Samuel Clarke

First published Sat Apr 5, 2003; substantive revision Mon Feb 10, 2014

Samuel Clarke (1675–1729) was the most influential British philosopher in the generation between Locke and Berkeley. His philosophical interests were mostly in metaphysics, theology, and ethics. In all three areas he was very critical of Hobbes, Spinoza, and Toland. Deeply influenced by both Newton and Descartes, Clarke was however publicly critical of Descartes' metaphysics of space and body because Descartes' identifying body with extension and removing final causes from nature had furthered irreligion and had naturally developed into Spinozism. He sided with Locke and Newton against Descartes in denying that we have knowledge of the essence of substances, even though we can be sure that there are at least two kinds of substances (mental and material) because their properties (thinking and divisibility) are incompatible. He defended natural religion against the naturalist view that nature constitutes a self-sufficient system and revealed religion against deism. Clarke adopted Newton's natural philosophy early on. Through his association with Newton, Clarke was the de facto spokesperson for Newtonianism in the first half the eighteenth century, not only explaining the natural science but also providing a metaphysical support and theological interpretation for it.

In what follows, we use “W” as an abbreviation to cite passages from the four-volume The Works, edited posthumously by Benjamin Hoadly. Two recent editions of Clarke's major works are more widely available and thus cited here as well: “D” for passages in A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God and Other Writings in Vailati (1998), and “CC” for passages in The Correspondence of Samuel Clarke and Anthony Collins (Uzgalis (ed.) 2011). References to the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence (available in many print and online editions) include the letter and section number preceded by an “L” for Leibniz and “C” for Clarke (e.g., L 1.4 refers to Leibniz's first letter, section four).

1. Life and Works

Samuel Clarke was born in Norwich, England, on October 11, 1675. His father was Edward Clarke, an alderman of Norwich and its representative in Parliament, and his mother was Hannah, daughter of Samuel Parmenter, a merchant (Hoadly 1730, i). He took his B.A. degree at Cambridge in 1695 by defending Newton's views, which were not yet widely accepted. His oral defense “suprized the Whole Audience, both for the Accuracy of Knowledge, and Clearness of Expression, that appeared through the Whole” (Hoadly 1730, iii-iv). His tutor, Sir John Ellis, apparently convinced him to provide a new annotated Latin translation of Rohault's Treatise of Physics. The 1697 translation included Clarke's notes to Rohault's text, criticizing Cartesian physics in favor of Newton's. The edition's success rapidly expanded the understanding of Newtonian physics, and later editions became the standard physics textbook in England. In that same year, Clarke befriended William Whiston, who probably introduced him into the Newtonian circle. In these early years he also began a concentrated study of theology, leading to the publication of Three practical essays on baptism, confirmation, and repentance (1699), A Paraphrase on the Four Evangelists (1701–1702), and Amyntor (1699), a response to John Toland's critique of the New Testament canon.

The middle years of his career mark his greatest philosophical contributions, beginning with the Boyle lectures (delivered 1704 and 1705). The first, an attempt to prove the existence of God, along with all divine attributes, was published as A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God (1705) and the second, a continuation intended to establish all fundamental moral truths and most religious doctrine, as A discourse concerning the unchangeable obligations of natural religion, and the truth and certainty of the Christian revelation (1706). They both went through many editions and were often published together. These lectures, established by Robert Boyle to promote natural religion based on the latest scientific developments, were closely watched, and Clarke instantly became one of the most well known philosophers in England. Also in 1706, his association with Newton became official when he translated the Opticks into Latin. In the meantime, he had been introduced to Queen Anne, who made him one of her chaplains in 1706, and three years later he was elevated to the rectory of St. James's, Westminster. After the Hanoverian accession, Clarke developed a close relationship with Caroline of Anspach, the Princess of Wales and future queen. His prominence as a philosopher drew him into a series of very public exchanges of letters. The most notable of these were the letters to Anthony Collins (1707–1708) and the letters to Leibniz (1715–1716) (see below).

In the later years of his life, Clarke published popular works of theology, notable translations of Caesar, and a royally appointed translation of the Iliad. Each of his major publications went through multiple editions, often with substantial revision. He died in 1729 after a very short illness, consistent with a stroke (Sykes 1729, 10). He was survived by his wife Katherine and five of his seven children. Clarke was a polite and courtly man, vivacious with his friends, and reportedly fond of playing cards.

1.1 Correspondence with Leibniz

Before Caroline of Anspach became the Princess of Wales, she was tutored by Leibniz. After Leibniz was not asked to join her in England, they corresponded across the channel. In one of these letters he attacked prominent views in England that Leibniz considered dangerous to natural religion. After mentioning materialism and Lockean skepticism about the soul, Leibniz chastises Newton twice. (Newton and Leibniz had sparred earlier over the priority of discovery of the calculus.) Clarke, who was ingratiating himself with Caroline, came to Newton's defense. A series of five letters passed through Caroline between Leibniz and Clarke over a wide range of issues.

Today this correspondence is easily Clarke's most often read work. However, there has long been a dispute over Newton's role in the authorship of the letters. Leibniz suspected and Caroline confirmed that Newton at least read Clarke's letters before sending them and provided “advice” (Alexander 1956, 189 and 193; Brewster 1855, 287–288). Since then, scholarly opinion has ranged from Newton's ghostwriting all the letters himself (Koyré and Cohen 1961, 560ff) to Clarke writing the letters and merely showing them to Newton to make sure there was no disagreement over the scientific information (Vailati 1997, 4–5). This point is not easily decidable, in part because Newton and Clarke were neighbors and thus almost no correspondence survives between them, presumably since they would meet in person. Current opinion has shifted toward attributing most of the philosophical arguments to Clarke, a move sparked in part by a reappraisal in recent years of Clarke's status as an original philosopher.

In reading the letters to Leibniz, it is helpful to remember that the views being defended might not belong only to Clarke or only to Newton, so attribution to a single figure might be misguided. What we have might be the intersection of their views, or they might be views that Newton held privately but did not yet want to avow publicly, or they might be a mixture of some of Clarke's views and some of Newton's views. In some cases, we can see links to other publications by Newton and Clarke. For instance, space as a sensorium (organ of sensation) of God, which Leibniz ridiculed in his first letter to Caroline, appeared first in Newton's Principia and Opticks and not in Clarke's other works. (Clarke tries to argue that Newton does not believe that space is the sensorium of God, but Koyré and Cohen [1961, 563–566] argue that Newton did believe it and tried to disguise or soften the view in publication.) Also, there are arguments based on the principle of sufficient reason, which Clarke employed in his Boyle lectures twelve years earlier, but do not play a role in Newton's publications. Other cases are more difficult to connect to Newton's and Clarke's other works, such as the famous passage in which space is called “an immediate and necessary consequence of the existence of God,” since “consequence” is not a term usually used by either Clarke or Newton on this issue.

2. Major Themes in Clarke

Three major themes run through all of Clarke's philosophical works: Newtonianism, anti-naturalism, and rationalism.

