Civil Rights

First published Mon Feb 3, 2003; substantive revision Fri Apr 28, 2017

In contemporary political thought, the term ‘civil rights’ is indissolubly linked to the struggle for equality of American blacks during the 1950s and 60s. The aim of that struggle was to secure the status of equal citizenship in a liberal democratic state. Civil rights are the basic legal rights a person must possess in order to have such a status. They are the rights that constitute free and equal citizenship and include personal, political, and economic rights. No contemporary thinker of significance holds that such rights can be legitimately denied to a person on the basis of race, color, sex, religion, national origin, or disability. By contrast, among the issues contested at present are those concerning whether the law-enforcement practice of racial profiling is justifiable, how to protect the equal right to vote of racial minorities, and whether the right to marry should be extended to same-sex partners. In addition, there is an extensive literature debating the philosophical and practical issues raised by the right of the disabled to equal citizenship.

1. Rights

1.1 The Civil-Political Distinction

Until the middle of the 20th century, civil rights were usually distinguished from ‘political rights’. The former included the rights to own property, make and enforce contracts, receive due process of law, and worship one’s religion. Civil rights also covered freedom of speech and the press (Amar 1998: 216–17). But they did not include the right to vote or to hold public office. The latter were political rights, reserved to adult males. Accordingly, the woman’s emancipation movement of the 19th century, which aimed at full sex equality under the law, pressed for equal “civil and political equality” (Taylor 1851/1984: 397 emphasis added)

The civil-political distinction was conceptually and morally unstable insofar as it was used to sort citizens into different categories. It was part of an ideology that classified women as citizens entitled to certain rights but not to the full panoply to which men were entitled. As that ideology broke down, the civil-political distinction began to unravel. The idea that a certain segment of the adult citizenry could legitimately possess one bundle of rights, while another segment would have to make do with an inferior bundle, became increasingly implausible. In the end, the civil-political distinction could not survive the cogency of the principle that all citizens of a liberal democracy were entitled, in Rawls’s words, to “a fully adequate scheme of equal basic liberties” (2001: 42).

It may be possible to retain the distinction strictly as one for sorting rights, rather than sorting citizens (Marshall, 1965; Waldron 1993). But it is difficult to give a convincing account of the principles by which this sorting is done. It seems neater and cleaner simply to think of civil rights as the general category of basic rights needed for free and equal citizenship. Yet, it remains a matter of contention which claims are properly conceived as belonging to the category of civil rights (Wellman 1999). Analysts have distinguished among “three generations” of civil rights claims and have argued over which claims ought to be treated as true matters of civil rights.

1.2 Three Generations of Rights

The claims for which the American civil rights movement initially fought belong to the first generation of civil rights claims. Those claims included the pre-20th century set of civil rights — such as the rights to receive due process and to make and enforce contracts — but covered political rights as well. However, many thinkers and activists argued that these first-generation claims were too narrow to define the scope of free and equal citizenship. They contended that such citizenship could be realized only by honoring an additional set of claims, including rights to food, shelter, medical care, and employment. This second generation of economic “welfare rights,” the argument went, helped to ensure that the political, economic, and legal rights belonging to the first generation could be made effective and that the vital interests of all citizens were protected. Accordingly, Martin Luther King, Jr. wrote, “With Selma and the Voting Rights Act one phase of development in the civil rights revolution came to an end,” and “[a] new phase opened” which would seek a massive national investment in “programs to fight poverty, ignorance and slums.(1967: 3 and 6).

Yet, some scholars have argued that these second-generation rights should not be subsumed under the category of civil rights. Thus, Cranston writes, ”The traditional ‘political and civil rights’ can…be readily secured by legislation. Since the rights are for the most part rights against government interference…the legislation needed had to do no more than restrain the executive’s own arm. This is no longer the case when we turn to the ‘right to work’, the ‘right to social security’ and so forth“ (1967: 50–51).

However, Cranston fails to recognize that such first-generation rights as due process and the right to vote also require substantial government action and the investment of considerable public resources. Holmes and Sunstein (1999) have made the case that all of the first-generation civil rights require government to do more than simply ”restrain the executive’s own arm.“ It seems problematic to think that a significant distinction can be drawn between first and second-generation rights on the ground that the former, but not the latter, simply require that government refrain from interfering with the actions of persons. Moreover, even if some viable distinction could be drawn along those lines, it would not follow that second-generation rights should be excluded from the category of civil rights. The reason is that the relevant standard for inclusion as a civil right is whether a claim is part of the package of rights constitutive of free and equal citizenship. There is no reason to think that only those claims that can be ”readily secured by legislation“ belong to that package. And the increasingly dominant view is that welfare rights are essential to adequately satisfying the conditions of free and equal citizenship (Marshall 1965; Waldron 1993; Sunstein 2001).

In the United States, however, the law does not treat issues of economic well-being per se as civil rights matters. Only insofar as economic disadvantage is linked to race, gender or some other traditional category of antidiscrimination law is it considered to be a question of civil rights. In legal terms, poverty is not a ”suspect classification.“ By contrast, welfare rights are protected as a matter of constitutional principle in other democracies. For example, section 75 of the Danish Constitution provides that ”any person unable to support himself or his dependents shall, where no other person is responsible for his or their maintenance, be entitled to receive public assistance.“

A third generation of claims has received considerable attention in recent years, what may be broadly termed ”rights of cultural membership.“ These include language rights for members of cultural minorities and the rights of indigenous peoples to preserve their cultural institutions and practices and to exercise some measure of political autonomy. There is some overlap with the first-generation rights, such as that of religious liberty, but rights of cultural membership are broader and more controversial.

Article 27 of the International Covenant on Civil and Political Rights (see Other Internet Resources) declares that third-generation rights ought to be protected:

In those States in which ethnic, religious or linguistic minorities exist, persons belonging to such minorities shall not be denied the right, in community with the other members of their group, to enjoy their own culture, to profess and practice their own religion, or to use their own language.

Similarly, the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms protects the language rights of minorities, and section 27 provides that ”This Charter shall be interpreted in a manner consistent with the preservation and enhancement of the multicultural heritage of Canadians.“ In the United States, there is no analogous protection of language rights or multiculturalism, although constitutional doctrine does recognize native Indian tribes as ”domestic dependent nations“ with some attributes of political self-rule, such as sovereign immunity (Oklahoma Tax Commission v. Citizen Band Potawatomi Indian Tribe).

There is substantial philosophical controversy over the legitimacy and scope of rights of cultural membership. Kymlicka has argued that the liberal commitment to protect the equal rights of individuals requires society to protect such rights, suitably defined (1989; 1994; 1995). He distinguishes among three sorts of rights that have been claimed as part of this third generation by various groups whose culture differs from the dominant culture of a country: (1) rights of self-government, involving a claim to a degree of political autonomy to be exercised through the minority culture’s own of institutions, (2) polyethnic rights, involving special claims by members of the minority culture to facilitate their integration into mainstream institutions and practices, and (3) representational rights, involving a special claim of the minority culture to have its members serve in legislatures and other political bodies of the broader society (1995: 27–33). Kymlicka argues that these three sorts of group rights can, in principle, be justified for those populations that he designates as ”national minorities,“ such as native Americans in the United States and the Québécois and Aboriginals in Canada. A national minority is ”an intergenerational community, more or less institutionally complete, occupying a given territory or homeland, [and] sharing a distinct language and history“(18). Kymlicka contends that ”granting special representational rights, land claims, or language rights to a [national] minority … can be seen as putting … [it] on a more equal footing [with the majority], by reducing the extent to which the smaller group is vulnerable to the larger“ (36–37). Such special rights do not involve granting to the national minority the authority to take away any of the civil rights of its members. Rather, the rights are ”external protections,“ providing the group with powers and immunities with which it can protect its culture against the potentially harmful decisions of the broader society (35).

