Decision-Making Capacity

First published Tue Jan 15, 2008; substantive revision Mon Jun 20, 2011

In many Western jurisdictions, the law presumes that adult persons, and sometimes children that meet certain criteria, are capable of making their own health care decisions; for example, consenting to a particular medical treatment, or consenting to participate in a research trial. But what exactly does it mean to say that a subject has or lacks the requisite capacity to decide? This last question has to do with what is commonly called “decisional capacity,” a central concept in health care law and ethics, and increasingly an independent topic of philosophical inquiry.

Decisional capacity can be defined as the ability of health care subjects to make their own health care decisions. Questions of ‘capacity’ sometimes extend to other contexts, such as capacity to stand trial in a court of law, and the ability to make decisions that relate to personal care and finances. However, for the purposes of this discussion, the notion of decisional capacity will be limited to health care contexts only; most notably, those where decisions to consent to or refuse treatment are concerned.

The combined theoretical and practical nature of decisional capacity in the area of consent is probably one of the things that makes it so intellectually compelling to philosophers who write about it. But this is still largely uncultivated philosophical territory. One reason is the highly interdisciplinary and rapidly changing nature of the field. Clinical methods and tests to assess capacity are proliferating. The law is also increasingly being called upon to respond to these clinical developments. All of this makes for a very eclectic and challenging field of inquiry. Philosophers must tread carefully if their contributions are to be timely and relevant.

1. Informed Consent

The origins of our contemporary concept of decisional capacity lie in a varied configuration of historical developments in health care law and ethics that accompany the rise of the doctrine of informed consent. That doctrine is intended to promote and protect the autonomy of health care subjects (Faden & Beauchamp 1986). It is commonly observed that autonomy in this context ‘flows from the recognition that all persons have unconditional worth, each having the capacity to determine his or her own moral destiny’ (Beauchamp & Childress 2001, 63–4). To respect autonomy in this case means that ‘we have a fundamental obligation to ensure that patients have the right to choose, as well as the right to accept or decline information’ (Beauchamp & Childress 2001, 63). Allowing adult persons and some children to make their own health care decisions is an essential component of this conception of autonomy.

Typically, in order to be deemed legally and ethically valid, an individual's consent must be properly informed and free of coercion (Faden & Beauchamp, 1986). A third requirement is that the individual whose consent is being sought is actually able to accomplish the decisional task at hand; in other words, they must have the ability to make that particular decision. This condition is sometimes referred to as ‘competence’ on the grounds that what is at issue is ‘the ability to perform a task’ (Beauchamp & Childress 2001, 70). It is also sometimes referred to as ‘capacity’, since the task in question involves the capacity to make a decision (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 84). We return to these exegetical issues once we have a better idea of what the concept of “decisional capacity,” as defined, is meant to capture.

The concept of decision-making capacity is therefore evidently broad in scope, emerging from a rich history that spans health care law, ethics, and philosophy. Debates surrounding the correct definition and application of the concept take place in all three domains, and many discussions endeavor to accommodate and integrate all three perspectives. There is a fourth item we must add to our list. This is the fact that there now exist an impressive variety of clinical tests and methods to assess capacity (Dunn et al. 2006; Vellinga et al. 2004; Welie 2001), which adds yet another dimension to the evaluation of claims about capacity. Tests for capacity need to be assessed for their reliability and major concepts and theories need to be empirically validated. This last element of capacity addresses the epistemic question how we can know an individual meets certain standards for capacity. Such questions must be distinguished from the conceptual and normative task of determining what capacity is and how it should be defined.

The fact that the concept of decisional capacity must serve many masters is important to keep in mind when assessing theories of decisional capacity and individual determinations of capacity. One must be careful to acknowledge the divergent methodological aims and limits of different methods and theories. This still leaves a large role for philosophy, since many of the challenges that face the theory of decisional capacity are inextricably philosophical in nature. The role of rationality in decision-making, and the role of values and emotion in choice, are among some of the more central philosophical questions we shall consider.

2. Elements of Capacity

Comprehensive theories of decisional capacity fall into two main groups. Some discussions remain at a very philosophical level (Buchanan & Brock 1989; Culver & Gert 1987, 1999, 2004; Drane 1985; Freedman 1981). In more empirically oriented discussions, a concerted effort is made to define concepts operationally and specialized psychometric tests are proposed (Etchells 1999; Kim 2010; Grisso & Appelbaum 1998; Welie 2001). The law also has its own history of tests and procedures that bear on the assessment of capacity (Roth et al. 1977; Zapf & Roesch 2005). Indeed, the manner in which clinical assessments of capacity interface with the relevant law constitutes an important topic of its own (Owen et al. 2009; Richardson 2010).