2.1 Newtonianism and Anti-Naturalism

On scientific, philosophical, and especially theological grounds, Clarke believed Newtonian natural philosophy to be superior to all alternatives. Clarke saw in Newtonianism a world that could only exist by a free act of God. Matter is dispersed sparingly throughout empty space, gravity is universal to matter but not inherent in it, and the universe is ordered according to rules that are neither absolutely necessary nor chaotic. Clarke concluded that the laws of nature do not describe the powers of matter, which is just dead mass constantly pushed around, but modalities of operation of the divine power. Clarke's response is similar to that of the occasionalists, who also denied that matter had the power to move itself and that the only thing with such power is God. Matter has no power of self-motion, so to explain motion, one must appeal to immaterial souls (divine and human). Thus, nature is not a self-sufficient system; without direct and constant divine physical intervention planets would fly away from their orbits and atoms would break into their components. Thus, the naturalist attempt to describe the world solely by the arrangement and matter in motion is doomed to failure on scientific and metaphysical grounds and must give way to a world with an active God. This is why “the foundations of natural religion had never been so deeply and firmly laid, as in the mathematical and experimental philosophy of that great man” (W4.582).

Newton may have held similar views about God's role in the world, but he was hesitant to state these positions publicly. Force (1984, 522–526) suggests he used the Boyle lectures to promote these views. Many have thought he supported Clarke's interpretations and defenses on matters scientific and also theological (e.g., Jacob 1976, 242). In private correspondence, such as the letters to Bentley of December 10, 1692, and January 17, 1693, he entertains views similar to those that Clarke would later proclaim. Whiston (1728) reports that when asked why he did not publicly announce them, Newton said, “He saw those Consequences; but thought it better to let his Readers draw them first of themselves,” at least until the “General Scholium” was published in the later editions of the Principia. For over a decade, then, Clarke was the leading voice on the metaphysical and theological implications of Newtonianism, until Newton himself publicly endorsed the fundamentals of Clarke's interpretation. 

2.2 Rationalism

Clarke adopted some form of rationalism in metaphysics, ethics, and theology, as exhibited in his methodology, his account of ethical truths, and in his acceptance of a fundamental rationalist principle, the principle of sufficient reason.

Clarke is also an ethical rationalist. Ethical truths are discoverable through reason and correspond to necessary and eternal relations among things in the world. He also calls ethical truths “truths of reason.” His theology is also rationalist, in that through reason one can discover the many truths contained in natural religion. Furthermore, true Christian doctrines are neither mysterious nor self-contradictory, and nearly all can be comprehended by human beings.

Most importantly, the Demonstration makes great use of the principle of sufficient reason, which motivates the cosmological argument, and he explicitly avows it again in the correspondence with Leibniz (C 3.2, W 4.606) and returns to it frequently. It is not mentioned in the correspondence with Collins, but he there adopts principles that can be derived from it. Clarke's understanding of the principle of sufficient reason differs notably from Leibniz's formulation, with whom it is more frequently associated. This was a major source of contention in their correspondence. Clarke asserts that the sufficient reason why something exists as it does may be due to the “mere Will” of God and nothing more (C 3.2, W 4.606–607; C 5.124–130, W 4.700). This involves two claims. First, in cases of complete indifference (such as God choosing where to place the world in the infinite expanse of absolute space), God is capable of acting even if there is no reason to prefer one option over another. Second, a free will is able to refrain from acting on what reason presents to it as best to do. As a consequence of these, Clarke denies the identity of indiscernibles, a principle that Leibniz argued is entailed by the principle of sufficient reason (L 5.21). This is significant for Clarke's Newtonianism, because if space is real and absolute, then the identity of indiscernibles must be false because regions of space are indiscernible with respect to their intrinsic and (prior to the creation of the world) their extrinsic properties. Clarke may also have felt the need to accommodate indiscernible atoms, which Newton seemed to allow. (Clarke defends atomism in the letters to Leibniz, but in his other works he claims that all matter is infinitely divisible.) Because Clarke denies the identity of indiscernibles and affirms libertarianism, Leibniz claims that Clarke grants the principle of sufficient reason “only in Words, and in reality denies it. Which shews that he does not fully perceive the Strength of it” (L 3.2, W 4.601). In response, Clarke argues that if Leibniz is right then a free agent would be merely passive because determined to do what reason presents, but a “passive agent” is a contradiction since the concept of agency includes the concept of activity.

3. Metaphysics

3.1 Absolute and Infinite Space and Time

According to Clarke, the ideas of space and time are the two “first and most obvious simple Ideas, that every man has in his mind” (D 114, W 2.752), anticipating the first step in an argument made famous by Kant. Like many of the early modern philosophers who investigated the nature of space and time, he tended to produce arguments with regard to space, leaving the reader to infer that parallel arguments could be drawn with respect to time. Drawing on an argument from Newton (1726, 410), he argued that while matter can be thought of as non-existing, space exists necessarily because “to suppose any part of space removed, is to suppose it removed from and out of itself: and to suppose the whole to be taken away, is supposing it to be taken away from itself, that is, to be taken away while it still remains: which is a contradiction in terms” (D 13, W 2.528). Space is also not an aggregate of its parts but an essential whole preceding all it parts.

Absolute space was allegedly demanded by Newtonian physics. Space is an entity in which things are, and not the mere absence of matter. All finite beings occupy an absolute position in space and time that we may or may not be able to establish because we have no direct access to absolute space and time. Although space is not sensible, Clarke rejected its identification with nothingness, since space has properties: quantity and dimension, and perhaps homogeneity, immutability, continuity, and the ability to contain matter. Law (1758, 10) objects that this makes no more sense than saying that darkness has qualities because it has the property of receiving light. 

Clarke believed that space is necessarily infinite because “to set bounds to space, is to suppose it bounded by something which itself takes up space” or else that “it is bounded by nothing, and then the idea of that nothing will still be space,” and both suppositions are contradictory (D 115, W 2.753). Clarke apparently thought that what has a boundary must be bounded by something else. If so, the argument was not well taken because a sphere, for example, has a boundary which stems from its own nature, not by the presence of something external bounding it. One possible solution is to appeal to space's peculiar nature as a property of an infinite God, which would require that it be boundless in virtue of God's possible activity being boundless (W 1.47), but this might reverse the proper order of explanation or beg the question. (For more on the relationship of God to space, see Section 4.2 below.) He also argues that because existence or being is a perfection, existing in more places is a greater perfection, so God (as the most perfect being) must exist in all places (W 1.46–47). Another possible solution is to appeal to the principle of sufficient reason: any finite limit would be arbitrary, and thus in violation of the principle. Establishing the infinity of space is important to Clarke's argument that space exists outside of us, because our ideas are always finite (Watts 1733, 4).

3.2 Free Will

Clarke attached great importance to the issue of free will. In his philosophical writings, he argues that freedom of the will involves a libertarian power of self-determination. However, in the sermon “Of the Liberty of Moral Agents,” he claims that the “True liberty of a Rational and Moral Agent” is “being able to follow right Reason only, without Hindrance or Restraint” (W 1.219). Similarly, in that sermon Clarke calls acting as one pleases “mere physical or natural liberty” (which humans and non-human animals have), so he seems to accept a definition of liberty that is compatibilist (W 1.218). Elsewhere he argues that human freedom requires a self-determining will that could freely assent or refrain from assenting to the mind's judgments; this is a freedom of choosing and not a freedom of acting, such that a prisoner in chains “who chooses or endeavors to move out of his place is therein as much a free agent as he that actually moves out of his place” (D 75, W 2.566). Clarke does not explicitly reconcile these incompatibilist and compatibilist approaches. One way to do so is to make the libertarian power of self-determination a necessary condition for the compatibilist understanding of freedom as following reason without restraint. Clarke also entertains a third notion of freedom: freedom is “a principle of acting, or power of beginning motion, which is the idea of liberty” (D 54, W 2.553). The ability to begin motion marks freedom as a power only held by non-material agents, because matter has no power of self-motion. Harris (2005, 46-61) argues that this third definition is libertarian and the most important of the three to Clarke's project.