According to Kymlicka, In contrast to national minorities (and refugees), most immigrants have left their original cultures voluntarily and so are entitled only to a much more limited set of group rights. These ”polyethnic rights“are claims to have certain adjustments or accommodations made in the prevailing laws and regulations so as give individuals access to the social mainstream. Thus, Kymlicka thinks that Orthodox Jews in the U.S. Armed Forces should have the legal right to wear a yarmulke while on duty and Canadian Sikhs have a legitimate claim to be exempt from motorcycle helmet laws (31).

Waldron (1995) criticizes Kymlicka for exaggerating the importance to the individual of membership in her particular culture and for underestimating the mutability and interpenetration of cultures. Kymlicka emphasizes that individual freedom requires some cultural context that constitutes the meaningful options from which the individual can choose her path in life. However, Waldron responds that such freedom does not require the preservation of the particular context in which the individual finds herself. Liberal individuals must be prepared to evaluate their culture and to distance themselves from it.

Kukathas criticizes Kymlicka for implying that the liberal commitment to the protection of individual rights is insufficient to treat the interests of minorities with equal consideration. Kukathas contends that ”we need to reassert the importance of individual liberty or individual rights and question the idea that cultural minorities have collective rights“ (1995: 230). But the system of uniform legal rules that he endorses would keep the state from intervening even when a minority culture inflicts significant harm on its more vulnerable members, e.g., when cultural norms strongly discourage females from seeking the same educational and career opportunities as males.

Perhaps the most criticized part of Kymlicka’s account is his distinction between national minorities and immigrants. Many critics agree with Choudhry that ”in the majority of cases the decision to immigrate is not free“ (64) due entrenched features of the global economy and other factors beyond the control of immigrants. But Patten defends a qualified form of Kymlicka’s distinction, arguing that, in light of the benefits received by immigrants and a moral prerogative that states enjoy to pursue their own national projects,“a modest prioritizing of the claims of national minorities over those of immigrants is reasonable and permissible” (295-96).

However, Patten holds that Kymlicka’s approach is deficient when it comes to cultural minorities — including immigrants —who are geographically-dispersed and lack institutions that could serve as the basis for their collective self-government. Contra Kymlicka, Patten argues that, as a matter of justice, such persons have a right that their cultural practices enjoy a level of recognition and accommodation from the state that is equal to what the majority culture enjoys. This right derives from a liberal state’s “obligation to extend a fair opportunity for self-determination to all its citizens,” (29) an obligation entailing that the state “has the responsibility to be neutral toward the various conceptions of the good that are affirmed by its citizens” (27). The appropriate form of neutrality (what Patten calls “neutrality of treatment”) is achieved when the state provides comparable facilities, resources, and opportunities to the members of cultural minority groups so that they are neither disadvantaged nor advantaged, relative to those in the cultural majority, when it comes to pursuing identity-related aspects of their conceptions of the good. Patten explains identity-related features as ones that are not simply preferences but help to define a person’s sense of who she is and hold a place of central importance in a person’s system of ends.

According to Patten, among the areas in which a state might be called upon to extend special rights to cultural minorities are language, holidays, and the arrangement of substate political divisions. For example, neutrality of treatment might require the state to supply its services, such as assistance with tax preparations or information regarding health matters, in the languages of cultural minorities. Although such accommodations would go well beyond what Kymlicka has endorsed, Patten agrees with Kymlicka that the underlying aim of cultural rights is not to ensure the survival of a culture. As Patten puts it, such rights “are not rights to cultural preservation” (29). Once a framework of fair opportunity is established, whatever cultural outcome that emerges is just, even if some cultures “struggle or . . . disappear altogether” (29).

Notwithstanding the differences, the positions of Patten and Kymlicka occupy a middle ground between views that are largely antagonistic to the idea of cultural rights and views that embrace such rights on the ground that the survival of cultures has an intrisic importance, irreducible to the interests of individuals. Barry takes the former, antagonistic view, while Taylor takes the latter.

Barry (2001) asserts that ”there are certain rights against oppression, exploitation, and injury, to which every single human being is entitled to lay claim, and…appeals to cultural diversity and pluralism under no circumstances trump the value of basic liberal rights“ (132–33). The legal system should protect those rights by impartially imposing the same rules on all persons, regardless of their cultural or religious membership. Barry allows for a few exceptions, such as the accommodation of a Sikh boy whose turban violated school dress regulations, but thinks that the conditions under which such exceptions will be justified ”are rarely satisfied“ (2001: 62).

At the other end of the spectrum, Taylor (1994) argues for a form of communitarianism that attaches intrinsic importance to the survival of cultures. In his view, differential treatment under the law for certain practices is sometimes justifiable on the ground that such treatment is important for keeping a culture alive. Taylor goes as far as to claim that cultural survival can sometimes trump basic individual rights, such as freedom of speech. Accordingly, he defends legal restrictions on the use of English in Quebec, invoking the survival of Quebec’s French culture.

However, it is unclear why intrinsic value should attach to cultural survival as such. Following John Dewey (1939), Kymlicka (1995) rightly emphasizes that liberty would have little or no value to the individual apart from the life-options and meaningful choices provided by culture. But both of them, as well as Barry and Patten, reasonably contend that human interests are ultimately the interests of individual human beings. In light of that contention, it would seem that a culture that could not gain the uncoerced and undeceived adherence of enough individuals to survive would have no moral claim to its continuation. Legal restrictions on basic liberties that are designed to perpetuate a given culture have the cart before the horse: persons should have their basic liberties protected first, as those protections serve the most important human interests. Only when those interests are protected can we then say that a culture should survive, not because the culture is intrinsically valuable, but rather because it has the uncoerced adherence of a sufficient number of persons.

2. Blacks and Native Americans: Integration and Self-Rule

The treatment of blacks under slavery and Jim Crow presents a history of injustice and cultural annihilation that is similar in some respects to the treatment of Native Americans. However, civil rights principles played very different roles in the struggle of these two oppressed groups.

Civil rights principles demand that individuals from a disadvantaged group have an opportunity for inclusion in the mainstream institutions of society on an equal basis with the individuals who are already treated as full citizens. However, in certain situations, such principles might require that the disadvantaged group be given a right to govern its own affairs, as Kymlicka’s account shows. This right of political self-determination has a separatist aspect, even though something less than complete sovereignty is involved. In general, the guiding aim of the civil rights movement of American blacks was equal inclusion, while Native American activists sought political self-determination.

