## Weyl’s metric-independent construction of the symmetric linear connection

Weyl characterizes the notion of a symmetric linear connection as follows:

Definition A.1 (Affine Connection)
Let $$T(M_{p})$$ denote the tangent space of $$M$$ at $$p \in M$$. A point $$p \in M$$ is affinely connected with its immediate neighborhood, if and only if for every vector $$v_{p} \in T(M_{p})$$, a vector at $$q$$

$\tag{44} v^{\,i}_{q} \in T(M_{q}) = v^{\,i}_{p} + dv^{\,i}_{p}$

is determined to which the vector $$v_{p} \in T(M_{p})$$ gives rise under parallel displacement from $$p$$ to the infinitesimally neighboring point $$q$$.

Of the notion of parallel displacement, Weyl requires that it satisfy the following condition.

Definition A.2 (Parallel Displacement)
The transport of a vector $$v_{p} \in T(M_{p})$$ to an infinitesimally neighboring point $$q \in M$$ constitutes a parallel displacement if and only if there exists a coordinate system $$\overline{x}^{i}$$ (called a geodesic coordinate system) for the neighborhood of $$p \in M$$, relative to which the transported vector $$\overline{v}_{q}$$ possesses the same components as $$\overline{v}_{p}$$; that is,

$\tag{45} \overline{v}^i_q - \overline{v}^i_p = d\overline{v}^i_p = 0.$

The requirement that there exist a geodesic coordinate system such that (45) is satisfied, characterizes the essential nature of parallel transport.

It is natural to require that for an arbitrary coordinate system the components $$dv^{i}_{p}$$ in (44) vanish whenever $$v^{i}_{p}$$ or $$dx^{i}_{p}$$ vanish. Hence, the simplest assumption that can be made about the components $$dv^{i}_{p}$$ is that they are linearly dependent on the two vectors $$v^{i}_{p}$$ and $$dx^{i}_{p}$$. That is, $$dv^{i}_{p}$$ must be bilinear in $$v^{i}_{p}$$ and in $$dx^{i}_{p}$$; that is,

$\tag{46} dv^{\,i}_{p} = - \Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x)v^{\,j}_{p}dx^{k}_{p},$

where the $$n^{3}$$ coefficients $$\Gamma^{i}_{jk}$$(x) are coordinate functions, that is functions of $$x^{i}$$ $$(i = 1, \ldots ,n)$$, and the minus sign is introduced to agree with convention.

The $$v^{\,j}_{p}$$ and $$dx^{k}_{p}$$ in (46) are vectors, but $$dv^{\,i}_{p} = v^{\,i}_{q} - v^{\,i}_{p}$$ is not a vector since the vectors $$v^{\,i}_{q}$$ and $$v^{\,i}_{p}$$ lie in different tangent planes and cannot be subtracted. Hence the coefficients $$\Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x)$$ do not constitute a tensor; they conform to a linear but non-homogeneous transformation law. The vector

$v^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p} + dv^{\,i}_{p} = v^{\,i}_{p} - \Gamma^{i}_{jk}v^{\,j}_{p}dx^{k}_{p}$

is called the parallel displaced vector.

Weyl (1918b, 1923b) proves the following theorem.

Theorem A.3
If for every point $$p$$ in a neighborhood $$U$$ of $$M$$, there exists a geodesic coordinate system $$\overline{x}$$ such that the change in the components of a vector under parallel transport to an infinitesimally near point $$q$$ is given by

$\tag{47} d\overline{v}^{\,i}_p = 0,$

then locally in any other coordinate system $$x$$,

$\tag{48} dv^{\,i}_{p} = - \Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x)v^{\,j}_{p}dx^{k}_{p},$

where $$\Gamma^{i}_{jk}(x) = \Gamma^{i}_{kj}(x)$$, and conversely.

The idea of parallel displacement leads immediately to the idea of the covariant derivative of a vector field. Consider a vector field $$v^{i}(x)$$ evaluated at two nearby points $$p$$ and $$q$$ with arbitrary coordinates $$x^{i}$$ and $$x^{i} + \delta x^{i}$$ respectively. A first-order Taylor expansion yields

$\tag{49} u^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p}(x + \delta x) = v^{\,i}_{p}(x) + \frac{\partial v^{\,i}}{\partial x^{\,j}} \delta x^{\,j}_p .$

If we set

$\tag{50} \frac{\partial v^{\,i}}{\partial x^{\,j}} \delta x^{\,j}_p = \delta v^{\,i}_p(x),$

then

$\tag{51} \delta v^{\,i}_{p}(x) = v^{\,i}_{p}(x + \delta x) - v^{\,i}_{p}(x),$

and

$\tag{52} u^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p}.$

The array of derivatives

$\frac{\partial v^{\,i}}{\partial x^{\,j}}$

do not constitute a tensorial entity, because the derivatives are formed by the inadmissible procedure of subtracting the vector $$v^{\,i}_{p}(x)$$ at $$p$$ from the vector $$u^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p}(x + \delta x)$$ at $$q$$. Their difference $$\delta v^{\,i}_{p}(x)$$ is not a vector since the vectors lie in the different tangent spaces $$T(M_{p})$$ and $$T(M_{q})$$, respectively. Since $$\delta x^{\,i}_{p}$$ is a vector whereas $$\delta v^{\,i}_{p}$$ is not, the array of derivatives