Despite this variety of approaches, it is possible to identify some shared posits in leading contemporary work on decisional capacity. Very often, decisional capacity is divided into four sub-capacities. These are: (1) Understanding; (2) Appreciation; (3) Reasoning; (4) Choice. In some instances, capacity is also said to include: (5) Values. But not always. The basic elements of capacity and their rationale are the following:

(1). Understanding. Perhaps the most basic element of capacity is understanding (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 23). Obviously, in order to be capable of consenting to or refusing a given treatment, a subject must have some basic understanding of the facts involved in that decision. Yet this apparently simple requirement can turn out to be rather complex depending on how ‘understanding’ itself is defined (Drane 1985). Basic comprehension and knowledge or cognition of facts is one minimal interpretation (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 37–42). However, most commentators recognize that this level of mental ability is not enough for generating the sort of health care decisions we are concerned with.

(2). Appreciation. In addition to understanding in the basic factual sense alluded to above, most writers on capacity agree that subjects must also have some appreciation of the nature and significance of the decision that they are faced with (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 42–52). The reason is that in order to understand what the facts in a decision really ‘are’, they must mean something to the decision-maker. Very basically, subjects must recognize that this really is their decision to make, that it is their life and values and future that are at stake. Thus, in addition to understanding, subjects must be able ‘to appreciate the nature and meaning of potential alternatives — what it would be like and “feel” like to be in possible future states and to undergo various experiences — and to integrate this appreciation into one's decision making’ (Buchanan & Brock, 1989, 24). This element of capacity is sometimes held to derive from the legal requirement that each subject must have ‘insight’ into the circumstances of a given decision (Glass 1997).

(3). Reasoning. Without the mental ability to engage in reasoning and manipulate information rationally, it is impossible for understanding and appreciation to issue in a decision (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 24–25; Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 52–58). The concept of reasoning is often left vague in discussions of decisional capacity. Probably this is because insisting on too high and specific a normative standard of reasoning might risk making a majority of health care subjects decisionally incapable; a reductio ad absurdum of any theory of decisional capacity that implied such a result. Yet normative standards of reasoning sometimes do get mentioned, for example, consistency and the ability to derive conclusions from premises (Freedman 1981). Reasoning is also usually said to include the ability to weigh risks and benefits and evaluate putative consequences. Again, no specific normative criteria for success are spelled out. Difficult cases must therefore be assessed individually.

(4). Choice. It is possible to imagine a case where understanding and appreciation and reasoning are all intact, but where a subject has no way to express or communicate their intended decision. It is impossible for them to express a choice. Yet unless a subject's preferred choice can be expressed to others in some outward way, it is impossible to know their intended decision. The condition is not trivial, since some patients — for example, stroke victims — can have an active mental life and satisfy our first three conditions for capacity, but are unable to express anything verbally or through gestures (e.g. blinking the eyes, lifting a finger etc.). This has led some commentators to add the ability to express a choice to the list of elements that comprise capacity (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 34–37). This is perhaps the least mental of the sub-capacities that constitute capacity, which may explain why it is not considered an element of capacity by some authors.

(5). Values. In addition to these four elements of capacity, some theorists explicitly state that capacity requires a set of values (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 24–25). Since a subject's values can be expected to change over time, what is required is not an immutable, fixed, set of values, but a minimally consistent and stable set of values (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 24). Another way of expressing this point is to say that capacity requires ‘a conception of what is good’ (Ibid). The reason for this last requirement should be obvious. Weighing the risks and benefits of various alternative choices requires values (Charland 1998a). So does selecting one option over others. Yet some leading accounts of capacity are strangely silent over the role and place of values in capacity (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998). Perhaps this is because the formulation and elaboration of values to guide choice usually involves emotion. As we shall see, this is an aspect of capacity that some theorists would prefer to downplay.

3. Assumptions

Two central assumptions underlie virtually all contemporary work on decisional capacity. These derive largely from the requirements that the law imposes on the ethics of informed consent .

The first assumption is that decision-making capacity is decision relative (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 18–20). The significance of this assumption is that capacity is always assessed relative to a specific decision, at a particular time, in a particular context. Note that this differs markedly from the era when capacity was thought to extend globally over time and place, irrespective of context (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 20–23). One important consequence of this assumption is that traditional psychometric instruments for judging ‘mental status’, like the mini-mental state examination, are no longer deemed acceptable for assessing capacity in the context of consent (Folstein et al. 1975). The mini-mental state examination is a simple psychometric tool that helps clinicians ask and rank patient's responses to questions that inquire into their mental ‘status’. The questions have to do with orientation (‘Where are you right now?’) and also address basic perceptual and mental skills (‘Can you count back from 100 subtracting 7 at a time?). Although extremely popular and practical, the mini-mental state examination is now thought to be too global and general for a proper assessment of a patient's mental capacity to make treatment decisions. Indeed, by law, assessments of capacity must now be more ‘case-specific’ and responsive to ‘situational variations in demands’ (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 22). Thus ‘decisional relativity’ now requires that the assessment of the mental capacity to make a treatment decision must be directly tied to a particular decision, for a particular patient, at a specific place and time.