2.1 Integration and Black Nationalism

The fact that American blacks lacked any territory of their own on which they could rule themselves favored the inclusion strategy, although arguments were made that there was sufficient geographical concentration of blacks in certain parts of the South (the so-called ”Black Belt“) for the African-Americans there to form their own self-governing nation. Thus, shortly after World War II, Harry Haywood advocated black political self-determination on the ground that the only way to solve ”the issue of Negro equality“ was through their ”full development as a nation“ (1948: 143). But there was stronger support among American blacks for a strategy that focused on the demand for inclusion on equal terms with whites in the body politic of the United States. The civil war amendments, and the civil rights laws that accompanied them, promised such inclusion, and, in their struggle to defeat Jim Crow, blacks repeatedly called upon white Americans live up to the promise. Integration into the mainstream institutions of society, rather than separate nationhood, was the goal of most American blacks, as shown by the widespread support among blacks for their civil rights movement.

For America’s blacks during the 1950s and 60s, the only attractive alternative to the movement’s guiding goal of inclusion was a form of black nationalism, the main aim of which was obtaining increased resources from the broader society for black institutions and communities. Black self-government along the lines suggested by Haywood did not seem politically possible to most blacks during the civil rights era, but resources for strengthening black businesses and schools and improving black housing was a quite reasonable demand to make on whites. And so many black nationalists argued that, unless and until black communities and their institutions were strengthened, the promise of racial justice through integration and equal opportunity would prove hollow (Ture and Hamilton 1967/1992). Accordingly, black nationalists criticized civil rights leaders for pursuing a strategy to achieve racial equality that was bound to fail.

Valls has recently developed a ”liberal black nationalism“ (2010: 479) by adapting Kymlicka’s account of group rights and arguing that, because American blacks are kind of national minority victimized by historical injustice at the hands of the white population, ”justice demands the support of black institutions and communities by the broader society“ (474). After this support is forthcoming, Valls contends, individual blacks will be in position to make a free and fair choice as whether, and to what degree, to participate in black institutions and to live in black communities or to become integrated into racially-mixed areas of society. But Elizabeth Anderson has argued, against black nationalism, that segregation is a ”fundamental cause of social inequality and undemocratic practices,“ (2010: 2) and ”[c]omprehensive racial integration is a necessary condition for a racially just future“ (189). Anderson’s argument entails that Vall’s form of black nationalism is self-defeating: segregation itself works to prevent the white support for black communities and institutions for which such nationalism calls.

However, Shelby argues that Anderson has failed to appreciate the key reasons why blacks prefer to live in mainly black neighborhoods: “the main concern is to elude interpersonal discrimination, racist treatment, and hostile attitudes,” supplemented by a desire “to avoid interracial conflict” (269). Seen in this light, black residential self-segregation is a form of “black solidarity” and “a component of an ethic of resistance to injustice” (271). Additionally, Shelby contends that Anderson “gives too little weight” to the value of the neighborhood-based social networks that economically disadvantaged blacks have in their segregated neighborhoods; those networks often provide “child care, transportation, and employment information and referral” (275), and it is unclear that giving up the networks and moving to more affluent, white areas would be sensible, especially because, by Anderson’s own assessment, anti-black prejudice is pervasive among whites (Shelby: 276). Shelby agrees with Anderson “that justice requires that obstacles to integration be removed so that individuals have the option to integrate,” but he does question the view “that justice requires that individuals actually integrate” (277 emphasis in original).

At the same time, one should keep in mind that Shelby’s disagreement with Anderson is focused on residential integration and does not extend to her insistence that justice requires integration in workplaces and political institutions. Additionally, one should take note of Miller’s argument that, in an ethnically and racially diverse society, integration appears to be the best way of fostering generalized trust across groups and that such trust is an important variable determining the level of support that persons give to treating out-group members in accordance with principle of social justice (2013: 87-91).

2.2 Political Self-Rule and Native Americans

In contrast to the civil rights movement of American blacks, Native Americans sought to mitigate the injustices perpetrated against them mainly by pursuing political self-determination, in the form of tribal self-rule. Even after the brutal tribal removals of the early 19th century and the efforts at the end of that century to destroy tribal control of lands through individual allotments, tribes still retained some territorial basis on which a measure of self-rule was possible. And during the black civil rights movement of the 1950s and 60s, there was tension between Native Americans and blacks due to their different attitudes toward self-determination and civil rights. Some Native Americans looked askance at the desire of blacks for inclusion and integration into white society, and they thought that the desire was hopelessly naïve (Deloria, 1988: 169–70). Such Native Americans were more in tune with radical black nationalists who favored Haywood’s call for blacks to govern themselves politically in those jurisdictions where they were concentrated.

In 1968, Congress enacted an Indian Civil Rights Act (ICRA). The act extended the reach of certain individual constitutional rights against government to intratribal affairs. Tribal governments would for the first time be bound by constitutional principles concerning free speech, due process, cruel and unusual punishment, and equal protection, among others. Freedom of religion was omitted from the law as a result of the protests of the Pueblo, whose political arrangements were theocratic, but the law was a major incursion on tribal self-determination, nonetheless (Norgren and Shattuck, 1993: 169).

A married pueblo woman brought suit in federal court, claiming that the tribe’s marriage ordinances constituted sex discrimination against her and other women of the tribe, thus violating the ICRA. (Santa Clara Pueblo v. Martinez) The ordinances excluded from tribal membership the children of a Pueblo woman who married outside of the tribe, while the children of men who married outsiders were counted as members. Martinez had initially sought relief in tribal forums, to no avail, before turning to the federal courts. The Supreme Court held that federal courts did not have jurisdiction to hear the case: the substantive provisions of the ICRA did apply to the Pueblo, but the inherent sovereign powers of the tribe meant that the tribal government had exclusive jurisdiction in the case. The ruling has been both questioned and defended by feminist legal scholars (MacKinnon, 1987; Valencia-Weber 2004).

Unlike U.S. law, the Canadian Indian Act provides that men and women are to be treated equally when it comes to the band membership of their children (Johnston, 1995: 190). This law and the Santa Clara case raise the general issue of whether and when it is justifiable for a liberal state to impose liberal principles on illiberal (or not fully liberal) political communities that had been involuntary incorporated into the larger state. Addressing this issue, Kymlicka (1995) argues that “there is relatively little scope for legitimate coercive interference” because efforts to impose liberal principles tend to be counterproductive, provoking the charge that they amount to “paternalistic colonialism.” Moreover, “liberal institutions can only really work if liberal beliefs have been internalized.” Kymlicka concludes, then, that liberals on the outside of an illiberal culture should support the efforts of those insiders who seek reform but should generally stop short of coercively imposing liberal principles (1995: 167). At the same time, Kymlicka acknowledges that there are cases in which a liberal state is clearly permitted to impose its laws, citing with approval the decision in a case that involved the application of Canadian law to a tribe that had kidnapped a member and forced him to undergo an initiation ceremony (44).

Applying Kymlicka’s general line of thinking might prove contentious in many cases. Consider Santa Clara. His arguments could be used to support the decision in that case: the exercise of jurisdiction might be deemed “paternalistic colonialism.” But one might argue, instead, that jurisdiction is needed to vindicate the basic liberal right of gender equality. However, it does seem that, if a wrong akin to kidnapping or worse is required before federal courts can legitimately step in, then the Santa Clara case falls short of meeting such a requirement. The argument might then shift to whether the requirement imposes an excessively high hurdle for the exercise of federal jurisdiction. Accordingly, Kymlicka’s approach might not settle the disagreement over Santa Clara, but it does provide a very reasonable normative framework in terms of which liberal thought can address the difficult issues presented by the case and, more generally, by the problem of extending liberal principles to Native American tribes.