Clarke's primary defense of libertarian freedom involves clarifying the relationship between the will and the judgment. In order to will, one must have a judgment about what to do and the power to choose in accordance with that judgment. This power to choose is provided by the will. The will is not to be identified with the last judgment of the understanding nor is a volition caused by a judgment. Those (like Hobbes) who thought so were guilty of basic philosophical errors. If they maintained that the content of the evaluative proposition is either identical with the volition or causes it, then they were confusing the “moral motive” with the “physical efficient,” the physical efficient being the element of the cause that provides the active power (D 73, W 2.565). Because the moral motive is simply an abstract object (a proposition) and abstract objects are causally inert, the moral motive cannot cause anything. On the other hand, if Clarke's opponents maintained that, not the evaluative proposition, but one's perceiving, judging or otherwise believing it is the cause (or a partial cause) of volition, then they were falling foul of a basic causal principle. Against Descartes, Clarke insisted that judging, i.e., assenting to what appears true and dissenting from what appears false, is not an action but a passion. But what is passive cannot cause anything active. So, there is no causal link between evaluation and volition, or, as Clarke put it, between “approbation and action” (D 126, W 4.714). In general, there is no causal link between previous non-volitional mental states, all of which are passive, and any volition (Vailati 1997, 82–84).

Jonathan Edwards (1754, 222–223) argued that Clarke was committed to an infinite regress of volitions. Because each volition is active, it must be caused by something active; but every other purported motivation is passive, so each volition is caused by a previous volition, and so on ad infinitum. However, Clarke did not believe that each volition was caused by a previous volition, but rather each volition is caused by the will itself. This raises a different problem, noticed by Leibniz: because the conditions for the will choosing in accordance with the judgment are exactly the same as when it refrains from choosing, there is no explanation for why it does one rather than the other, in violation of the principle of sufficient reason (L 4.1, W 4.612; L 5.14, W4.634). Clarke never provided a satisfactory response to this charge; his best attempt is his claim that to deny this account would lead to accepting passive agency, which is a contradiction.

The issue of divine freedom raises new problems for Clarke. For one, human and divine freedom are perhaps in tension with God's knowledge of future events. Against the claim that divine foreknowledge is incompatible with free will, Clarke objected that because knowledge does not affect the thing known, our free choices are unaffected by divine omniscience (D 75–78, W 2.566–568). A second problem is that God always does what is best, so God cannot refrain from acting on his judgment of what is best, and thus acts necessarily, which Clarke claims is a contradiction (D 83–86, W 571–573). Clarke could rely, again, on the passivity of judgment to block the move that God's judgment determines God's choice. Thus, even though we have complete certainty that God always does what is best, it does not follow that God doing the best is necessitated by God's judgment of what is right to do. This response is nested in Clarke's official response, which is to distinguish God's metaphysical attributes from his moral attributes. Because God's will is not determined by God's knowing that an action is the best, our certainty that God will do what is best is due to our confidence in “the unalterable Rectitude of his Will” and not a necessity of his nature (D 86–87, W 573). In other words, it is a moral and not a metaphysical necessity. A third and related problem is that when God created the world, he did what was best to do, but had a choice among an infinite number of equally best ways of creating the world because he could place the world anywhere in space and could create it at any time. Thus, it does not follow from God's perfect judgment combined with his infinite power to create that God should create the world in a particular way. Although this bothered Leibniz because it conflicts with his account of the principle of sufficient reason, Clarke fails to see any problem (C 4.18–20, W 4.626).

3.3 Matter and the Laws of Nature

Clarke steadfastly maintained that matter has neither an essential nor an accidental power of self-motion. “All things done in the world, are done either immediately by God himself, or by created intelligent beings: matter being evidently not at all capable of any laws or powers whatsoever.” Consequently, the so called “effects of the natural powers of matter, and laws of motion; of gravitation, attraction, or the like” properly speaking are but the “effects of God's acting upon matter continually and every moment, either immediately by himself, or mediately by some created intelligent beings.” Thus, the course of nature is “nothing else but the will of God producing certain effects in a continued, regular, constant and uniform manner which…being in every moment perfectly arbitrary, is as easy to be altered at any time, as to be preserved” (D 149, W 2.698).

The claim that matter has not even an accidental power of self-motion was radical for the time. The claim was central to Clarke's attempt to exhibit the manifest activity of God in the Newtonian world and refute Spinozism (Schliesser 2012, 443–449). Despite his insistence on God's continual activity in the world, Clarke was not, strictly, an occasionalist. Unlike the occasionalists, Clarke did not think that God was the real cause of interactions between finite minds and matter. Furthermore, matter has a single “Negative Power” of staying at rest or continuing in motion (W 2.697).

3.4 Soul

In response to the biblical scholar Henry Dodwell's argument that the soul is naturally mortal, Clarke wrote an open letter defending the soul's immortality on the basis that the soul cannot be material, because what is material is divisible, and what is divisible cannot be the source of the unity of consciousness. (He assumes that if the soul is immaterial then it is immortal.) In response, the freethinker Anthony Collins defended the position that consciousness can be an emergent property of matter, opening the door for a materialist theory of mind. The epistolary debate is well covered in another entry in this encyclopedia, so below is a brief summary of Clarke's views as found in the correspondence and elsewhere.

Loosely following Locke's distinctions, Clarke argues that there are three kinds of properties: those that inhere in the substance (real properties), those that are commonly but improperly believed to reside in the substance (secondary qualities), and “merely abstract names to express the effects” of material substances or systems (CC 56–58). The third category includes magnetism and gravity, which are properly descriptions of a different substance (in this case, divine activity and not matter). The second category are the traditional secondary qualities; the discussed example is the smell of a rose. Consciousness falls in the first category, but, unlike the other members of that category such as magnitude and figure, it does not divide or sum.

Employing what Kant (1781, A351) famously dubbed the “Achilles argument,” Clarke claims that the essential unity of consciousness is incompatible with the divisibility and composability of matter, because the consciousness must be distributed among the various component parts, rendering each part conscious. Clarke is not clear on what exactly it is about consciousness that requires this unity (Rozemond 2003, 175–177). Officially, consciousness is a reflexive act in which I recognize my thoughts as my own and is therefore prior to memory, although Clarke sometimes writes “consciousness” when he should say “memory” (Thiel 2011, 231).

Clarke's version of the Achilles argument rests on two principles. The Homogeneity Principle says that “a power can really inhere in a composite only if it is of the same kind as the powers of the parts” (Vailati 1993, 395). Strictly, the Homogeneity Principle only applies to the first category of qualities (Rozemond 2009, 180). The Composition Principle says that “the properties of the parts will sum to the same properties of the whole (and that the properties of the whole can be divided into the parts)” (Uzgalis 2011, 23). Uzgalis finds versions of the Homogeneity Principle in Cudworth and Bayle, and in all three cases it is used to argue that thought or consciousness cannot arise from motion or figure because they are not of the same kind. A less often discussed variation on Clarke's core argument (but see Rozemond 2003, 182ff) is that “figure, divisibility, mobility and other such like qualities of matter” cannot produce conscious thought (a real power) because they are “not real, proper, distinct, and positive powers, but only negative qualities, deficiencies, and imperfections,” which appeals to the principle that there can be no perfection or power in the effect that is not in the cause (D 41, W 2.545).