A second assumption that pervades contemporary work on decisional capacity is that decision-making capacity is a threshold concept (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 26–29). Of course, depending on the nature and sophistication of the tools used to assess capacity, it is sometimes possible to meaningfully speak of ‘degrees’ of capacity. The problem is that, in practice, what is required of a determination of capacity is a practical judgment of a bivalent type. This bivalent character of capacity judgments derives from the special practical function of capacity determinations, which is to issue an ‘all-or-nothing’ and ‘yes-or-no’ verdict about whether a person can make a particular decision for herself or not (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 27).

4. Terminology

As defined above, the term “decisional capacity” is meant to capture a component of informed consent. This is the ability of subjects to make health care decisions; primarily decisions to consent to or refuse treatment. Yet while there is some agreement on what the sub-capacities that underlie decisional capacity are supposed to be, the same cannot be said of the term “decisional capacity” itself. In fact, there is a large amount of disagreement and confusion over whether “decisional capacity” is an appropriate term to refer to this element of informed consent. The other candidate is the term “competence.” Generally, in these discussions, ‘capacity’ and ‘competence’ are understood to mean ‘decisional capacity’ and ‘mental competence’, respectively. These terminological infelicities can cause considerable confusion but are often overlooked. There are a number of strategies in the literature for addressing them.

One way to settle our problem is to use the terms “capacity” and “competence” interchangeably and warn against exceptions. This usually is done by adding a minor proviso or caveat at the beginning of a discussion to that effect (Charland 2002, 37 note 1; Checkland 2001, 53, note 2; National Bioethics Advisory Commission 1998, Ch1. Note 4). The strategy has the virtue of avoiding the cumbersome repeated substitution of one term for the other in or across discussions where both are used. But it can also inadvertently perpetuate confusion of just the sort it is meant to obviate.

Another strategy for addressing our terminological problem can be gleaned from a leading reference work in the area, entitled Deciding for Others. In this pioneering book, Allen Buchanan and Dan Brock write that ‘competence is competence for some task, competence to do something’ (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 84; emphasis in original). They then specify their own focus, which is ‘competence to make a decision’ (Ibid.). This leads to a lengthy discussion of what the authors call “decision-making competence” and its standards, as well as the specific ‘decision-making capacities’ that are said to underlie what they call “decision competence.” According to this strategy, the introduction of a new term — “decisional competence” — is the proposed solution. Unfortunately, this stipulative solution arguably compounds rather than simplifies our problem, since it is more common to speak of “decisional capacity” than “decisional competence.”

A third strategy is to attempt to reconcile the usage of our two terms — “competence” and “capacity” — by establishing their independence and then paying heed to those differences. For example, in their landmark study, Competence to Consent to Treatment, Thomas Grisso and Paul Appelbaum consider the following approach:

… we talk of “decision-making capacities” when we refer to the abilities related to decisions. We use the term “competence,” however, to denote the state in which a patient's decision-making capacities are sufficiently intact for their decisions to be honored (and conversely for incompetence) regardless of who makes the determination. (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 11)

This last suggestion is reasonable enough, but it is hard to see why it should be preferred to the stipulative solution proposed above.

Finally, a fourth strategy for solving our terminological problem is to focus on who makes the determination of a subject's decisional ability. On one interpretation, this approach leads to the view that ‘decision making capacity is a clinical assessment of a patient's ability to make specific health care decisions, whereas competency is a legal determination of the patient's ability to make his or her own decisions in general’ (Ganzini et al., 2004, 264). Against this option, it can be argued that, while attractive in principle, the proposed distinction breaks down in practice. Indeed, as Thomas Grisso and Paul Appelbaum aptly remind us, physicians often make assessments of capacity that effectively carry the weight of legal judgments, even though the courts are not directly involved (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 11).

Despite this last rebuttal, it remains true that in some legal jurisdictions, like Britain, the term “capacity” is usually taken to be a legal one (Bielby 2005; Tan & Elphik 2002). On the other hand, in the United States, it is the terminology of “competence” that is often said to carry legal connotations and authority (Buchanan 2004; Berg et al. 1996). So, the law does offer some manner to choose between our two terms. However, this is not very helpful, since as soon as we switch jurisdictions or engage in comparative work, terms change.

What all of this means is that anyone researching the concept of decisional capacity should be wary of taking key terms at face value and must make sure to examine their underlying origins and assumptions. In this discussion, we assume that the concepts of “decisional capacity” and “mental competence” are interchangeable, unless specified otherwise. However, in the name of simplicity and consistency, we use the terminology of “decisional capacity” for the purposes of exposition.

5. Rationality

A theory of decisional capacity must allow for the fact that health care subjects can make unpopular decisions, even ones that are considered highly irrational by others. A good example of such a decision is the refusal of life-saving transfusion due to doctrinal religious reasons (Charland 2001, 137). Indeed, it is considered axiomatic in most theoretical work on decisional capacity that ‘clinicians should not conclude that patients lack decision-making capacity just because they make a decision contrary to medical advice’ (Ganzini 2004, 264). The challenge is that, while a theory of decisional capacity must allow for such apparently irrational decisions, it must also embody a clear and robust test of capacity. It is therefore an important desideratum of an adequate theory of decisional capacity that it permit some kinds of highly irrational decisions, but forbid others.