3. Free and Equal Citizenship

Civil rights are those rights that constitute free and equal citizenship in a liberal democracy. Such citizenship has two main dimensions, both tied to the idea of autonomy. Accordingly, civil rights are essentially connected to securing the autonomy of the citizen.

2.1 Public and Private Autonomy

To be a free and equal citizen is, in part, to have those legal guarantees that are essential to fully adequate participation in public discussion and decisionmaking. A citizen has a right to an equal voice and an equal vote. In addition, she has the rights needed to protect her “moral independence,” that is, her ability to decide for herself what gives meaning and value to her life and to take responsibility for living in conformity with her values (Dworkin, 1995: 25). Accordingly, equal citizenship has two main dimensions: “public autonomy,” i.e., the individual’s freedom to participate in the formation of public opinion and society’s collective decisions; and “private autonomy,” i.e., the individual’s freedom to decide what way of life is most worth pursuing (Habermas: 1996). The importance of these two dimensions of citizenship stem from what Rawls calls the “two moral powers” of personhood: the capacity for a sense of justice and the capacity for a conception of the good (1995: 164; 2001: 18). A person stands as an equal citizen when society and its political system give equal and due weight to the interest each citizen has in the development and exercise of those capacities.

2.2 Ancient and Modern Citizenship

The idea of equal citizenship can be traced back to Aristotle’s political philosophy and his claim that true citizens take turns ruling and being ruled (1984: 1252a16). In modern society, the idea has been transformed, in part by the development of representative government and its system of elections (Manin 1997). For modern liberal thought, citizenship is no longer a matter of having a direct and equal share in governance, but rather consists in a legal status that confers a certain package of rights that guarantee to an individual a voice, a vote, and a zone of private autonomy. The other crucial differences between modern liberalism and earlier political theories concern the range of human beings who are regarded as having the capacity for citizenship and the scope of private autonomy to which each citizen is entitled as a matter of basic right. Modern liberal theory is more expansive on both counts than its ancient and medieval forerunners.

It is true that racist and sexist ideas plagued liberal theory for much of its modern history (e.g., see Eze 1997 and Mills 2005 on Kant’s racism). However, two crucial liberal ideas have made possible an internal critique of racism, sexism, and other illegitimate forms of hierarchy. The first is that society is constructed by humans, a product of human will, and is not some preordained natural or God-given order. The second is that social arrangements need to be justified before the court of reason to each individual who lives under them and who is capable of reasoning. The conjunction of these ideas made possible an egalitarianism that was not available to ancient and medieval political thought, although this liberal egalitarianism emerged haltingly out of the racist and sexist presuppositions that infused much liberal theorizing and that, even if in modified forms, still shape the mentality of substantial portions of the population in liberal democratic states.

Many contemporary theorists have argued that taking liberal egalitarianism to its logical conclusion requires the liberal state to pursue a program of deliberately reconstructing informal social norms and cultural meanings. They contend that social stigma and denigration still operate powerfully to deny equal citizenship to groups such as blacks, women, and gays. Accordingly, Kernohan has argued that “the egalitarian liberal state should play an activist role in cultural reform” (1998: xi), and Koppelman has taken a similar position: “the antidiscrimination project seeks to reconstruct social reality to eliminate or marginalize the shared meanings, practices and institutions that unjustifiably single out certain groups of citizens for stigma and disadvantage” (1996: 8). This position is deeply at odds with at least some of the ideas that lie behind the advocacy of third-generation civil rights. Those rights ground claims of cultural survival, whether or not a culture’s meanings, practices and institutions stigmatize and disadvantage the members of some ascriptively-defined group. The egalitarian proponents of cultural reconstruction can be understood as advocating a different kind of “third-generation” for the civil rights movement: one in which the state, having attacked legal, political and economic barriers to equal citizenship, now takes on cultural obstacles.

A cultural-reconstruction phase of the civil rights movement would run contrary to Kukathas’s argument that it is too dangerous to license the state to intervene against cultures that engage in social tyranny (2001). It also raises questions about whether state-supported cultural reconstruction would violate basic liberties, such as freedom of private association. The efforts of New Jersey to apply antidiscrimination law to the Boy Scouts, a group whose national organization discriminated against gays until 2015 (Boy Scouts: 2015), illustrates the potential problems. The Supreme Court invalidated the state’s efforts on grounds of free association (Boys Scouts v. Dale). Nonetheless, it may be necessary to reconceive the scope and limits of some basic liberties if the principle of free and equal citizenship is followed through to its logical conclusions.

4. Voting Rights

Among the most effective and important pieces of legislation to come out of the civil rights movement was the Voting Rights Act of 1965 (VRA). The act effected a “quiet revolution” (Davidson and Grofman) in the political systems of southern states by greatly reducing the legal power those states had traditionally possessed to determine the rules by which their electoral systems operated. The rules had been designed to ensure that whites maintained a monopoly on political power by disenfranchising African Americans, notwithstanding the demand of the Fifteenth Amendment that the right to vote not be denied or abridged on the basis of race or color. Using a variety of devices, southern jurisdictions had succeeded in denying the ballot to the vast majority of African Americans. Those devices included literacy and other knowledge tests, which were administered by local registrars in a discriminatory manner. And in Giles v. Harris (1903), the Supreme Court had effectively declared that the federal judiciary was not the place to go for blacks who sought to dismantle the system of disenfranchisement, with Justice Holmes writing for the Court that “relief from a great political wrong, if done, as alleged, by the people of a state and the state itself must be given by them or by the legislative and political department of the government of the United States” (488).

The VRA took a series of unprecedented steps in shifting the power to regulate elections from the states to the national government. The traditional understanding had been that, under the Constitution, states had the exclusive and final power to determine the rules by which their elections were held. The VRA overturned that understanding, inserting federal power into the sovereign domain of the states. Previous federal statutes addressing racial discrimination in voting had respected that domain and had required the right to vote, regardless of race or color, be vindicated on a case-by-case basis by lawsuits brought by individual complainants. But by the mid-1960’s Congress had determined that such an approach had proved ineffective in addressing systemic violations of the Fifteenth Amendment.

Section 2 of the VRA contained a nationwide ban on any voting qualification or procedure that denied or abridged a citizen’s right to vote on account of race or color. The act went on to provide remedies to make the ban effective in jurisdictions that had been particularly egregious in their violations of the Fifteenth Amendment. The remedies applied to jurisdictions that met two conditions (the “coverage formula”): 1) as of November 1964, the jurisdiction was using a literacy test or some similar device to determine eligibility to register, and 2) the proportion of eligible voters in the jurisdiction who were actually registered on that date was below 50% , or the voter turnout there for that year’s presidential election was below 50%. The remedies authorized for use against jurisdictions that met the coverage formula included the invalidation of literacy tests and other such devices, the appointment of federal examiners to replace local registrars and to prepare and maintain the voting rolls, and, under Section 5, the requirement to gain federal approval (typically from the Attorney General) for any changes in rules governing elections (“the preclearance requirement”). Seven southern states fell under the coverage formula. Section 4 also provided that otherwise covered jurisdictions could “bailout” of federal oversight by showing that, in the previous five years, they had not used the suspect devices with the purpose or effect of denying the right to vote on racial grounds.“

The constitutionality of the key provisions of the VRA was challenged by the states that fell under the coverage formula, but the Supreme Court upheld the law in South Carolina v. Katzenbach (1966). The act was then reauthorized several times, most recently in 2006. The alterations sought to strengthen protections against what were called “second- generation” barriers to racial equality in the electoral process. The first generation had been the literacy tests and other devices that were applied in discriminatory fashion to block blacks from registering. The second generation consisted of various ways that the political power of registered minority voters was diluted by making it more difficult for them than for the white majority to elect their favored candidates.