The enduring soul serves as Clarke's explanation for personal identity. Collins, following Locke, argued for a memory theory of personal identity. Clarke's original attack on Collins claims that God could put one person's memories into multiple people; they would be distinct people but each would be identical to the original person, so identity is not transitive. Although Clarke's argument became popular in the eighteenth century (Barresi and Martin 2004, 33–49), it seems to have been forgotten then reintroduced in the 1950s (Uzgalis 33, citing Flew 1951, Prior 1957, and Williams 1957).

Clarke's claim that the unity of consciousness is incompatible with divisible matter is complicated by his apparent belief that souls are extended. At least, he refused to rule out the possibility that souls are extended because “as the parts of space or expansion itself can demonstrably be proved to be absolutely indiscerptible [indivisible], so it ought not to be reckoned an insuperable difficulty to imagine that all immaterial thinking substances (upon supposition that expansion is not excluded out of their idea) may be so likewise” (CC 62, W 3.763). The issue, as Clarke tries to frame it, is not that consciousness is incompatible with extension but that it is incompatible with anything divisible into parts. Because, following Newton, he denies that space is actually divisible into parts, it cannot be ruled out that the soul is extended. Clarke's acceptance of the principle that there is no action at a distance and of the claim that immaterial beings (both finite and God) act in space perhaps push him to accept that the soul is extended. If so, he does not provide details. (Does the soul occupy the same space as the whole body, the brain, or some part of the brain? How do souls move from place to place if not affected by bodies?)

4. Philosophical Theology

This section reviews Clarke's key arguments in philosophy of religion and philosophical theology. The topic of divine freedom was covered in the earlier section on free will, as well as in another entry in this encyclopedia. Clarke also wrote on topics such as baptism, the historicity of disputed New Testament writings, and the veracity of various Christian doctrines, which are not discussed here.

4.1 Argument A Priori

Clarke thought highly of the argument from design, largely because it is widely accessible and easily grasped. However, due to the rise of atheistic systems of philosophy, he thought it was necessary to give an argument that would satisfy his fellow metaphysicians.

Clarke tells us that his argument for the being and attributes of God was done “partly by metaphysical Reasoning, and partly from the Discoveries (principally those that have been lately made) in Natural Philosophy” (W 2.581). His argument, which was known in Clarke's time as “the argument a priori,” occupies most of A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, Clarke's first set of Boyle Lectures. (Note that Clarke's use of the term “a priori” is not that which has been standard since Kant. The argument is a priori not primarily because it is available independent of experience, but because it argues from the nature of the cause to the nature of the effect; this is in contrast with the argument a posteriori which works from the effects — e.g., the design of the world— to the cause — e.g., the designer.) The argument is typically classified today as cosmological, but it should not be confused with the kalam cosmological argument (which takes as a premise that the world has a finite history). Clarke's version belongs to the tradition of modal cosmological arguments that employ the principle of sufficient reason to argue from a contingent series of causes to a necessary being. The main lines of Clarke's “argument a priori” are as follows.

Something now exists, so something always was (D 8, W 2.524). Otherwise nothing would exist now because it is impossible for something to be produced by nothing. Clarke does not explicitly acknowledge that “something always was” is ambiguous between a stronger, de re reading and a weaker, de dicto reading. Because the stronger, de re claim seems unwarranted by the argument thus far and the next step of the argument is to establish that there is a single independent being, the more plausible and weaker de dicto claim can be assumed.

What has existed from eternity can only be either an independent being, that is, one having in itself the reason of its existence, or an infinite series of dependent beings. However, such an infinite series cannot be the being that has existed from eternity because by hypothesis it can have no external cause, and no internal cause (no dependent being in the series) can cause the whole series. Hence, an independent being exists. A frequent objection to this argument is that the demand for an explanation is satisfied when it is conceded that each being in the series has a cause. The series is not a new entity to be explained, so there is no reason to appeal to an eternal, independent being.

This independent being is “self-existent, that is, necessarily existing” (D 12, W 2.527), a conclusion he also reaches by arguing that space and time cannot be conceived not to exist and they are obviously not self-existent, so the substance on which they depend, God, must exist necessarily as well (D 13, W 2.527–528). It seems that for Clarke a “necessary being” is a being whose non-existence is impossible (either because it is an independent being or is necessarily dependent on an independent being), and a “self-existent being” is a being whose non-existence is impossible because the necessity of its existence is to be found in its own nature. Once these two are distinguished, however, Clarke is open to the criticism that he cannot rule out the existence of two self-existent beings (as he attempts in the seventh proposition) because there may be two beings who are self-existent even though only one self-existent being is required to explain the existence of the world (Law 1758, 21). Anthony Atkey (1725, 3–14) provided a variation on this objection in correspondence. He alleges that Clarke illegitimately moves from the existence of at least one “necessary being” to the existence of no more than one “self-existent being.” Clarke concludes that there exists only one self-existent, but he has at best shown that we cannot have the idea of two self-existent beings. Atkey's objection is about the relationship of the conceivable to the possible. Clarke's response (Atkey 1725, 17–19) is that we have clear ideas in this case, so our ideas can guide us in the nature of things (the conceivable entails the possible), but he does not give any reason why we should think our ideas are clear in this case.

If successful, the argument a priori can establish all the metaphysical attributes of God (independence, eternality, immutability, infinitude, omnipresence) by examining the nature of necessity and positing the contingency of the world. To reach the personal and moral attributes of God, it is necessary to draw upon further features of the world and argue a posteriori (D 38, W 2.543). One real feature of the world is that there are intelligent beings in it. Intelligence, being a perfection, must exist to at least as great a degree in the cause as in the effect (an instance of Clarke's applying a causal corollary of the principle of sufficient reason). So God must be intelligent (D38–39, W 4.543). This intelligence can also be established from the order and beauty of the world, so a teleological argument can reach this conclusion as well.

Clarke attempted a variety of arguments to establish that God is an agent (that is, that God is not only intelligent but has a will that is free in a libertarian sense). First, Clarke claimed that “intelligence without liberty … is really (in respect of any power, excellence, or perfection) no intelligence at all,” so therefore God must be an agent. Second, the person positing a God without freedom (Clarke specifically mentions Spinoza) is positing a contradiction and has failed to explain the source of activity in the world (D 46–47, W 4.548–549). Furthermore, the necessitarian (like Spinoza) is forced to deny a number of (to Clarke) obvious points, including that things could be different than they are, that there are final causes in the universe, and that there is a variety of finite things in the universe.

With God's intelligence and agency in place, he sketches how God's wisdom, goodness, justice, and other moral perfections can be established.

4.2 God, Space, and Time

According to traditional Christian theology, God is eternal and omnipresent. Clarke accepted both, but his attempts to explain what those basic claims mean are not always clear. Four central tenets of Clarke's position are unpacked below.

God is able to act at all times and in all places because he is substantially present. To deny this would entail accepting action at a distance, which Clarke, like most of his contemporaries, found mysterious or impossible.