The most widely accepted solution to the requirement that a theory of decisional capacity permit some irrational decisions but forbid others, is to construe decisional capacity as a matter of process (Buchanan & Brock 1989; Freedman 1981). On this view, capacity has more to do with the nature of the reasoning process whereby one arrives at a decision, rather than the content or outcome of the actual decision itself. What counts is the ‘internal rationality’ of the reasoning process. ‘Internal rationality’ in this sense is supposed to be distinguishable from ‘external rationality’. There is in fact a division among theories of decisional capacity between those that stress ‘internal rationality’ and process as a major criterion of capacity, and those that insist instead on the primacy of ‘external rationality’ and outcomes (Charland 2001).

Consider, again, the example of refusal of life-saving transfusion based on adherence to religious doctrine. It can plausibly be argued that, in such a case, a subject is decisionally capable to make a decision of this sort as long as it is rational according to internal reasons they recognize as theirs (Freedman 1981). This is an example of internal rationality. To this example one can add the condition that the decision must accord with the subject's basic goals and values (Buchanan & Brock 1989). In cases where criteria like these are said to be satisfied, subjects are sometimes deemed to be decisionally capable to refuse treatment and their decisions are honored. Decisional capacity in such cases is ultimately a matter of internal rationality. In such theories, capacity is allegedly assessed without evaluating the content or outcome of the decision. But of course to be meaningful, the decision must have some ‘content’ — what it is about — which may be called its ‘putative’ content (Charland 2001).

Theories that construe decisional capacity as a matter of internal rationality are sometimes criticized on the grounds that they ignore the importance of ‘external rationality’ as a criterion of capacity. Consider the example of a subject who refuses electroconvulsive treatment for depression because of an irrational fear of the procedure, even though they have consented to and benefited from it in the past (Culver & Gert 1987, 2004). In this case, the outcome of the decision to refuse treatment can plausibly be said to be irrational; so irrational, indeed, that the subject should be deemed incapable to refuse treatment and the decision overruled. On this view, ‘internal rationality’ and the mental processes involved in understanding and appreciation are not sufficient for establishing decisional capacity, although they may be necessary (Culver & Gert 1997). Some standard of ‘external capacity’ is also required. It is necessary to consider the outcome of decisions in order to rule on capacity. According to one such prominent theory of ‘external rationality’, capacity should be defined as the ability to make rational decisions, in this external sense (Culver & Gert 2004, 265).

6. Risk and Symmetry

Part of what is involved in reasoning about a particular course of action and reaching a decision is weighing the risks and benefits and consequences of proposed options. In health care contexts where consent is at issue, this normally amounts to a decisional problem that is framed in symmetrical terms: either one consents to a given treatment option, or one refuses that same treatment option. This way of framing things seems to assume that both poles of the decision are symmetrical and that mental capacity necessarily remains fixed as one evaluates the two options. Yet this is an assumption that can be philosophically challenged.

It is sometimes argued that treatment decisions and refusals are not symmetrical. The reason is that the risks respectively associated with consenting to or refusing treatment are not the same. From this it is inferred that the decisions are not the same; hence, that decisions to consent to or refuse treatment are not symmetrical. There have been substantial debates over the symmetricality question (Brock 1991; Buller 2001; Cale 1999; Checkland 2001; Skene 1991; Wicclair, 1991, 1999; Wilks 1997, 1999). An interesting aspect of these debates is whether decisional capacity should be considered a fixed mental commodity, or instead assessed according to a ‘sliding scale’ that varies with the associated risks and circumstances (Buchanan & Brock 1989, 60). However, while it may seem plausible to say that riskier decisions ought to require higher standards or levels of capacity, critics respond that there is something counterintuitive about claiming that mental capacities can vary according to external circumstances in this way (Culver & Gert 2004, 264).

7. Dual Nature of Competence

In assessing claims about capacity, it is important to distinguish between descriptive and factual aspects of capacity on the one hand, and prescriptive and normative aspects on the other. As one commentator explains: ‘a psychiatrist may give expert testimony, in his capacity as a trained observer, about a person's competence seen as a factual matter, and the judge may or may not give this testimony practical effect in deciding how we ought to treat that person’ (Freedman 1981, 55). In this example, the first claim addresses the issue whether the individual is decisionally capable. The second claim addresses the issue whether the individual should be considered decisionally capable. Note that this dual nature of capacity goes beyond individual judgments of capacity and extends to theories of capacity as a whole. It is especially important not to conflate or equivocate between these two aspects of capacity when assessing theories and determinations of capacity. At the same time, paying heed to the distinction makes the concept of capacity both philosophically problematic and empirically elusive.