Consider the following example of vote dilution. In many counties in the South, whites were in the overall majority but blacks were a majority in certain parts of the county. The counties were divided into districts, with each district electing a member of the county board. First-generation discrimination ensured all-white boards by blocking black registration in majority-black districts. When first-generation devices were invalidated as a result of the VRA, many southern counties switched from a district-based system to at-large voting, so that the white majority in the county could continue to elect an all-white board. The Supreme Court held that such changes were subject to a preclearance review by federal authorities, who were empowered to prohibit the changes. (Allen v. State Board of Elections 1969). However, in Shelby County v. Holder (2013), the Supreme Court effectively struck down the coverage formula of Section 4, thereby rendering impotent Section 5’s preclearance provision: with no coverage formula, no jurisdictions could be picked out as ones needing to receive federal approval for changing their electoral rules. The formula had been last updated in the early 1970’s, and, writing for the Court, Chief Justice Roberts found that the use of the formula had become “irrational” in light of the “dramatic [racial] progress” that had been made in the intervening decades (Slip Opinion at 23-24). He pointed out that the jurisdictions covered by the formula had rates of black voter registration and turnout as high, and in some cases higher, than the rates for whites, and that minorities now hold office “at unprecedented levels” (14) in those states.

Justice Roberts did not deny the existence of second-generation barriers, but he argued that Congress had failed to reshape the coverage formula to track the parts of the country in which such barriers were most prevalent at present. Accordingly, he did not see a rational relationship between the formula and any remaining obstacles to racial discrimination in voting. Moreover, he contended that Section 5 constituted a “dramatic departure from the principle that all states enjoy equal sovereignty” (1). In light of such a departure from a principle that he regarded as “fundamental” (11), Roberts concluded that Congress lacked the constitutional power to impose the old coverage formula.

In her dissent, Justice Ginsburg emphasized the evidential record that Congress had compiled prior to its 2006 reauthorization of the law. That record led Congress to the conclusion that the old coverage formula was adequate to capture those jurisdictions where second-generation barriers were most prevalent. For example, the record contained a study showing that covered areas were much more likely to be successfully sued in Section 2 litigation than jurisdictions that were not covered. Accordingly, Ginsburg judged that “Congress had reasonably concluded that the coverage formula continues to identify the jurisdictions of greatest concern” (Ginsburg, J., dissenting, Slip Opinion at 20). She also construed the “equal sovereignty” principle as applying only to the very limited circumstances in which a new state was being admitted to the union: the new state must not be accorded a lesser, or greater, degree of sovereignty than the existing states.

Much of the critical discussion of Shelby County has focused on the equal sovereignty principle, with many commentators rejecting Roberts’s characterization of the principle as legally fundamental. And it is true that his broad understanding of the principle does not find much explicit legal precedent. However, the principle, understood as he does, seems to be such a clear operating premise of American federalism that it could be reasonably expected to go unformulated for so long. Additionally, Roberts is correct to see section 5 of the VRA as a “dramatic departure” (1) from the principle. As Bruce Ackerman stresses, the VRA was a radical piece of legislation, akin to a constitutional amendment in the way that it overturned long-settled legal understandings. Nonetheless, Roberts’s argument remains problematic due to his insistence that Congress reshape the coverage formula in light of current realities regarding racial discrimination in voting. Congress did examine the current situation and found that no reformulation was needed because, notwithstanding the formula’s references to registration and turnout from decades ago, it still captured the jurisdictions with the most serious problems. This finding is not prima facie implausible, and Roberts’s second-guessing Congress’s judgment in the matter is difficult to defend.

In arguing that the coverage formula needed reformulation, Roberts pointed to the levels of black registration, turnout, and office holding in recent years. Turnout and registration were at least as high as for whites in covered jurisdictions, and office holding had increased dramatically over the decades. However, the turnout and registration figures do not speak to second-generation barriers, nor does the comparison between black office holding now and forty-five years ago. Whether or not those barriers have been largely taken down cannot be determined from a baseline of 1970: the admittedly great progress in office holding since then might only show how bad things were in the covered jurisdictions in 1970 and not how close they are now to having eliminated the effects of racial discrimination in their electoral processes.

5. Criminal Justice and Racial Profiling

In recent years, the criminal justice system has become a focal point in the discussion of civil rights in the United States. A number of commentators have argued that the system amounts to a “new Jim Crow,” reducing blacks to an inferior, caste-like status (Alexander 2012; for criticism of the Jim Crow analogy, see Forman 2012). Yet, even apart from such arguments, civil rights concerns have been raised about every dimension of criminal justice in the U.S., from the investigation and arrest of suspects to the imposition of the death penalty. And issues of racial equality with respect to criminal justice are hardly limited to the U.S. (Clarke: 9-10). In France, for example, race-based abuse perpetrated by the police is a matter of serious public concern, and the office of Defender of Rights has found that persons perceived as black or Arab are 20 times as likely to be stopped by police as members of the general population (Bredeen and Morenne).

Among the most controversial tactics used by police in determining who has committed a crime is racial (and ethnic) profiling. The tactic has given rise to the charge that the use of the tactic violates the civil rights of those whom it targets, and, in some cases, the courts have agreed with the charge. In State v. Soto, for example, a New Jersey court found that police traffic stops targeted blacks and amounted to a “selective enforcement” (351) of the law and a violation of the Equal Protection Clause of the 14th Amendment. Nonetheless, debate continues over when, if ever, it is justifiable for police to use race in deciding whom to stop and question.

Risse and Zeckhauser formulate a philosophically sophisticated defense of racial profiling. They argue that, even in a racist society like the United State, such profiling is justifiable under conditions plausibly thought to exist in a range of cases. Their argument combines utilitarian and deontological considerations: the utilitarian strand regards profiling as contributing to the public good of crime control, while the deontological line of argument aims to rebut claims that profiling is objectionably discriminatory and unfair to persons whom it harms.

Risse and Zeckhauser acknowledge that police abuse can be coupled with profiling, but they insist that “abuse and profiling . . . are different problems that must be assessed independently” (139; emphasis in original). Profiling is “any police initiated-action that relies on the race, ethnicity, or national origin and not merely on the behavior of an individual” (136). Such action need not involve any abusive police behavior, such as “rude words, demeaning demands, physical force, or physical injury” (138). Abuse “must be rectified independently” (139) of profiling.

Some critics of profiling contend that it is wholly ineffective as a crime control measure. Risse and Zeckhauser point out that if this contention is true, then there is no issue: profiling is unjustifiable on that premise. But they reason that, even if some forms of profiling make no net contribution to crime control, it seems unlikely that all forms fit that description, given “a significant correlation between membership in certain racial groups and the tendency to commit certain crimes” (132).

