seen in their proper historical context, Porta’s literary and scientific activities appear as a particular form of self-fashioning for the emerging class of courtiers under absolutist rulers (Greenblatt 1980; Biagioli 1991; MacDonald 2005). Hence, viewing Porta’s oeuvre as a product of this courtly environment helps us understand his contribution to a characteristic form of comportment, where the practice of deception and dissimulation is tied to the crafty staging of marvellous appearances (Snyder 2009; Kodera 2012).

This topic of the marvellous (meraviglia), and of emotions elicited by attendant stupefaction, is so essential for Porta that he projects it onto the whole of creation, thus endowing it with the status of a universal law. In a crucial passage from the Magia 1558, he writes that Nature herself—the great female magician—creates all her wonders out of delight in her own shows (bk. 1, ch. 9).

Both this anthropomorphic perception of nature and the importance accorded to marveling in it reveal the close affinity between Porta’s magical practices and his texts for the stage. Porta evidences a keen sense for media’s power to manipulate individuals and masses alike by way of drugs or optical deceptions, wondrous performances, and the employment of the physical traits of individual human beings. He believed that our physiognomonic features, the shapes of our bodies, are indicative of hidden inclinations (for this reason, a master physiognomonist may speedily detect criminals and other abject persons). Hence, throughout Porta’s oeuvre we can detect the link he establishes between policing, naturalizing and assimilating human beings among other animals, all under the sway of occult but natural astrological influences. With his works on physiognomony, Porta undoubtedly sought to offer his services to absolutist rulers and courtiers. This approach distinguishes Porta from his predecessors: Ficino had directed his intellectual energies towards the development of a Theologia Platonica, i.e., a spiritual culture in which the Platonic tradition would be compatible with Christianity, to which end Ficino translated and wrote commentaries on Plato and the Neoplatonists. Ficino developed the principles for a kind of natural magic directed not at impressing audiences, but rather at the amelioration of elderly scholars’ melancholy temperaments (Copenhaver 2007).


List of Porta’s Works

The editors of the “Edizione Nazionale Delle Opere di Giovan Battista della Porta” (Naples: Edizioni Scientifiche Italiane, Raffaele Sirri, general editor) have so far printed an impressive number of Porta’s texts:

  • Ars reminiscendi, 1602 (1996).
  • Claudii Ptolemaei magnae constructionis liber primus, 1588 (2000).
  • Coelestis physiognomonia, 1603 (1996).
  • De aeris transmutationibus, 1610 (2000).
  • De ea naturalis physiognomoniae parte quale ad manuum lineas spectat libri duo (2003).
  • De humana physiognomonia—libri sex, 1584/1601 (2011).
  • Della fisionomia dell'uomo Libri sei, 1596 (2011–13).
  • De munitione libri tres, 1608 (2013).
  • Elementorum curvilineorum libri tres, 1610 (2005).
  • Pneumaticorum libri tres, 1601 (2008).
  • Taumatologia e Criptologia (2013).
  • Teatro, in 4 Volumes (2000–2003)
  • Villae, in 3 Volumes, 1592 (2010).

Other editions

  • De telescopio. Edited and introduced by Vasco Ronchi e Maria Amalia Naldoni. Florence: Fondazione Giorgio Ronchi. 1962
  • Metoposcopia. Edited and introduced by Giovanni Aquilecchia. Naples: Istituto Suor Orsola Benincasa. 1990.

Historic editions and translations

  • De distillationibus libri IX. Strasbourg: L. Zetzner, 1609.
  • Magiae naturalis, sive, De miraculis rerum naturalivm libri IIII. Naples: Matthias Cancer, 1558.
  • Magiae Naturalis libri xx. Napels: Horazio Salviani 1589
  • Natural magick. London, 1658. [Anastatic reprint, of English Translation of 1589 edn. Of the Magia. New York: Basic Books, 1957]

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