God's substantial presence entails that the Scholastic view of divine eternity and immensity is false. Clarke rejected the view of God as substantially removed from space and time. Divine eternity involves both necessary existence and infinite duration which, however, could not be identified with the traditional notion of the eternal present (nunc stans) according to which God exists in an unchanging permanent present without any successive duration. He considered such a view unintelligible at best and contradictory at worst (CC 107, W 3.794). The attribution of successive duration to God might suggest that God, like us, is in time but, unlike us, does not change. However, this was not Clarke's view. In his exchanges with Butler he clarifies that God is not technically in space and time, because God is prior (in the order of nature) to time whereas things in time are metaphysically subsequent to the existence of time. Moreover, he attributed distinct and successive thoughts to God; otherwise God could not “vary his will, nor diversify his works, nor act successively, nor govern the world, nor indeed have any power to will or do anything at all” (W 3.897). Hence, God is immutable with respect to his will only in the sense that he does not change his mind.

God is not identical to space or time; although necessary, they depend for their existence upon God. Clarke's earliest reported philosophical idea, years before he read Newton, is that God cannot destroy space (Whiston 1730, 22–23). A common worry about absolute space in the eighteenth century was that if space is infinite, necessary, and indestructible then either God is not the only infinite, necessary, and independent being or God is identical to space, both of which were theologically unacceptable. Clarke rejected both of these. Clarke's position in the Demonstration, the letters to Butler, and the letter to an anonymous author (almost certainly Daniel Waterland) is that space and time are divine properties or modes. Because they depend on the only self-subsisting being, they are not independent beings (D 122–123, W 4.758). He told Leibniz that immensity and eternality are “an immediate and necessary consequence” of God's existence, without supplying any further argument or explaining the relationship between “consequence,” “mode,” “attribute,” and “property.” Many have understood Clarke to mean that God is literally dimensional. Clarke's early critic Anthony Collins (1713, 47–48) read him this way.

God's immensity and eternality are consistent with God's unity. As Leibniz and Waterland noted, the identification of divine immensity with space endangers the simplicity of the divine being because space has parts, albeit not separable ones. The objection, though formidable, was not new; Bayle in the Dictionnaire (entry “Leucippus,” remark G) had chided the Newtonians for identifying space with divine immensity in order to solve the ontological problem created by the positing of an infinite space because it leads to the destruction of divine simplicity and to various absurdities. As a further point, Waterland suggests that since Clarke accepts that nothing with parts can be the subject of consciousness, God's immensity also undermines divine intelligence and consciousness.

Clarke offered two responses. Firstly, not everything extended has parts. Space is extended, but (as Newton had claimed) its “parts” cannot be moved, so they are not truly parts. Secondly, Clarke claimed parity between spatial and temporal extendedness: because the former is compatible with the simplicity of what “stretches” temporally, the latter is compatible with the simplicity of what stretches spatially. But the parity between space and time, were it to be granted, rather than showing that spatial extendedness is not detrimental to a thing's simplicity because temporal extendedness is not, could be taken to show that the latter is detrimental to a thing's simplicity because the former is.

4.3 Trinitarian Views

In his lifetime, Clarke was infamous for his view of the trinity. In Christian theology, God is represented as tripartite—three persons but one God. In the 1662 Book of Common Prayer, in use in England during Clarke's lifetime, one of the liturgies draws from the Athanasian Creed, which includes the following discussion of the Trinity: “For there is one Person of the Father, another of the Son : and another of the Holy Ghost. But the Godhead of the Father, of the Son, and of the Holy Ghost, is all one… So the Father is God, the Son is God : and the Holy Ghost is God. And yet they are not three Gods: but one God.” In his position as a cleric, Clarke was required to subscribe to this formulation. In 1712, against the advice of his friends, he published The Scripture Doctrine of the Trinity, in which he diverged from what his opponents considered the plain sense of this formulation. The Scripture Doctrine of the Trinity begins by collecting all the passages of the New Testament that relate to the Trinity. It then sets out a series of 55 propositions regarding the Trinity, each supported by references to the texts collected in the first section. The third section relates these propositions to the Anglican liturgy. This approach reflects Clarke's general expectation that the correct theological doctrines are found in the Bible and are compatible with reason. Through hundreds of years of what he considered bad metaphysics, the correct and intelligible doctrine of the trinity had become obscured, and Clarke hoped to return to a pre-Athanasian understanding of the trinity.

Clarke's position in The Scripture Doctrine of the Trinity was labeled by his opponents as “Arian,” “Socinian,” and “Sabellian.” Although they were commonly used as abusive terms for anyone holding non-traditional or anti-trinitarian views, they also have more precise meanings. An Arian holds that the Son (the second person of the Trinity) is divine but not eternal; he was created by God the Father out of nothing before the beginning of the world. A Socinian holds that the Son is merely human and was created at or after the conception of Jesus. A Sabellian holds that the Son is a mode of God. In the precise use of the terms, Clarke is none of these. Unlike the Arians, Clarke affirmed that the Son is co-eternal with the Father and not created (W 4.141). From this it also follows that, contra the Socinians, the Son existed before the conception of Jesus. Unlike the Sabellians, Clarke denied that the Son was a mode of the Father. (This would have been very problematic given that he sometimes claimed that space is a mode of God.) Clarke's claimed ignorance about substance made him reluctant to declare that the Father and the Son were the same divine substance, but the Son is endowed by the Father with all of the power and authority of the Father. He also called the manner of the Son's generation from the father “ineffable.” Pfizenmaier (1997) provides further textual and historical arguments that Clarke should not be classified as an Arian.

Clarke affirms that each member of the trinity is a person, but only the Father is self-existent. His views are best described as subordinationist. [See especially Prop. XXV (W 4.150); Prop. XXVII (W 4.151); Prop. XXXIV (W 4.155).] Clarke was not officially censured (but nearly so), but it surely prevented his rising to higher office. For a discussion of the debate following its publication, see Ferguson 1974 (59–149) and Pfizenmaier 1997 (179–216).

4.4 Miracles

Like many associated with the Royal Society, Clarke thought that miracles could be used as evidence for the claim that Christianity is the true religion. However, given that matter is inactive, God is actively involved in all or nearly all events in the world. What then could separate out a particular action of God as miraculous? According to Clarke, a miracle is a “work effected in a manner unusual, or different from the common and regular Method of Providence, by the interposition either of God himself, or of some Intelligent Agent superior to Man, for the Proof or Evidence of some particular Doctrine, or in attestation to the Authority of some particular Person” (W 2.701).

Miracles became a point of controversy in the letters that passed between Clarke and Leibniz (W 4.605). One focus of the debate is which would be greater: a world so perfectly crafted that God does not need to intervene to keep it running (Leibniz), or a world so dependent on God that one cannot understand the world without recognizing its continual dependence on the operations of God (Clarke). A second focus of the debate is the proper understanding of a miracle: something that exceeds the natural power of created things (Leibniz), or something that seems different from our human expectation of how things operate (Clarke).

