Public Health Ethics

First published Mon Apr 12, 2010; substantive revision Thu Feb 19, 2015

At its core, public health is concerned with promoting and protecting the health of populations,[1] broadly understood. Collective interventions in service of population health often involve or require government action. In the United States, for example, the Centers for Disease Control and Prevention, the Food and Drug Administration, the Environmental Protection Agency and the Consumer Protection Agency are in part or in whole public health agencies. All nations and most states or provinces and municipalities have health departments whose functions include everything from the inspection of commercial food service to the collection and use of epidemiological data for population surveillance of disease. Collective action to promote and protect population health also occurs at the global level, as exemplified by the activities of the World Health Organization. Public health ethics deals primarily with the moral foundations and justifications for public health, the various ethical challenges raised by limited resources for promoting health, and real or perceived tensions between collective benefits and individual liberty.

One view of public health ethics regards the moral foundation of public health as an injunction to maximize welfare, and therefore health as a component of welfare (Powers & Faden 2006). This view frames the core moral challenge of public health as balancing individual liberties with the advancement of good health outcomes. Consider, for example, how liberties are treated in government policies that fluoridate municipal drinking water or compel people with active, infectious tuberculosis to be treated.

An alternative view of public health ethics characterizes the moral foundation of public health as social justice. While balancing individuals' liberties with promoting social goods is one area of concern, it is embedded within a broader commitment to secure a sufficient level of health for all and to narrow unjust inequalities (Powers & Faden, 2006).[2] , [3] Thus, another important area of concern is the balancing of this commitment with the injunction to maximize good aggregate or collective health outcomes. Understood this way, public health ethics has deep moral connections to broader questions of social justice, poverty, and systematic disadvantage.

Against the backdrop of these two normative approaches, this paper proceeds as follows: Section 1 lays out some of the distinctive challenges of public health ethics. Section 2 discusses different justifications for public health interventions, including the role of paternalism and how it bears on the permissibility of public health interventions. Also discussed in Section 2 are broader questions of democratic legitimacy. Section 3 focuses on questions of justice and fairness in public health ethics. Finally, Section 4 discusses global justice as it intersects with public health. Overall, this entry strives to provide a general lay of the land of the central issues that drive public health ethics, with a particular focus on questions of justice and fairness.[4]

1. Distinctive Challenges of Public Health Ethics

There is no standard way of organizing the ethics of clinical practice, public health and biomedical science. These distinctive fields are often presented as focal areas that fall under the broader, umbrella term of bioethics, but sometimes bioethics is presented as the equivalent of medical ethics or in contrast to public health and population-level bioethics. Whichever approach is preferred, a key question remains: what distinguishes public health ethics from the ethics of clinical practice or the ethics of biomedical science? The answer lies in the distinctive nature of public health. Public health has four characteristics that provide much of the subject matter for public health ethics: (1) it is a public or collective good; (2) its promotion involves a particular focus on prevention; (3) its promotion often entails government action; and (4) it involves an intrinsic outcome-orientation.

First, in public health the object of concern is populations, not individuals. Public health is, by its very nature, a public, communal good, where the benefits to one person cannot readily be individuated from those to another, though its burdens and benefits often appear to fall unevenly on different sub-groups of the population. This raises a particular set of justificatory challenges public health ethics has to address: who is public health good for? Whose health are we concerned with, and what sacrifices is it acceptable to ask of individuals in order to achieve it? Is there a difference between public health and population health? And why is public health a good worth promoting? Any answer to these questions has to take account of the fact that public health measures are often based on prospective benefits, not immediately securable benefits.[5]

Second, promoting public health involves a high degree of commitment to the prevention of disease and injury. However, although much of the discussion surrounding public health focuses primarily on this preventive aspect, public health agencies and services also involve diagnosing and treating illnesses, with all the attendant clinical services that those activities require. Indeed, increasingly national health systems are understood to include both preventive functions and the delivery of personal medical services. Often, these functions and services are integrated under a common political or administrative structure. Depending on the specific context in which population health is to be improved, separating public health services and functions from personal medical care services and functions may or may not make sense. That said, policies and programs whose aim is to prevent illness and injury are paradigmatically the territory of public health. Certainly, no other social institution is generally recognized as so clearly having this remit.