Consider, first, individual determinations of capacity. There are now a number of published studies that report on the decisional capacity of different patient groups to consent to treatment or research. In some cases, depressed patients are found to be decisionally capable and compare well with matched controls (Appelbaum & Grisso 1995). At the same time, some clinicians warn that we should be wary of such results. The reason is that the ability of depressed patients to weigh risks and benefits is most likely compromised due to their depressed mood, even though cognitively their reasoning may be intact (Elliott 1999; Rudnick 2001). There are two ways to interpret the claims that are at odds in this dispute. First, there is the descriptive claim that the subjects are capable. Second, there is the normative claim that, notwithstanding this descriptive fact of the matter, the subjects nonetheless probably should not be declared capable. Note that what critics are arguing is not that a better use of the same tests would yield a more accurate set of descriptive results, namely, a determination of incapacity rather than a determination of capacity. Instead, the point is that it may be the test and its underlying theory that need to be reexamined.

A rather different situation occurs in debates about whether addicted subjects have the capacity to consent to research that employs their drug of choice, notably, heroin (Charland 2002). Compared to the above case, what is different about this example is the fact that the debate lies at the descriptive level only. The issue is what a given test will yield, if it is applied, and that it must be applied; not, as above, that we probably should not accept the results of a test, since there are normative grounds to doubt the appropriateness of the test.

There is in fact a surprising absence of empirical research on the ability of addicted individuals to consent to treatment or research (Anderson & Du Bois 2007; Charland 2011). Until such research is conducted, we cannot say with certitude whether subjects of this sort are capable to consent or not. Debates of this descriptive sort also occur in the literature on the capacity of schizophrenic subjects to consent to research (Carpenter 2000; Weijer 1999). But in this case, many of the requisite studies have been carried out and the empirical data base is much richer than in the case of addiction.

In debates like the above, it is easy to equivocate between the descriptive claim that a subject is or is not capable, and the normative judgment that they should or should not be considered capable. Yet since the two kinds of claims are so interdependent, it is easy to inadvertently conflate or confuse one level of argument with the other. Explicitly acknowledging and respecting the dual nature of capacity is an important safeguard for avoiding these pitfalls. It helps distinguish cases where what is at issue is primarily a descriptive matter, namely, the application of a given theory or test of capacity, from cases that are essentially normative in nature, for example, where what is at issue is the empirical validity of the concept of capacity embodied in a given test.

8. Empirical Validity

At the origin of any theory of capacity, there lies a set of paradigm examples around which the theory is built and which it must account for. Thus, in the initial instance, a theory is built around a selection of paradigm examples of what capacity and incapacity should be taken to be. With few notable exceptions, these normative origins of the theory of decisional capacity are seldom explicitly stated or debated (Culver & Gert 1987). The focus, instead, appears to be on ensuring that specific tests are statistically reliable, and on generating empirical data on the decisional capacity of various patient groups (Appelbaum & Grisso, 1995; Grisso et al. 1995; Grisso & Appelbaum 1995). We saw above that there are instances where the assessment of results yielded by specific tests for capacity start to merge into normative evaluative questions that bear on the empirical validity of those tests. In fact, questions of empirical validity are a matter of increasing concern in the recent literature on capacity (Appelbaum 2007, 1838; Howe 2009).

In a study that assesses the capacity of anorexic patients to consent to and refuse treatment, psychiatrist Jacinta Tan and her colleagues have compiled evidence which suggests that one of the most popular empirical tests of capacity may embody a faulty theoretical conception of decisional capacity (Tan et al., 2003a, 2003b, 2007, 2009). First, Tan and colleagues apply the MacCAT-T test for competence developed by Tom Grisso and Paul Appelbaum to their research subjects (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998, 173–200). Then, based on the results of additional qualitative data collected from those subjects, Tan and her colleagues challenge the individual capacity determinations of the MacCAT-T. Thus, claims that the subjects are capable to consent to or refuse treatment according to the MacCAT-T, are challenged on the basis that there is convincing independent evidence that those same subjects should not be considered decisionally capable.

While Tan and her colleagues do not argue that their study shows that the MacCAT-T and its supporting theory are entirely empirically invalid, philosophically, this is a legitimate interpretation of what is at issue (Charland 2006). The problem is not simply that the MacCAT-T may be off base on a few problematic cases; a tension that further applications of the test might resolve. Rather, the point is that the MacCAT-T appears to be profoundly off the mark; that there is a foundational problem with the theory. In her study, Tan asks subjects who wish to refuse treatment for their reasons. Reponses by subjects reveal that often their putative decision is based on fundamental overvaluations of their fatness and deeply entrenched iatrogenic assumptions about personhood. These pathological valuations, Tan argues, are a direct causal result of severe anorexia. So the irrationality here is due to the disease. Because the MacCAT-T is not designed to incorporate such data on reasons and values, it predicts that the subjects are capable to refuse treatment, even though, in Tan's view, her own evidence suggests the opposite.