Racial minorities feel aggrieved by profiling, and Risse and Zeckhauser do not disregard that fact. However, they claim that the grievance rests largely on “the underlying systematic racism” (145) of society and that the harm done to minorities by profiling is “small” (169) in comparison to that harm done by that underlying racism. For example, African Americans would be “only slightly” better off if profiling were eliminated, “keeping everything else fixed” (149; emphasis in original). “[T]he harm attached to profiling per se,” they explain, “is expressive” (146; emphasis in original). Profiling is “a symbol of structural disadvantage” (147) but “not the primary cause of . . . the sense of hurt among minorities” (149). In the utilitarian calculus of Risse and Zeckhauser, the harms that count against the benefits flowing from more effective crime control are “comparatively modest” (149), viz., symbolic harms plus the temporary inconveniences of being stopped and questioned by the police. These modest harms are, in their view, likely to be outweighed in a range of cases by the benefits.

Additionally, Risse and Zeckhauser argue that racial profiling per se is not objectionably discriminatory, because it has neither “the intention or the effect of maintaining or establishing an oppressive relationship” between the races (153; emphasis in original). When it does not involve abuse, profiling has the intention of crime control, and, because profiling “is itself parasitic on an underlying oppressive relationship” (154) and does (mainly) symbolic harm, it “does not contribute to [an] oppressive relationship” (155).

Critics of Risse and Zeckhauser argue that profiling is not only a symbol of society’s underlying racism but that it contributes materially to such racism as well. Thus, Lever contends that profiling “encourages us to see black people as perpetrators” and that it likely “discourages black people from living, traveling and working in white neighborhoods” (2007: 23). Lever also challenges the idea that police abuse is independent of profiling; she suggests that “racial profiling exacerbates problems of police abuse” because such profiling “conveys a message that black people are . . . dangerous” (24). And one could also argue against Risse and Zeckhauser that it is reasonable to hold that abuse is a predictable consequence of the combination of profiling and society’s underlying racism, because the racist belief that blacks in general are especially likely to be lawbreakers is hardly foreign to police and can be reasonably expected to prime police to resort to excessive force and other forms of abuse when dealing with blacks.

Lippert-Rasmussen criticizes Risse and Zeckhauser for failing to take account of the fact that patterns and rates of crime among blacks are not independent of the wrongful behavior of whites in society at large toward blacks. If racial profiling is an effective law-enforcement practice because blacks disproportionately commit crimes of a certain sort, that fact might be the product of the unjustified, discriminatory conduct of whites, and if blacks reject profiling, it would seem that whites could not then justify the practice by appealing to its efficacy. Instead, whites could and should forego profiling and, instead, cease engaging in their wrongful behavior.

In replying to Lever and Lippert-Rasmussen, Risse notes that “[i]t may be true that, given current conditions, it is impossible to use race [in criminal profiling] . . . without encountering massive problems of police abuse” (2007: 4). But critics of profiling will say that even this point understates the matter: profiling predictably generates racist abuses by providing an opportunity for racist beliefs to operate in law enforcement and by encouraging such beliefs to operate there. And this situation is not simply a matter of “current conditions,” as though in the next few years the matter could well be different. As Risse writes in responding to Lippert-Rasmussen, the behavioral patterns of “people [who] have been socialized in a racist society . . . will be hard to change” (2007: 8).

Risse emphasizes that his view would justify racial profiling only when such profiling contributes to the provision of the important public good of personal safety. In his estimation, at least some of the forms that profiling has taken fail to meet that conditions, e.g., random traffic stops of blacks driving in white neighborhoods. His point is that it is a mistake to think that all forms of racial profiling are like such traffic stops and to categorically reject profiling on the assumption that the traffic-stop example can stand in for every form of racial profiling.

Reiman agrees that some forms of racial profiling can make a significant contribution to overall safety, but he also supports Lever’s view that racial profiling in a racist society is likely to exacerbate racism and increase the violation of the rights of those victimized by racism. While he holds that “profiling is not intrinsically racist” (17), Reiman argues that Risse and Zeckhauser have not set the bar sufficiently high for profiling to be justified. He contends that, in light of its likely exacerbation of existing racism, “racial profiling [must] be used only for grave crimes and only where there is abundant evidence of its likelihood of significantly increasing apprehension of perpetrators of such crimes” (17). This view is in conformity with Lever’s position that profiling should only be “an exceptional measure” (2005: 109) in the work of police.

The Risse- Zeckhauser argument is consistent with the idea, undoubtedly accepted by many critics of profiling, that racial injustice is severe and widespread in a society like the U.S. Disagreement arises, however, over the extent of the harms brought about by those forms of racial profiling that have value in catching offenders and reducing crime. But the deeper disagreement is over how the harms in question are to be factored into the determination of when profiling is acceptable. Risse and Zeckhauser hold that the harms are to be balanced against, and so can be outweighed by, the benefits of more effective law enforcement. Critics, on the other hand, do not regard the benefits of profiling as morally innocent gains, to be impersonally weighed in a utilitarian calculus. Rather, the critics see whatever law-enforcement benefits there may be as tainted by the way in which profiling, even when non-abusive, is linked to racism: the benefits should be morally discounted, or put another way, they should not simply outweigh the harms but should do so by an especially large margin if a given form of profiling is to be justifiable.

6. Marriage Equality

Among the most highly contested civil rights issues of recent years has been the question of whether marriage laws should be extended to include same-sex couples. Over the past two decades, a number of countries have liberalized their laws to enable such couples to become married, despite the opposition of those who think that it is morally or theologically unjustified to alter the traditional understanding of marriage as the union of a man and a woman. The countries that currently recognize same-sex marriages include the Netherlands, Belgium, Canada, South Africa, Spain, Norway, Sweden, Mexico, Portugal, Iceland, Argentina, Denmark, Brazil, France, England, New Zealand, and the United States. In most of these countries, nationwide same-sex marriage was brought about by legislation. But in the United States, the Supreme Court ruling in Obergefell v. Hodges extended same-sex marriage from ten states to all fifty.

Most scholars working in the areas of philosophy and legal theory endorse a principle of equal treatment for same-sex and heterosexual couples and argue that equal treatment requires that same-sex marriages be legalized (Wardle 1996 and Eskridge 1996). However, there are dissenting voices in the literature, rejecting marriage equality. These voices do not argue in favor the traditional practice of criminalizing same-sex relations, although some contend that such relations are “manifestly unworthy of the human being and immoral” (Finnis 1996: 14). But they all argue that extending marriage to same-sex couples flouts important values and principles.

Many advocates of a right to same-sex marriage argue that abridging a person’s right to marry on the basis of sexual orientation is objectionable for the same reasons that abridging that right on the basis of race cannot be justified: both forms of restriction are arbitrary deprivations of a fundamental civil right (Koh et al.: 18-19 and 42). However, such an argument proceeds too quickly. In the eyes of opponents, the analogy between race and sexual orientation is inapt: the considerations they invoke against same-sex marriage, such as the interests of children or the distinctive nature of heterosexual intercourse, do not apply to interracial marriages. Accordingly, arguments about same-sex marriage must engage with those considerations.

Finnis (1996), Lee (1997) and George (1997) make their case against same-sex marriage by invoking natural law. However, unlike traditional versions of natural law theory, their version does not rest on any explicit theological or metaphysical claims. Rather, it invokes independent principles of practical reasoning that articulate the basic reasons for action. Such reasons are the fundamental goods that action is capable of realizing and, for Finnis, Lee and George, include “marriage, the conjuntio of man and woman” (Finnis 1996: 4). Homosexual conduct, masturbation, and all extra-marital sex aim strictly at “individual gratification” and can be no part of any “common good.” Such actions “harm the character” of those voluntarily choosing them (Lee and George, 1997: 135), and, in taking the actions, the individual becomes a slave to his passions, allowing his reason to be overridden by his raw desire for sensuous pleasure.