Clarke maintains that miracles are miraculous only from a human perspective and that God actively works in the physical world because matter is completely passive. Since God's wisdom and goodness are unchanging, if God chooses to act differently in the world at a certain time (e.g., by changing the laws of motion), it is only because it was always good to do so and was part of God's plan from eternity. Because it requires no more power for God to do the miraculous-to-us as to do the natural-to-us, neither one is “with Respect to God, more or less Natural or Supernatural than the other.” From our perspective, God is changing the order of things; from God's perspective, everything is equally a part of God's design. A miracle, then, is only a miracle “with Regard to our Conceptions” (C2.6–12, W 4.598–601). In his final letter Clarke elaborates on this, suggesting that we only call the sun stopping in the sky miraculous because it is unusual; if it was always at the same point in the sky, then that would be natural, and its motion miraculous. Similarly, raising a dead body from the ground is miraculous, but only because God does not usually act that way (C5.107–109, W 4.693; C3.17, W 4.611–612). Unusualness is a necessary but not sufficient condition for being a miracle (C4.43, W 4.629–630), but Clarke nowhere says what else is required.

Leibniz attacks Clarke's views from multiple angles. His first letter accuses Newton (and therefore Clarke) of making an imperfect machine that requires tuning to keep it running, like a watch that requires winding; but this is unfitting a perfect God. In Newton's world, miracles are required “in order to supply the Wants of Nature” (L1.4, W 4.588). Clarke responds that there is a disanalogy between the watch and the world. The watch requires winding because a human watchmaker can only compose parts and put them in motion, whereas God is both the creator and preserver of forces and powers. On the offensive, Clarke charges those who deny God's constant involvement in the world to be allowing a mechanical world, a world of “Materialism and Fate,” where God is not needed at all (C1.4, W 4.590) In response, Leibniz makes the interesting objection that either Clarke is explaining natural things by the supernatural, which is absurd, or else God is a part of nature (specifically, the soul of the world) (L2.12, W 4.596; L4.110–11, W 4.666). Leibniz also charges that Clarke cannot explain the difference between natural and supernatural action. “But it is regular, (says the Author,) it is constant, and consequently natural. I answer; it cannot be regular, without being reasonable; nor natural, unless it can be explained by the Natures of creatures” (L5.121, W 4.668–669). Regularities require explanations, and to be natural these explanations must come from the natures of the creatures. The Clarkean picture, in which matter is completely passive, is incapable of explaining the regularities exhibited in the interaction of material bodies in terms of those bodies. Whereas Clarke saw this as the pinnacle of what natural science contributes to natural theology, Leibniz saw it as a failure to exhibit a fully rational world suited to being created by a perfectly good God.

4.5 Revelation and the Four Categories of Deism

Clarke is very confident in the prospects of general revelation; that is, he thinks that human reason (if it is not corrupted by vicious habits) is capable of discovering the existence of God as well as the attributes of God from the evidence of nature and the capacity of reason. Indeed, Christianity presupposes natural religion (W 4.582). Many theological and ethical truths (e.g., there is a God, God is to be worshiped, it is good to be just and righteous) are plainly understandable to everyone, and if one is mistaken in these matters “'tis not by his Understanding, but by his Will that he is deceived.” Yet it is very common to oppose these truths; the most common causes are “a presumptuous Ignorance, which despises Knowledge”; carelessness, which leads to blindly following local customs; prejudice, which is relying implicitly on others and traditions rather than an examination of the evidence; and vice, a willful opposition to the truth due to the love of wickedness, debauchery, and power (W 2.147–160). The reasoned defense of natural religion, although perhaps unable to sway the prejudiced, was central to Clarke's project.

Clarke thought deists could be convinced to abandon their position, because deism is unstable. In Clarke's taxonomy, there are four categories of deists (W 2.600ff). The first category of deist say they believe in “an Eternal, Infinite, Independent, Intelligent Being” that made the world, but this God is not involved in the governing of the world nor does God care for what happens in it. In response, Clarke argues (1) that the best science of the day has shown that the nature of matter is insufficient to ground the laws by which matter acts and thus requires the continuous dependence upon its Creator, and (2) a God that isn't concerned for what happens in the world must be lacking in knowledge of what is happening, power to affect what is happening, ability to act in the world, or wisdom to know that intervention is needed, and thus is not the God that the deist claimed to accept. The second category accept providential action in the world, but deny that God has moral attributes; ethics is a matter of human construction. They fail to see, thinks Clarke, (1) that ethics is a matter of eternal, fixed relations and (2) that to deny the moral attributes of God entails the denial of either God's wisdom or power. The third group of deists affirm God's moral attributes, but they deny the immortality of the human soul and that moral terms apply univocally between God and humans, which in practice leads to the denial of a future state after death. Clarke claims that this explodes all the attributes of God so that we no longer know what we are saying when we talk about God. Finally, some deists hold all the right theological and ethical doctrines, but claim that they know this solely on the basis of general revelation and thus have no need of a special, Christian revelation. Clarke suspects that this fourth category of deists no longer exist in lands where Christianity has reached.

5. Ethics

Although some of his sermons contain interesting analyses of individual Christian virtues, the most sustained exposition of Clarke's deontological, rationalist ethics is contained in his second set of Boyle Lectures, A Discourse Concerning the Unalterable Obligations of Natural Religion. Clarke started by stating that clearly there are different relations among persons and that from these relations there arise a “fitness” or “unfitness” of behavior among persons. So, for example, given the relation of infinite disproportion between humans and God, it is fit that we honor, worship, and imitate the Lord. These facts can be rationally apprehended by anyone with a sound mind, although in some cases we may be at a loss in clearly demarcating right from wrong. Being grounded in necessary relations, ethical truths, like geometrical truths, are universal and necessary. As such, they are independent of any will, divine or human, and of any consideration of punishment or reward.

In somewhat more detail, the central tenets of Clarke's ethics are elucidated in the subordinate components of the first proposition of A Discourse.

  1. There are eternal and necessary differences (or “reasons”) of things, from which “necessarily arises an agreement or disagreement of some things with others, or a fitness or unfitness of the application of different things or different relations one to another” (2.608).
  2. God wills to act according to these eternal reasons of things (2.612).
  3. All rational creatures should choose to act according to the eternal rule of reason (by which Clarke seems to mean these eternal relations) (2.612), and the human mind “naturally and necessarily Assents to the eternal Law of Righteousness” (2.616).
  4. This eternal law is classified into piety (duty toward God), righteousness (duty to other human persons), and sobriety (duty to oneself) (2.618).
  5. This law of nature is (temporally and logically) prior to and independent of human interaction (2.624).
  6. It is also (logically) prior to and independent of the will of God (2.626).
  7. The obligation to follow this law is “antecedent to all Consideration of any particular private and personal Reward or Punishment” (2.627).

Regarding (4), Clarke argues that duties toward others are governed by equity, which demands that one deal with other persons as one can reasonably expect others to deal with one (2.619), and by love, which demands that one further the well-being happiness of all persons (2.621). Duties towards oneself demand that one preserve one's physical health, mental faculties, and spiritual well-being so as to be able to perform one's duties (2.623). Clarke uses (5) as an opportunity to develop a series of interesting attacks on Hobbes' account of political and moral obligation. Among his many criticisms, he argues that a social contract cannot be obligatory unless there were already an obligation to obey contracts; if a contract benefits the community then there are real benefits prior to the contract so the contract does not generate benefits and harms; it is a contradiction for everyone to have a right to the same thing in the state of nature; and if power is to be obeyed then an all-powerful devil should be obeyed, which is absurd (W 2.609–616, 631–638).