9. Value and Emotion

The example of anorexia above shows that concerns about the empirical validity of theories and tests of decisional capacity are not always simply based on a clash of intuitions over paradigm cases. Evidence about a subjects' underlying values is also relevant. A similar case can be made for the centrality of values in conceptualizations of voluntarism, another pivotal ingredient of informed consent. Which brings us back to the topic of emotion and the status of value as an element of capacity.

Leading clinical theories and tests of decisional capacity tend to be exclusively cognitive in nature and orientation (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998; Etchells 1999). As a result, those tests and theories ignore the positive contribution of emotion to capacity (Charland 1998a). Of course, emotions and their associated feelings can conflict with and impair the mental functions that underlie capacity. But what is rarely acknowledged is that emotions and feelings also have a positive role to play; indeed, that capacity without emotion is impossible.

Philosophers have been stressing the positive importance of emotion for the theory of decisional capacity for some time (Buchanan & Brock, 1989; Drane 1985; White 1997). After all, it seems obvious that most decisions to consent to or refuse treatment are made largely on the basis of emotion, or at least have important contributing emotional factors. Thus, there is the hope or despair that one will get well; or there can be anger, fear, or joy that one will undergo a given procedure. In such cases emotions and their underlying valuations often function as reasons for action (Charland 1998b). Not surprisingly, concerns over the absence of emotion from leading models of capacity have started to emerge in the clinical literature on capacity (Berghmans 2004; Roberts 2002b; Torsten & Vollman 2004; Vellinga et al. 2004). Here it is important not to forget that decisional capacity in the context of consent is invariably a matter of ‘practical judgment’ (Pepper-Smith et al., 1996). This makes the contribution of emotion doubly important. The reason is that in practical judgment emotions are ‘on-line’ and therefore usually have a marked felt bodily dimension (Charland 1998b).

Emotions and their associated feelings both embody and promote core values of the organism. Thus an important corollary of the fact that emotions are central to decisional capacity, is that values as well are equally important (Charland 2001). Yet most leading theories of capacity have very little to say about value, preferring instead to stick to ostensibly more tangible and ‘objective’ matters of fact (Grisso & Appelbaum 1998). As a result, subjects are seldom asked ‘why’ questions that probe into the values behind their expressed preferences (Tan 2007). Yet in the case of mental disorders that impair valuation, there are good reasons to think this information highly clinically relevant. Indeed, pathologically-induced changes in values appear to play a large role in a number of medical conditions where capacity is thought to be impaired.

For example, in the case of anorexia, pathologically induced overvaluation of thinness may be a central contributing factor underlying impaired decision-making capacity (Tan 2007). Conversely, in addiction, pathological overvaluation of addictive substances probably contributes to impaired capacity (Charland 2002, 2007). Recall, also, the case of depression, where the fact that subjects may undervalue risks arguably impairs capacity (Elliott 1997; Rudnick 2002). Finally, there is Alzheimer's disease, which poses particularly vexing challenges that implicate value and capacity (Jaworska 1999).

In all of the above examples, the mental disorder in question can cause pathological alternations in value that may impair decision-making capacity. When those changes in value are sufficiently pervasive and severe, they may even threaten personal identity, since it is no longer clear that the valuations which inform decision-making are authentically chosen by the subject. Instead, they are caused and imposed by the disease. At this point, we can legitimately wonder whether we have crossed the line from capacity to accountability. The point is no longer merely whether a subject is capable to consent to or refuse treatment. There is now the further question whether a subject can be considered accountable for her decision; whether, that is, the decision is truly her own (Elliott 1991).

Evidently, further empirical research on how valuation contributes to capacity is required before we can devise tests that declare subjects to be incapable due to pathological valuations. But that valuation should be considered a contributing factor in decisional capacity seems both philosophically and clinically indisputable. None of this removes the cognitive bias of the law, which remains stubbornly institutionally and historically entrenched: a legal noose around the theoretical neck of capacity. And so, until such a time as the law changes, the theory of decisional capacity will remain in a state of tension: torn between new clinical developments and empirical research that increasingly call for the inclusion of values and emotion in the theory of capacity, and the cognitive inertia of the law (Appelbaum 1998). Philosophy is sure to play a critical role in articulating and meeting these challenges. However, right now we have to wonder whether it is ethically appropriate for the theory of decisional capacity to treat health care subjects as if they were only cognizers, when in fact they are also emoters. That seems a dismal failure of the principle of respect for autonomy — which, ironically, is what led us to inquire into capacity in the first place.

10. Revival of Voluntarism

Together with decision-making capacity and the provision of relevant information, the capacity for voluntary choice — voluntarism — is one of the three fundamental pillars of informed consent. Indeed, the very first principle of the Nuremberg Code states that, “the voluntary consent of the human subject is absolutely essential” (U.S.A. vs. Karl Brandt, 1949). The Code goes on to specify that, “the person involved…should be so situated as to be able to exercise free power of choice, without the intervention of any element of force, fraud, deceit, duress, overreaching, or other ulterior form of constraint or coercion …” (ibid.). This principle, which is meant to protect the inviolability of the capacity for voluntary choice in the context of research, is also fundamental in the ethical and legal principles that govern the doctrine of informed consent in the context of treatment.