Public health's commitment to prevention carries with it particular moral challenges. Eliminating or mitigating a harm that already exists is sometimes viewed as being of greater moral importance - or simply as more immediately motivating action - than long-term strategies to prevent a harm from materializing. Although in recent years there is arguably more emphasis on prevention in health policy, preventive public health interventions continue to receive less funding and public support than medical treatments. For example, despite the increasing focus on wellness in public policy and the workplace,[6] both policy makers and the public still tend to place a higher priority on ensuring that heart patients have access to surgery and medications than on programs to prevent heart disease through diet and exercise. Another factor that can result in prioritizing cures over prevention is that although the costs and burdens of preventive interventions occur largely in the present, the benefits of successful preventive interventions often occur in the future, and usually only to some members of the population whose identities cannot be predicted in advance and whose numbers can only be estimated probabilistically.[7] Thus, prevention policies and programs raise questions about how we should think about statistical and unidentified lives and persons, and whether health gains in the future should be treated as worth less than health gains in the present. In some cases, the beneficiaries of preventive interventions are members of future generations, complicating the moral picture even further.

Third, as noted previously, achieving good public health results frequently requires government action: many public health measures are coercive or are otherwise backed by the force of law. Public health is focused on regulation and public policy, and relies less often on individual actions and services. In this as in all other areas of official state action, we therefore have to address tensions among justice, security, and the scope of legal restrictions and regulations. This adds to the peculiarity of the justificatory questions surrounding public health: the exercise of public authority and the imposition of public sanctions and penalties in an area as deeply personal as an individual's health choices require strong justification. The same questions of trade-off between personal freedom and collective action that arise in the political arena generally thus also arise for public health. It is in this context that concerns about paternalism typically emerge.

Fourth, public health has a definite consequentialist orientation. Promoting public health means seeking to avoid bad health outcomes and advance good ones. As noted at the outset, in some discussions of public health ethics, this outcome-orientation is viewed as the moral justification and foundation of public health and, as with all consequentialist schemes, is presented as needing to be constrained by attention to deontological concerns such as rights, and by attention to justice-related concerns such as the fair distribution of burdens (Childress et al. 2002; Kass 2001). While public health ethics has to engage with the traditional problems raised by its consequentialist commitments, for those who view social justice as the moral foundation of public health, considerations of justice provide the frame within which the moral implications of public health's consequentialist orientation are addressed.

These four distinctive features provide public health ethics with its basic structure and orientation. Under the first rubric, important questions arise with regard to the scope of public health: who is the “public?” The usual assumption is that the public is a discrete unit that corresponds with state boundaries: a single country's population. But in a global world, that assumption is not always plausible for various reasons. Communicable diseases have a way of ignoring national boundaries, and preventive measures in one country may be futile if other countries do not follow suit.[8] Moreover, the statist focus is not always readily justifiable: insofar as diseases cross borders, should public health interventions do the same? Further questions about justice and equity across borders also arise: do wealthier countries and wealthier individuals have obligations to attend to the public health of less fortunate others? These questions will be discussed further in section IV, below.

Depending on the particular health challenge we are concerned with, the public in question can be more local or more global than a single country's population. National boundaries are relevant because policies and regulations are usually set by individual countries, and vary from country to country. They are also relevant for reasons having to do with government control: countries report their data about communicable disease outbreaks, burden of disease, and other health indicators to global institutions such as the World Health Organization (WHO) on a voluntary basis. Although International Health Regulations to which 196 countries (WHO 2014) are signatories provide an international structure for global public health, as with much international law and regulation, enforcement mechanisms are weak. It is not clear what the moral implications of these practical limitations should be for public health. The structure of the problem is similar to environmental challenges such as air pollution and global warming: determinants of ill health are not restricted by national boundaries, and we are all ultimately connected to each other's health status, at least in some ways. But more importantly, citizens in the developed world are arguably causally connected to some health deprivations in the developing world, for example by upholding restrictions on the production and distribution of generics that hinder the containment of easily treatable diseases in poor countries (Pogge 2002; Grover, Citro, Mankad & Lander 2012). This gives public health, and therefore public health ethics, a special and very interesting location vis-à-vis discussions of global justice, our duties to the distant poor, and the need for global cooperation to address common problems (Holland 2007).