$\frac{\partial v^{\,i}}{\partial x^{\,j}}$

in (50) cannot therefore be a tensorial entity. To form a derivative that is tensorial, that is covariant or invariant, we must subtract from the vector $$u^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p}$$ not the vector $$v^{\,i}_{p}$$, but another vector at $$q$$ which “represents” the original vector $$v^{\,i}_{p}$$ as “unchanged” as we proceed from $$p$$ to $$q$$. Such a representative vector at $$q$$ may be obtained by parallel transport of the vector $$v^{\,i}_{p}$$ to the nearby point $$q$$, and will be denoted, given an arbitrary coordinate system $$x$$, by

$\tag{53} v^{\,i}_{q} = v^{\,i}_{p} + dv^{\,i}_{p}\,.$

Since $$dv^{\,i}_{p}$$ is the difference between $$v^{\,i}_{p}$$ and $$v^{\,i}_{q}$$, $$dv^{\, i}_{p}$$ is also not a vector for the for the reasons given above; however, the difference

\begin{align} u_{q} - v_{q} &= v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p} - [v^{\,i}_{p} + dv^{\,i}_{p}] \\ \tag{54} &= \delta v^{\,i}_{p} - dv^{\,i}_{p} \end{align}

is a vector and is therefore a tensorial entity. Figure 16: Covariant differentiation

The covariant derivative can now be defined by the limiting process

\begin{align} \nabla_{k}v^{\,i}_{p} &= \lim_{\delta x^{k}_{p} \rightarrow 0} \frac{(v^{\,i}_{p} + \delta v^{\,i}_{p} - v^{\,i}_{p} - dv^{\,i}_{p})}{\delta x^{k}_{p}} \\ \tag{55} &= \lim_{\delta x^{k}_{p} \rightarrow 0} \frac{(\delta v^{\,i}_{p} - dv^{\,i}_{p})}{\delta x^{k}_{p}} \\ &= \frac{\partial v^{\,i}_p}{\partial x^k} + \Gamma^i_{jk} v^{\,j}_{p}. \end{align}

In general, one writes the covariant derivative of a vector field $$v^{i}$$ simply as

$\tag{56} \nabla_{k}v^{\,i} = \partial_{k}v^{\,i} + \Gamma^{i}_{jk}v^{\,j}.$

Weyl (1918b, §3.I.B) also provided a more synthetic argument to establish the symmetry of the affine connection. He considers two infinitesimal vectors $$\overline{PP}_{1}$$ and $$\overline{PP}_{2}$$ at a point $$P$$. The vector $$\overline{PP}_{1}$$ under parallel transport along $$\overline{PP}_{2}$$ goes into $$\overline{P_{2}P}_{21}$$. Similarly, the vector $$\overline{PP}_{2}$$ under parallel transport along $$\overline{PP}_{1}$$ goes into $$\overline{P_{1}P}_{12}$$. These relationships are illustrated in figure 17. Figure 17: Symmetry of Parallel Transport

The condition imposed on parallel transport is that the four vectors $$\overline{PP}_{1}$$, $$\overline{P_{1}P}_{12}$$, $$\overline{PP}_{2}$$ and $$\overline{P_{2}P}_{21}$$ form a closed parallelogram; that is, the points $$P_{12}$$ and $$P_{21}$$ coincide. It follows that

$\tag{57} \overline{PP}_{1} + \overline{P_{1}P}_{12} = \overline{PP}_{2} + \overline{P_{2}P}_{21}.$

Denote the coordinates of $$\overline{PP}_{1}$$ and $$\overline{PP}_{2}$$ by $$dx^{i}$$ and $$\delta x^{i}$$, respectively. The coordinates of $$\overline{P_{2}P}_{21}$$ and $$\overline{P_{1}P}_{12}$$ are respectively denoted by $$dx^{i} + \delta dx^{i}$$ and $$\delta x^{i} + d\delta x^{i}.$$ Substitution into (57) yields

$\tag{58} dx^{i} + \delta x^{i} + d\delta x^{i} = \delta x^{i} + dx^{i} + \delta dx^{i},$

or

$\tag{59} d\delta x^{i} = \delta dx^{i}.$

From the assumption that the vectors transform linearly, one has

$\tag{60} \begin{matrix} \delta dx^{i} = - \delta \gamma^{i}_{r}dx^{r} & \text{and} & d\delta x^{i} = - d\gamma^{i}_{r}\delta x^{r} \end{matrix}$

From the assumption that the infinitesimal transformation coefficients $$\delta \gamma^{i}_{r}$$ and $$d\gamma^{i}_{r}$$ are of the same order as the corresponding differentials $$\delta x^{i}$$ and $$dx^{i}$$, one obtains

$\tag{61} \begin{matrix} \delta \gamma^{i}_{r} = \Gamma^{i}_{rs}\delta x^{s} & \text{and} & d\gamma^{i}_{r} = \Gamma^{i}_{rs}dx^{s}. \end{matrix}$

Substitution of (60) and (61) into (59) yields

$\tag{62} \Gamma^{i}_{jk} = \Gamma^{i}_{kj}$
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