On Finnis’s account, when consensual sexual conduct is private, government may not outlaw it, but government “can rightly judge that it has a compelling interest in denying that ‘gay lifestyles’ are a valid and humanly acceptable choice and form of life” (1996: 17). And for Finnis, Lee and George, equal treatment of same-sex and heterosexual relations is out of the question due to the morally defective character of same-sex relations.

Macedo responds to Finnis by arguing that “all of the goods that can be shared by sterile heterosexual couples can also be shared by committed homosexual couples” (1996: 39). Macedo points out that Finnis does not condemn sexual intercourse by sterile heterosexual couples. But Finnis replies that there is a relevant difference between homosexual couples and sterile heterosexual ones: the latter but not the former are united “biologically” when they have intercourse. Lee and George make essentially the same point: only heterosexual couples can “truly become one body, one organism” (1997: 150). But Macedo points out that, biologically, it is not the man and woman who unite but the sperm and the egg (1996: 37). It can be added that the “biological unity” argument seems to run contrary to Finnis’s claim that his position “does not seek to infer normative conclusions from non-normative (natural-fact) premises” (1997: 16). More importantly, Macedo and Koppelman make the key point that the human good realized in intimate relations is a function of “mutual commitment and stable engagement” (Macedo, 1996: 40) and that same-sex couples can achieve “the precise kind of human good” that is available to heterosexual ones (Koppelman, 1997: 1649). Accordingly, equal treatment under the law for same-sex couples, including the recognition of same-sex marriage, would remove unjustifiable obstacles faced by same-sex couples to the achievement of that human good.

Corvino explains one of the central human goods provided by marriage in this way: marriage involves two individuals mutually and publicly committing to be the “Number One Person” for the other in sharing the benefits and alleviating the burdens that life brings (Corvino and Gallagher: 15). Sterile heterosexual couples and those unable to have sexual relations for physical reasons are rightly permitted to marry to secure that good, and Corvino argues that “once the state provides marriage as an option for different-sex partners, even if they cannot or choose not to have children; . . . [and] even if they are incapable of coitus, . . . but then denies [marriage] to same-sex couples, it is treating citizens unequally” (89–90).

Gallagher rejects Corvino’s view, contending that “[t]he critical public or ‘civil’ task of marriage is to regulate sexual relationships between men and women in order to reduce the likelihood that children . . . will face the burdens of fatherlessness, and increase the likelihood that there will be a next generation that will be raised by their mothers and fathers in one family, where both parents are committed to each other and to their children” (Corvino and Gallagher: 96). She argues that “gay marriage is a profound change to the meaning of the word ‘marriage’. . . . [b]ecause] it disconnects marriage from its grounding in the human reality that male-female sexual relationships are different from other kinds of relationships” (101).

However, Gallagher is not correct to claim that Corvino’s view rests on the premise that “a union of two men or two women is just the same as a union of husband and wife” (132). The question is whether the two sorts of union are relevantly similar with respect to values that marriage serves. Corvino claims that, with respect to at least one important value, viz., providing support for couples who want to undertake a mutual and public commitment to be each other’s “Number One Person,” there is no relevant difference. Gallagher weakens her own view when she writes that “gay marriage is wrong first and foremost not because of its consequences but because it is a lie” (178), specifically, the lie that same-sex couples “are like man and wife” (177). Rather, in light of her emphasis on how marriage protects children (109-115), she should argue that regulating sexual relations between men and women in the interest of children is the most important social purpose of marriage and that marriage equality threatens the capacity of marriage to serve that function; she should not deny that marriage has other, socially valuable functions.

Corvino affirms that marriage has an important child-protection function, while rejecting the idea that it is the sole function (192). His key disagreements with Gallagher are over the importance of those other functions and whether there is adequate reason to think that marriage equality threatens the child-protection function. Corvino argues that denying same-sex couples access to the human goods that marriage can provide to them is no small matter for those couples and that Gallagher vastly underestimates what such access means to them (198). Given how persistently and vigorously same-sex couples have fought for marriage equality, it is difficult to disagree with Corvino on the matter.

Citing studies suggesting that male same-sex couples have a relatively weak commitment to sexual fidelity and are relatively unconcerned about their partner having sex outside of the relationship, Gallagher argues that same-sex marriage would dilute the commitment to fidelity among heterosexual couples, thereby undermining an essential marital norm. And, with the fidelity norm seriously weakened, heterosexual marriages would become more unstable and the interests of children would be harmed.

In Corvino’s judgment, however, Gallagher’s argument rests on an ”implausible empirical claim about same-sex couples’ power to topple majority norms“ (195). Gay marriages would be only a tiny fraction of all marriages, and gay marriages between men who are indifferent to fidelity would be an even smaller fraction. One could add to Corvino’s criticism that, even if Gallagher’s claim is not implausible, it does seem to be little more than speculation, and it is problematic to deny a civil right on such speculative grounds to a portion of the adult population that has made it clear that, contra Gallagher, the right is very important to them. Gallagher might respond that the stakes for society are high, claiming that the well-being of future generations hang in the balance. But essentially the same claims have been made by defenders of traditional marriage about every liberalization of the law of marriage, from the dismantling of coverture (which had placed a married woman almost entirely under the legal power of her husband) to the present controversy over same-sex marriage.

Girgis, Anderson, and George argue that the defense of same-sex marriage rests on a faulty understanding of marriage, what they call “the revisionist view” (4). Such a view derives from the sexual revolution of the 1960’s and rejects the understanding that had prevailed in almost every society until then, “the conjugal view” (3).

On the conjugal view, marriage is a permanent commitment, “ordered to procreation and family life” (7) and constituting a “comprehensive union” of a man and a woman. The union joins spouses “in body as well as in mind” and is “sealed by sexual intercourse” (3). Such a union is “a basic human good, a distinctive way of thriving” (35). And “there is something special” about a marital couple’s sexual intercourse, because it constitutes the “highest kind of bodily unity” (26), a unity not available in any other relationship. In having intercourse, the marital partners “do not merely touch or interlock” but unite in a way that “has generative significance” and “physically embodies their specific, marital commitment” (36).

By contrast, the revisionist view regards marriage as essentially a matter of “emotional union and cohabitation” (8). Sex can enhance the emotional connections but is not essential to the marital union, and when the emotions cool, the partners might reasonably seek to end the union.

Girgis et al. claim that the revisionist view warps our grasp of what marriage is. They dismiss Corvino’s idea that marriage is a matter of having a “Number One Person,” arguing that it “cannot distinguish marriage from simple companionship” (15). Nor can the revisionist view explain why the state should be involved in regulating marriage or account for the central marital norms of permanence and sexual exclusivity.

Corvino can respond that his defense of marriage equality does not rest on the revisionist view, even though he does reject the conjugal view. Rather, Corvino is suggesting a way of understanding marriage that gives same-sex partners access to those substantial goods of marriage that are not tied to heterosexual intercourse. Security in a stable relationship that is publicly and legally ratified as lasting and exclusive is among those goods. The liberty to break off a relationship when emotions “cool” is no part of Corvino’s understanding of marriage. And although it is true that companionship and friendship can provide a “Number One Person,” they cannot do so with the same level of assurance that a legally ratified marriage can do so.