In clarification of (6), Clarke adds that because God always does what is just and good, God's commands align with the eternal law (2.637), and that because God wants to make us happy and good, God promotes the goodness and welfare of the whole of creation, including us (2.640). While the law is antecedent to considerations of reward and punishment (7), God's justice ensures the proper rewards and punishments for following the law (2.641). These sanctions are not uniformly present in this life, so the reward and punishment must (at least partly) occur in the next life. Moreover, human depravity makes the prospect of future sanctions a necessary incentive for proper behavior.

Clarke's theory has been roundly criticized on several grounds, especially on the meaning and sufficiency of (1). He never adequately explained the nature of the relations among persons that ground morality. For instance, his explanation for why it is “fit” to honor, worship, obey, and imitate God is that “God is infinitely superior to Men” (W 2.608). If the infinite superiority is in reference to power or being, it is not obviously to the point; if it is an expression of an ethical relation, the argument is circular. Additionally, it is unclear what in the “Nature and Reason of Things” is necessary. Is it that good is necessarily not evil? (This is trivial and unhelpful.) Is it that one thing cannot be both good from one perspective and evil from another? (In which case, Clarke is offering a response to Hobbes or maybe Spinoza, but he doesn't provide a substantial alternative.) Is it that whatever is good is necessarily good? (In which case, he is perhaps restating his opposition to divine command theory, but again not in a way that makes clear his alternative.) Is it something else? Clarke's position is not clear, but he does seem to affirm each of these interpretations at different times. A further structural problem is that Clarke slides between the claim that ethical truths are relations between mind-independent objects in the world, and that they are grounded in the nature of rationality itself, apparently without distinguishing the two positions. Finally, even if these relations exist, it is not clear how moral obligation arises from such relations. Hume (1739,–7) famously charged theories like Clarke's with motivational impotence because the perception of “fitness” cannot, by itself, move the will. However, as we saw, Clarke denied that evaluation causes motivation, although he clearly thought that evaluation provides the agent, who ultimately causes the volition, with reasons for action.

6. Influence and Reception

Clarke's influence on his contemporaries and the generation that followed was immense. One important aspect of his immediate influence was that as the translator of the standard textbook in physics in England in the early eighteenth century, as the defender of absolute space and atomism in the correspondence with Leibniz, as the translator of Newton's Opticks into Latin, and as a recognized close friend of Newton, Clarke was perhaps the most significant spokesperson for the Newtonian natural philosophy, and a primary interpreter of its implications for metaphysics, philosophy of science, and theology. In particular, his use of the passivity and scarcity of matter in his argument for the existence of God was noted by his contemporaries internationally. Voltaire (1752) declared, “Among these philosophers [the last generation of British philosophers], Clarke is perhaps altogether the clearest, the most profound, the most methodical, and the strongest of all those who have spoken of the Supreme Being.” Voltaire as a young man was particularly impressed with Clarke; later in life, he seems to have been less convinced by Clarke's argument for the existence of God. In Emile, Rousseau refers to “the illustrious Clarke enlightening the world, proclaiming at last the Being of beings and the Dispenser of things,” but whether Rousseau was sympathetic to Clarke's system is in doubt (Attfield 2004).

Clarke's influence was greatest in England and Scotland, where all of his works were widely read and propagated. Among those sympathetic to Clarke's methodology and positions, Thomas Reid is the most well known today. Clarke's ethics were defended by Catharine Trotter Cockburn and attacked by Francis Hutcheson and Hume. Hume clearly has Clarke in mind in his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, where Demea recites the argument a priori and both Cleanthes and Philo offer critiques. Furthermore, Clarke is cited by name in Treatise 1.3.3 and is a likely object of the arguments against ethical rationalism in Treatise 3.1. In A Letter from a Gentleman (1745), Hume admits that Clarke's argument a priori is undermined by the claims of the Treatise. Russell (1997 and 2008) has proposed that Clarke is a major target of Hume's Treatise, and that Hume's opposition to natural theology as defended by Clarke is a uniting theme of the Treatise.

Clarke profoundly influenced philosophers in the eighteenth century that had interests in the intersection of theology and philosophy, particularly on the freedom of the will and the relationship between God, space, and matter. Jonathan Edwards singled out Clarke as a major opponent in his Freedom of the Will, where Edwards runs together libertarianism with Arminian theology. That same libertarianism made Clarke popular among the German Pietists. Among them, Crusius is the most notable, both for his work and for his importance to Kant.

By the nineteenth century interest in and appreciation of Clarke had waned. Representatively, Leslie Stephen (1881, 119) claimed that to nineteenth-century eyes, Clarke “appears to be a second-rate advocate of opinions interesting only in the mouths of greater men who were their first and ablest advocates.” In the last few decades, a renewed interest in Clarke's argument a priori and appreciation of his historical importance has more philosophers reading Clarke, and the estimation of his philosophical acuity has increased.


Primary Literature

W Clarke, S., 1738, The Works, B. Hoadly (ed.), London; reprint New York: Garland Publishing Co, 2002.
D Clarke, S., 1705, A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God And Other Writings, E. Vailati (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
CC Clarke, S., and Collins, A., 1707–1708, The Correspondence of Samuel Clarke and Anthony Collins, W. Uzgalis (ed.), Buffalo, NY: Broadview Press, 2011.
L,C Leibniz, G.W., and Clarke, S., 1715–1716, The Leibniz–Clarke Correspondence, H. G. Alexander (ed.), Manchester, UK: Machester University Press, 1956.

Secondary Literature


  • Attfield, R., 1977, “Clarke, Collins and Compounds,”Journal of the History of Philosophy 15: 45–54.
  • –––, 1993, “Clarke, Independence and Necessity,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 1: 67–82.
  • Ducharme, H., 1986, “Personal Identity in Samuel Clarke,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 24: 359–83.
  • Gay, J. H., 1963, “Matter and Freedom in the Thought of Samuel Clarke,” Journal of the History of Ideas 24: 85–105.
  • Harris, J., 2005, Of Liberty and Necessity: The Free Will Debate in Eighteenth-Century British Philosophy, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Janiak, A., 2007, “Newton and the Reality of Force,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 45 (1): 127–147.
  • Koyré, A., and Cohen, I. B., “The Case of the Missing Tanquam: Leibniz, Newton & Clarke,” Isis 52 (4): 555–566.
  • Martinello, F., 2008, “What Is Leibniz's Argument for the Identity of Indiscernibles in His Correspondence with Clarke?,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 16 (2): 315–333.
  • Mijuskovic, B. L., 1974, The Achilles of Rationalist Arguments, The Hague: M. Nijhoff.
  • O'Higgins, J., (ed.), 1976, Determinism and Freewill: Anthony Collins' “A Philosophical Inquiry concerning Human Liberty,” The Hague: M. Nijhoff.
  • Rowe, W. R., 1987, “Causality and Free Will in the Controversy Between Collins and Clarke,” The Journal of the History of Philosophy, 25: 51–67.
  • Rozemond, M., 2009, “Can Matter Think? The Mind-Body Problem in the Clarke-Collins Correspondence,” Topics in Early Modern Philosophy of Mind, J. Miller (ed.), 171–192.
  • –––, 2008, “The Achilles Argument and the Nature of Matter in the Clarke-Collins Correspondence,” The Achilles of Rationalist Psychology, T. Lennon & R. Stainton (eds.), 159–175.
  • Schliesser, E., 2012, “Newton and Spinoza: On Motion and Matter (And God, Of Course),” The Southern Journal of Philosophy 50: 436–458.
  • Thiel, U., 2011, The Early Modern Subject, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Vailati, E., 1993, “Clarke's Extended Soul,”Journal of the History of Philosophy, 28: 213–28.
  • –––, 1997, Leibniz and Clarke: A Study of their Correspondence, New York: Oxford University Press.