Until recently, there has been a remarkable paucity of empirical research on the capacity for voluntary choice in the context of consent, and the means to assess it (Appelbaum et al. 2009, 31; Roberts 2002b, 705). Fortunately, that situation is changing, and there is now a limited but important revival of scholarly work on voluntarism in the relevant literature (Appelbaum et al. 2009; Weiss Roberts 2002b; Geppert 2007). There is of course a long and valuable tradition of philosophical work on voluntarism in the biomedical and ethical literature on consent. What distinguishes the revival we are concerned with from this long venerable tradition, is a sharp clinical focus on empirical theoretical construction and conceptualization, as well as the attempt to develop assessment tools.

The reasons for taking voluntarism in this clinical sense seriously should be obvious. In the early days of psychiatry, it was widely recognized that there could be lesions of the will, just as there could be lesions of the understanding and the affective faculties. Towards the end of the last century, the French philosopher-psychologist Théodule Ribot published a highly influential book on the topic, entitled Les maladies de la volonté — later translated as ‘Diseases of the Will’ (Ribot 1883). Ribot argued that the capacity for voluntary choice could sometimes be compromised, perverted, or even virtually obliterated, by disease, and that the various impairments that resulted deserved to be scientifically studied and classified. While it is no longer popular to speak of ‘diseases of the will’ in this way, contemporary clinicians and researchers do recognize that human will and agency can be impaired in various ways by diseases of many sorts. The problem is that how exactly these deficits impact on decision-making capacity, and what they mean for the doctrine of informed consent, remains largely unclear.

Addiction is a case in point. We have seen that there are a number of ways in which choice may be compromised in severe forms of substance dependence. Some of these impairments, like pathological hyperbolic fluctuations and deviations in values, might be classified as problems with decision-making capacity, strictly speaking; in particular, appreciation and reasoning (Charland 2002). Other impairments, such as those stemming directly from disordered impulse or compulsion, might more helpfully be addressed by adopting the perspective of voluntarism (Roberts 2002a). A big problem with attempting to settle such questions is that, “voluntarism, as a capacity has not been adequately examined or empirically studied for its ingredient elements” (Roberts 2002a, 58). Until we know how to conceptualize the capacity for voluntary choice, it is hard to know exactly how to distinguish it from decision-making capacity, and therefore hard to understand its role in informed consent as a whole. The issues are certainly not limited to addiction, but extend to psychopathology generally. Clearly, new developments in the conceptualization and assessment of the capacity for voluntary choice are directly relevant to parallel efforts to understand and assess decision-making capacity and consent.

Contemporary theoretical approaches to voluntarism tend to highlight and begin with one of two theoretical perspectives: legal or ethical. Currently, the legal perspective is best exemplified in recent work by Paul Appelbaum and his collaborators (Appelbaum et al. 2009). According to this view, the existing law on informed consent is taken as a fundamental given; an essential desideratum for the theoretical viability of any conceptualization of voluntarism that aims to have practical legal import. In contrast, Laura Weiss Roberts proposes a conceptualization of voluntarism where ethical theoretical desiderata play a much larger role than legal ones. It is the law, here, that is expected to be subservient to ethics, and not the reverse. These two perspectives give rise to two quite different definitions of voluntarism.

10.1 Legal Approach to Voluntarism.

Appelbaum and his collaborators state that, “for legal purposes, a decision is presumed voluntary if no evidence exists that someone else has unduly influenced it or coerced the person deciding” (Appelbaum 2009, 32). They go on to specify that “a decision is involuntary only if it is subject to a particular type of influence that is external, intentional, illegitimate, and causally linked to the choice of the subject” (33). The discussion then turns to specific examples of constraints on voluntariness that can arise in research settings. Appeals to shared values, inducements, persuasion, and force, are the four principal types of external influences that are discussed. A full review of the very interesting and detailed examples of types of influence that Appelbaum and his colleagues provide cannot be provided here. However, it is intriguing to note that these examples are virtually all taken from the realm of addiction research; a theoretical fact that begs for elaboration but receives none. Are we to believe that constraints on voluntary choice in this domain are greater than elsewhere?

A great virtue of the conceptualization of voluntariness proposed by Appelbaum and his colleagues is that it is accompanied by a psychometric instrument designed to assess patient's perceptions of coercion. This is the MacArthur Perceived Coercion Scale (PCS). The instrument was originally developed in the context of psychiatric hospitalization. However, we are told that, “a slightly modified version of this questionnaire may be helpful to uncover the extent to which subjects believe that their decisions are not their own, and our experience suggests that this modified version can also be helpful in research consent settings” (36). Admittedly, this is just a start. Improvements are said to require inquiring into “the nature of the influences on respondents' decisions, or their legitimacy” (37). That, in turn, is said to begin with “a general inquiry into the motivations for a person's decision to enrol in research” (37). For this, it will be necessary to ask questions such as, “What made you decide to participate in the research project?” (37).

