Notes to Teleological Arguments for God's Existence

1. What I am about to give here is a somewhat controversial construal of Paley. At some later points in Natural Theology, Paley's language sounds very comparative (see, e.g., Paley 1802 [1963], 37ff).

2. In this connection, see also Glass and Wolfe 1986 (17–19). See also McPherson 1965 (79), and Sober 1993 (34–5).

3. Along that same line, Paley says:

How is it possible, under circumstances of such close affinity, and under the operation of equal evidence, to exclude contrivance from the one, yet to acknowledge the proof of contrivance having been employed, as the plainest and clearest of all propositions, in the other? [p. 15]

4. As Elliott Sober notes, if the argument is not analogical, then “Hume's criticisms entirely lose their bite.” (Sober 1993, 33).

5. In fact, apparent design is sometimes so exquisite that it has generated what has become known among biologists as Orgel's Second Law: “Evolution is cleverer than you are.”

6. “[In early 19th century Germany] a very coherent body of theory based on a teleological approach was worked out, and it did provide a constant fertile source for the advance of biological science on a number of different research fronts” (Lenoir 1982, 2). John Hedley Brooke and others advance similar contentions.

7. One key subtype involves establishing the co-presence of two (groups of) variables within a significant set of known phenomena, then again under certain constraints, taking that co-presence as indicative of a more general connection between the two variables which can then be used in previously unchecked cases to infer the likely presence of the second variable from the established presence of the first.

8. An exception would be views associated with process theology, which locates God in a sense within nature, but I shall not pursue such views here.

9. See Ratzsch 2001, e.g., Chapter 8.

10. In fact, John Foster claims that: “The only primitive rational form of empirical inference is inference to the best explanation.” [my emphasis] (Foster 1982–3, 89). In a later piece, the same line appears but with the addition of “(non-deductive)” after “empirical” (Foster 1985, 227)

11. This is a standard position among Intelligent Design advocates - Meyer (1998) is a good example.

12. The terminology, which is standard, is unfortunate, seeming intuitively backwards.

13. There are much deeper waters here which I will not enter. See e.g., (Fitelson, 2007)

14. For further discussion see Ratzsch 2003 (124-144).

15. We should note that while chance variation and random mutation entail that the events at issue were unplanned, appeals to chance do not mean that such events are unexplained. There typically is at least a partial explanation of random events in science, but at a deeper level of explanation. The random behavior of ping-pong balls used in a lottery machine is explained in part by the nature of elastic collisions and the geometry of the balls. Similarly, random mutations have biochemical explanations which include environmental influences (e.g., radiation) and copy errors in cell production.

16. Some of the directions explored here were initially suggested to Ratzsch by David van Baak (personal communication). For more on the distinction between explaining and explaining away, see Rott 2010 (67-68) and Glass 2012.

17. A raft of qualifications is required here of course, concerning various specific situated conditions fo rationality or irrationality. For present purposes, those can be set aside.

18. One nice description of this move as resulting from science itself comes from Whewell:

We have shown, we trust, that the notion of design and end is transferred by the researches of science, not from the domain of our knowledge to that of our ignorance, but merely from the region of facts to that of laws. (Whewell 1834, 349)

19. Here is Boyle:

[I]t much more tends to the illustration of God's wisdom, to have framed things first, that there can seldom or never need any extraordinary interposition of his power. … [I]t more sets off the wisdom of God in the fabric of the universe, that he can make so vast a machine perform all those many things, which he designed it should, by the mere contrivance of brute matter managed by certain laws of local motion and upheld by his ordering and general concourse, that if he employed from time to time an intelligent overseer … to regulate, and control the motions of the parts. (Boyle 1685–6, 150–1)

Whewell says:

But with regard to the material world, we can at least go so far as this—we can perceive that events are brought about not by insulated interpositions of Divine power, exerted in each particular case, but by the establishment of general laws. (Whewell 1834, 356)

Gaps began coming more to prominence in around the 1840s.

20. The quote in question is that from Whewell 1834 (356) cited above in note 32.

21. Darwin in his B notebook, written in the late 1830s, says:

Astronomers might formerly have said that God ordered each planet to move in its particular destiny. In same manner God orders each animal created with certain form in certain country, but how much more simple and sublime power let attraction act according to certain laws such as inevitable consequen [sic] let animal be created, then by the fixed laws of generation, such will be their successors. (Darwin 1987, 195, para 101].

And in an 1860 (post Origin) letter to Asa Gray, Darwin says:

… I cannot anyhow be contented to view this wonderful universe, and especially the nature of man, and to conclude that everything is the result of brute force. I am inclined to look at everything as resulting from designed laws, with the details, whether good or bad, left to the working out of what we may call chance. (Darwin 1902 [1995], 236)

22. This is similar to what some Intelligent Design (ID) advocates refer to as “frontloading.” The basic idea can even be found in Augustine, and is given explicit statement by theologians such as Jonathan Edwards who saw provision even for subsequent miracles as incorporated into the initial conditions:

[It requires] great wisdom [to] dispose every atom at first, as that they should go for the best throughout eternity; and in the adjusting by an exact computation, and a nice allowance to be made for the miracles that should be needful” (Edwards 1980, 49).

23. As C.D. Broad notes in this connection (Broad 1925, 86):

[S]o long as we take a material system as a going concern and do not raise questions about its origin, there is no reason whatever why its characteristic behavior should not be at once teleological and capable of complete mechanistic explanation.

24. See Ratzsch 2001 and 2005. For instance, even were it true that ID efforts were religiously motivated (and that is not true in all cases) that would imply little about the propriety of ID theories themselves.

25. See Ratzsch 2003, for more detailed discussion of Reid.

26. Cleanthes:

Consider, anatomize the eye; survey its structure and contrivance, and tell me, from your own feeling, if the idea of a contriver does not immediately flow in upon you with a force like that of sensation. (Hume 1779 [1998], 25).

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Del Ratzsch
Jeffrey Koperski <>

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