Girgis et al. might reject Corvino’s view on the ground that it rests on mere psychological considerations related to such matters as how secure people feel and how likely they are to end a relationship if it is sexually open, whereas their view rests on a priori principles concerning objective human goods. However, Corvino can respond that his understanding of marriage invokes human goods that are no less objective than Girgis’s “comprehensive union.” Additionally, Corvino might note that, even assuming that heterosexual intercourse unites male and female partners, his argument proceeds without recourse to such contestable claims as the quasi-metaphysical thesis that such intercourse between married partners is “the highest” form of bodily unity and that other sorts of sexual activity are a “mere” touching or interlocking of bodily parts.

Girgis et al. think that the conjugal account of marriage reflects its true nature, but this position appears to have been rejected by most democratic societies since the liberalization of marriage laws and norms that began with nineteenth-century criticisms of the law of coverture. Blackstone summarized the law as it had been through the 18th century: “By marriage, the husband and wife are one person in law: that is, the very being or legal existence of the woman is suspended during the marriage, or at least is incorporated and consolidated into that of the husband” (441). Over the course of a century and more, coverture was limited and eventually eliminated in favor of marriage equality between husband and wife, though traditionalists repeatedly argued that such changes violated the essence of marriage as “a union of person in husband and wife” (441). Subsequent changes in the social understanding of marriage were reflected in the rejection of the requirement of sexual intercourse for the consummation of marriage and in the spread of no-fault divorce laws. Given that such radical changes in the understanding of marriage have already taken place and been inscribed in law, it is unclear how law and society can now consistently or justly exclude same-sex couples from forming a marital bond.

7. Disability

During the 1970s and 80s, persons with disabilities increasingly argued that they were treated as second-class citizens by law and society. They organized into a civil rights movement that pressed for legislation that would help secure for them the status of equal citizens. Protection against discrimination based on disability was written into the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms and The Charter of Fundamental Rights of the European Union. The disability rights movement in the U.S. culminated with the passage of the Americans With Disabilities Act of 1990 (ADA). The ADA has served as a model for legislation in countries such as Australia, India and Israel

The disability rights movement began with the idea that discrimination on the basis of disability was not different in any morally important way from discrimination based on race. The aim of the movement was to enshrine in law the same kind of antidiscrimination principle that protected persons based on their race. But some theorists have questioned how well the analogy holds. They point out that applying the antidiscrimination norm to disability, for example, by installing ramps for access to buildings or offering special education programs, requires taking account of physical or mental differences among people. This seems to be treatment based on a person’s physical or mental features, apparently the exact opposite of the ideal of ”colorblindness“ behind the traditional antidiscrimination principle.

Even race-based affirmative action does not really seem to be parallel to antidiscrimination policies that take account of disability. Advocates of affirmative action assert that the social ideal is for persons not to be treated on the basis of their race or color at all. Race-conscious policies are seen as instruments that will move society toward that ideal (Wasserstrom, 2001).

In contrast, policies designed to counter discrimination based on disability are not sensibly understood as temporary measures or steps toward a goal in which people are not treated based on their disabilities. The policies permanently enshrine the idea that in designing buildings or buses or constructing some other aspect of our physical-social environment, we must be responsive to the disabilities people have in order for the disabled to have ”fair equality of opportunity“ (Rawls, 2001: 43–44). The need for a permanent ”accommodation“ of persons with disabilities seems to mark an important difference in how the antidiscrimination norm should be understood in the context of disability, as opposed to the context of race.

However, it is important to recognize that, at the level of fundamental principle, the reasons why disability-based discrimination is morally objectionable and even unjust are essentially the same as the reasons why racial discrimination is so. At the individual level, disadvantageous treatment of the disabled is often rooted in ill-will, disregard, and moral arbitrariness. At the systemic level, such treatment creates a social pattern of disadvantage that reduces the disabled to second-class status. In those two respects, the grounds of civil rights law are no different when it comes to the disabled.

Another way in which disability is thought to be fundamentally different from race concerns the special needs that the disabled often have that make life more costly for them. These extra costs would exist even if the socially-constructed physical environment were built to provide the disabled with fair equality of opportunity and their basic civil and political liberties were secured. In order to function effectively, disabled persons may need to buy medications or therapies or other forms of assistance that the able-bodied do not need for their functioning. And there does not seem to be any parallel in matters of race to the special needs of some of those who are disabled. The driving idea of the civil rights movement was that blacks did not have any special needs: all they needed was to have the burdens of racism lifted from them and, once that was accomplished, they would flourish or fail like everyone else in society.

However, Silvers (1998) argues that the parallel between race and disability still holds: all the disabled may claim from society as a matter of justice is that they have fair equality of opportunity and the same basic civil rights as everyone else. Any special needs that the disabled may have do not provide the grounds of any legitimate claims of justice. On the other hand, Kittay (2000) argues that the special needs of the disabled are a matter of basic justice. She focuses on the severely mentally disabled, for whom fair opportunity in the labor markets and political rights in the public sphere will have no significance, and on the families that have the responsibility of caring for the severely disabled. Pogge (2000) also questions Silvers’ view, suggesting that it is implausible to deny that justice requires that society provide resources for meeting the needs of the severely disabled. Still, it may be the case that some version of Silvers’ approach may be justifiable when it comes to disabled persons who have the capacity ”to participate fully in the political and civic institutions of the society and, more broadly, in its public life“ (Pogge, 2000: 45). In the case of such persons, the basic civil right to equal citizenship would require that they have the equal opportunity to participate in such institutions, regardless of their disability. Although there may be some aspects of the racial model that cannot be applied to persons with severe forms of mental disability, the principles behind the American civil rights struggles of the 1950s and 60s remain crucial normative resources for understanding and combating forms of unjust discrimination that have only more recently been addressed by philosophers and by society more broadly.

8. Legal Cases and Statutes

  • Allen v. State Board of Elections 89 S.Ct. 817 (1969).
  • Americans With Disabilities Act. 42 U.S.C. §§12101–12213 (1999).
  • Boy Scouts v. Dale 530 U.S. 640 (2000).
  • Civil Rights Act of 1866. 42 U.S.C §1981 (1999).
  • Civil Rights Act of 1964. 42 U.S.C. §§2000e et seq.
  • Ex Parte Crow Dog 109 U.S. 556 (1883).
  • Giles v. Harris 189 U.S. 475 (1903).
  • Indian Civil Rights Act of 1968. 28 U.S.C. §§1301–1303.
  • Obergefell v. Hodges 576 U.S. ___ (2015).
  • Oklahoma Tax Commission v. Citizen Band, Potawatomi Indian Tribe 498 U.S. 505 (1991).
  • Pregnancy Discrimination Act 42 U.S.C. §2000 (e)(k).
  • Santa Clara Pueblo v. Martinez 436 U.S. 49 (1978).
  • Shelby County v. Holder 570 U.S. ___ (2013).
  • South Carolina v. Katzenbach 383 U.S. 301 (1966).
  • State v Soto 734 A.2d 350.
  • Voting Rights Act 42 U.S.C. §§1973–1973aa-6.


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The editors would like to thank Jesse Gero for spotting several typographical errors and formatting errors of other kinds, and for taking the time to bring these to our attention.

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