Questions of the above sort — “Why?” questions — bring us back to the central role of values and reasons among the factors that need to be considered in assessments of decision-making capacity generally (Charland 2001, 2006). It is clear that inclusion of such factors makes the assessment of decision-making capacity, and now voluntariness, much more difficult than consideration of cognitive factors alone. However, this appears to be the price that must be paid in exchange for an empirically valid theoretical conceptualization that is sufficiently rich to do justice to the facts and practical tasks at hand. To give the law and its exclusively cognitive perspective the first and final word on such matters is, in the end, to abdicate on the possibility of attaining an empirically adequate theory of both decision-making capacity, and now voluntariness. No doubt, Appelbaum and his collaborators believe that it is imperative to respect the letter of the law as much as possible when engaged in theoretical conceptualization in these areas. However, others differ and we now have the makings of a vigorous debate.

10.2 Ethical Approach to Voluntarism.

Psychiatrist Laura Weiss Roberts proposes a definition and conceptualization of voluntariness that explicitly cites and embraces the role of values and reasons in informed consent. Unlike Appelbaum and his colleagues, she focuses on the ethical, rather than the legal, foundations of informed consent in framing her account of voluntariness. According to Roberts, traditional accounts of voluntarism tend to focus on cognitive influences at the expense of factors like “…emotional maturity and the emergence of distinct personhood” (Roberts 2002, 705–706; see also Gebbert & Abbot 2007, 412). Other non-traditional influences include, “[e]motional experience, life history, and personal psychological issues … [s]uffering and pain due to physical or mental health problems … emotional distress … and distinct psychological experiences of power relationships” (Roberts 2002, 706). Recognizing such non-traditional influences requires additional safeguards, she argues.

Not surprisingly, the recognition of such non-traditional factors among the theoretical and practical desiderata that an empirically adequate conceptualization of voluntariness must include, yields a very different definition of “voluntariness” than the one proposed by Appelbaum and his colleagues. Somewhat ironically, Roberts purports to borrow from the insights of Grisso and Appelbaum's (1998) analysis of decision-making capacity in formulating her account of voluntariness (Roberts 2002, 707). The situation is ironic, because she arrives at a definition of voluntariness that is not only incompatible with the one proposed by Appelbaum, but also one that he explicitly rejects on the grounds that it “…does not reflect the law and could not be implemented in a research setting” (Appelbaum 2009, 34).

Roberts defines voluntariness “… as ideally encompassing the individual's ability to act in accordance with one's authentic sense of what is good, right, and best in light of one's situation, values, and prior history” (707). On her view, voluntarism “…involves the capacity to make this choice freely and in the absence of coercion“ (707). She goes on to add that, “[d]eliberateness, purposefulness of intent, clarity, genuineness, and coherence with one's prior life decisions are implicitly recognized in this construction” (707). Among the domains of influence that need to be considered, Roberts cites: developmental factors, illness-related considerations, psychological issues and cultural and religious values, and external features and pressures (707–709). It is impossible to provide a full review of Robert's examples and the manner in which she argues they can impair or compromise the capacity for voluntary choice. Suffice it to say that her selection of examples differs markedly from those proposed by Appelbaum.

The difference between the two definitions of voluntarism outlined above should occasion little surprise in light of the different approaches they derive from. Appelbaum and his colleagues begin their account of voluntarism with a commitment to the ‘legal doctrine’ of informed consent (Appelbaum 2009, 30). In contrast, Roberts begins her account of voluntarism with a commitment to the ‘ethical meaning’ of informed consent (Roberts 2002, 705). It is therefore no wonder that their conceptualizations and examples are different. It is interesting that both accounts point to the need to include considerations that relate to values in the assessment of voluntariness. This is a matter on which Appelbaum and his collaborators appear to be making increased concessions, as they simultaneously attempt to preserve the cognitive bias of the law.

Clarification in the area of values — their nature, their origin, their role in consent — is sure to be an important prerequisite of future work in this domain, as scholars endeavour to develop improved theories, while at the same time being mindful of the need to address the practical exigencies of clinical reality with reliable and valid assessment tools. It is worth noting that the time required for assessments of capacity is already a significant concern for clinicians, especially in complicated cases, where assessment risks turning into a separate therapeutic intervention of its own (Szmukler 2010). While theoretically laudable, the proposal that we expand the scope of assessment tools designed to evaluate the capacity for voluntarism to include values, risks adding to these woes. Likewise with decision-making capacity. On the other hand, there may be no other option if we wish to have assessment tools for assessing voluntarism and decision-making capacity that truly reflect the clinical realities they are meant to capture.


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Thanks to George Graham, William Harvey, Tony Hope, and Tom Ban for helpful comments on previous versions of this entry. Thanks also to Jennifer Hawkins for her careful comments and suggestions. This article is dedicated to the late Benjamin Freedman (1951–1997). Sine qua non.

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