Boyle Lectures

  • Atkey, A., 1725, Letters Written, in MDCCXXV, to the Rev. Dr. Samuel Clarke, relating to an argument advanced by the Doctor, in his Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, in proof of the Unity of the Deity: with the Doctor's Answers, London: Daniel Browne, 1745.
  • Dahm, J. J., 1970, “Science and Apologetics in the Early Boyle Lectures,” Church History, 39 (2): 172–186.
  • Force, J. E., 1984, “Hume and the Relation of Science to Religion among Certain Members of the Royal Society,” Journal of the History of Ideas, 45 (4): 517–536.
  • –––, 1996, “Samuel Clarke's Four Categories of Deism, Isaac Newton, and the Bible,” Scepticism in the History of Philosophy, R. Popkin (ed.), Dordrecht: Kluwer, 53–74.
  • Khamara, E. J., 1992, “Hume Versus Clarke on the Cosmological Argument,” The Philosophical Quarterly 42: 34–55.
  • Le Rossignol, J. E., 1892, The Ethical Philosophy of Samuel Clarke, Leipzig.
  • MacIntosh, J. J., 1997, “The Argument from the Need for Similar or ‘Higher’ Qualities: Cudworth, Locke, and Clarke on God's Existence,” Enlightenment and Dissent 16: 29–59.
  • Rowe, W. R., 1997, “Clarke and Leibniz on Divine Perfection and Freedom,” Enlightenment and Dissent 16: 60–82.
  • –––, 1975, The Cosmological Argument, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • Stewart, L., 1981, “Samuel Clarke, Newtonianism and the Factions of Post-Revolutionary England,” Journal of the History of Ideas 42: 53–71.
  • Thomas, D. O., 1997, “Reason and Revelation in Samuel Clarke's Epistemology of Morals,” Enlightenment and Dissent 16: 114–135.
  • Zebrowski, M. K., 1997, “'Commanded of God, Because ‘tis Holy and Good’: The Christian Platonism and Natural Law of Samuel Clarke,” Enlightenment and Dissent 16: 3–28.

Influence and Reception

  • Attfield, R., 2004, “Rousseau, Clarke, Butler and Critiques of Deism,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 12 (3): 429–443.
  • Barresi, J., and Martin, R., 2004, Naturalization of the Soul: Self and Personal Identity in the Eighteenth Century, New York: Routledge.
  • Edwards, J., 1754, Freedom of the Will, P. Ramsey (ed.), New Haven, CT: Yale University Press, 1957. [Available online]
  • Ferguson, J. P., 1976, An Eighteenth Century Heretic. Dr Samuel Clarke, Kineton, UK: Roundwood Press.
  • –––, 1974, The Philosophy of Dr Samuel Clarke and Its Critics, New York: Vantage Press.
  • Flew, A., 1951, “Locke and the Problem of Personal Identity,” Philosophy, 26: 359–383.
  • Hume, D., 1739, A Treatise of Human Nature, London: John Noon. [Available online]
  • –––, 1745, A Letter from a Gentleman to His Friend in Edinburgh, Edinburgh.
  • Jacob, M. C., 1976, The Newtonians and the English Revolution: 1689–1720, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.
  • Kant, I., 1781/1787, Critique of Pure Reason, P. Guyer and A. W. Wood (eds.), Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
  • King, W., and Law, E., 1758, An Essay on the Origin of Evil, E. Law (ed. and trans.), 4th edition, London; reprinted in The Collected Works of Edmund Law, Chippenham, UK: Thoemmes, 1997.
  • Law, E., 1758, Collected Works of Edmund Law, 5 vols., V. Nuovo (ed.), Chippenham, UK: Thoemmes, 1997.
  • Meli, D. B., 1999, “Caroline, Leibniz, and Clarke,” Journal of the History of Ideas 60 (3): 469–486.
  • Newton, I., 1726, The Principia: Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy, I. B. Cohen and A. Whitman (trans. and eds.), Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1999.
  • Prior, A., 1957, “Opposite Number,” Review of Metaphysics, 11: 196–201.
  • Rousseau, J., 1762, Emile or On Education, A. Bloom (ed. and trans.), New York: Basic Books, 1997.
  • Russell, P., 1997, “Clarke's ‘Almighty Space’ and Hume's Treatise,” Enlightenment and Dissent 16: 83–113.
  • –––, 2008, The Riddle of Hume's Treatise: Skepticism, Naturalism, and Irreligion, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Stewart, J., 1754, “Some Remarks on the Laws of Motion, and the Inertia of Matter,” Essays and Observations, Physical and Literary, Edinburgh: G. Hamilton and J. Balfour.
  • Tull Baker, J., 1932, “Space, Time, and God: A Chapter in Eighteenth Century English Philosophy,” The Philosophical Review 41 (6): 577–593.
  • Voltaire, 1752, “Plato,” Philosophical Dictionary, W. F. Fleming (trans.), New York: E. R. Dumont, 1901.
  • Watts, I., 1733, Philosophical Essays on Various Subjects, 2nd edition, London: Richard Ford.
  • Williams, B., 1957, “Personal Identity and Individuation,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 57: 229–252.
  • Yolton, J. W., 1983, Thinking Matter: Materialism in Eighteenth-Century Britain, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press.


  • Brewster, D., 1855, Memoirs of the Life, Writings, and Discoveries of Sir Isaac Newton, 2 vols, Edinburgh: Thomas Constable & Co. [Second volume available online.]
  • Hoadly, B. (ed.), 1730, Sermons on Several Subjects by Samuel Clarke, D.D., London: W. Botham.
  • Stephen, L., 1881, “Clarke and Wollaston,” A History of English Thought in the Eighteenth Century, 2 vols., 2nd ed., London: Smith, Elder, & Co.
  • Stephen, L., and Lee, S., (eds.), 1882, Dictionary of National Biography, London; reprinted by London: Oxford University Press, 1949–50, sub voce.
  • Sykes, A., 1729, “The Elogium of the late truly Learned, Reverend and Pious Samuel Clarke, D.D.,” W. Whiston (ed.), Historical Memoirs of the Life of Dr. Samuel Clarke, 3rd ed., London, 1748. [Available online.]
  • Whiston, W., 1728, A Collection of Authentick Records, London. [Available online.]
  • –––, 1730, Historical Memoirs of the Life of Dr. Samuel Clarke, London.

Other Internet Resources

  • Google Books has digitized versions of Volume 2 (including the correspondence with Leibniz) and Volume 4 (including the Demonstration) of the definitive 1738 edition of the Works, edited by Hoadly.
  • Samuel Clarke in the Early Modern Philosophy Texts, prepared by Jonathan Bennett and Peter Millican, contains the texts of A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God, the correspondence with Butler, and the correspondence with Leibniz, in heavily edited versions prepared for students.
  • Samuel Clarke, catalog of the Galileo Project, maintained by Albert Van Helden.

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Ezio Vailati

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