Another issue that comes up in this connection is the following: are “public” and “population” interchangeable terms to designate the entity whose health we are concerned with? Is there a significant conceptual difference, a difference in moral valence, or a difference in attitude and orientation between public health ethics on the one hand, and population-level health ethics on the other? The literature presents three general ways of denoting the object of public health: community, the public, and populations. In one sense, the most morally laden manner of designating those who are subject to, and benefit from, public health measures, is to think about them as a community (Beauchamp & Steinbock 1999). Reference to “community” implies a cohesive group, usually with a shared language, culture, history, and geographical location. Characterizing the concern of public health as being the health of the community renders more natural (and possibly more plausible) appeal to the common good as a way of justifying public health interventions. Reference to “the public” shares some of those same features but tends to be less morally laden. This is in part because “the public” is somewhat more anonymous than “the community” and does not necessarily signal a tight cultural connection. Rather, it connotes a relatively discrete unit with some common institutions and usually a shared political life. Thus, references to the public as well as to the community may encourage the perception that the good we are seeking to advance is that of a geographically bounded unit, with community connoting stronger cultural associations, and public connoting some kind of official political unit such as a state or a country.

Characterizing the health we are trying to advance as that of populations, by contrast, may minimize the implication that special shared features or characteristics are needed in order for a group of individuals to constitute a collective unit whose health can be of concern. Because of that, it may lend itself more readily to an internationalist, less inward-looking orientation: any population, regardless of nationality or geographic location, has health interests that ought to be attended to and advanced (Wikler & Brock 2007). Populations can be more local or more global than a community or the public. This way of speaking also may dilute the emphasis on national borders as a way of delineating the scope of concern and provides more flexibility in the object of concern for public health. In much the same way, discussion of global health, as opposed to international health, is seen as helpful in emphasizing a focus on the health needs of all, as opposed to a focus on international cooperation and the health needs of peoples in countries other than one's own.

This is not, of course, to say that those who prefer the term “public health” to “population health” do not share a global orientation. Indeed, the World Health Organization is generally referred to as a global public health institution, and those who work to promote health transnationally are referred to as public health and not population health professionals. Indeed, although some see a substantive conceptual divergence in ways of thinking about whose health is to be protected and promoted, others see no conflict, at least between the concepts of public health and population health. For example, the Nuffield Council on Bioethics uses the term “population health” to refer to the collective state of health of members of a population and the term “public health” to refer to efforts made to improve the political, regulatory and economic environments that affect prospects for health. So understood, the object of public health is the improvement of population health (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007, p. XV).

Another conceptual challenge central to public health ethics is how to think about public health or population health as a public good. Is the health of the public or of a population a good in its own right, or can it meaningfully be understood only as an aggregation of the welfare interests secured for each individual that comprises the population? Is public health a good that nations and global institutions can rightly seek with the same justificatory structures and limitations with which they seek national security and world peace, or is it somehow a more limited or different kind of political construct?

Common to the second, third and fourth features of public health is the question of how broadly or narrowly to understand what public health entails (Powers & Faden 2006). Given a widening understanding of health and the factors affecting prospects for population health, public health can be viewed as being so expansive as to have no meaningful institutional, disciplinary or social boundaries. Everything from crime, war and natural disasters; to population genetics, environmental hazards, marketing and other corporate practices; to political oppression, income inequality and individual behavior has been claimed under the rubric of public health. Part of what makes each of these diverse things of concern is their impact on health, and in that sense they are all public health problems. A central role of public health, grounded in social justice, is to bring attention to all aspects of the social or natural world that exert a significant impact on the preservation or promotion of health, and not only those that can be effected through traditional public health measures or means.

At the same time, however, health is only one dimension of human well-being. Calling attention to the devastating impact on the health of women of Taliban rule is important, but it should not be confused with reducing the injustices of the oppression of women to its health effects. The assault of such oppression on personal security, self-determination and respect is of independent moral concern. Similarly, while reducing violence is critical to population health, that does not mean that law enforcement, the criminal justice system, diplomacy and international relations should be considered tools of public health. Whether and under what conditions it is advantageous to frame or re-frame a social problem in public health terms is morally complex. For example, taking a public health rather than criminal justice orientation to gun violence or drug abuse can sometimes contribute to defusing tensions, decreasing negative impacts on racial or other minority groups, and leading to better overall outcomes (Dorfman & Wallack 2009).

Because so many of the determinants of the different dimensions of well-being overlap and reinforce one another, it is not surprising that different social institutions and professional communities share common concerns and priorities, nor should it be expected that public policies rest on only one moral consideration like health or security.

The flip side of this observation is that public health has an obligation to evaluate the impact of its policies and practices on human well-being broadly and not only on health. Guaranteed access to basic health services can improve health, but just as importantly, it can provide people with a sense of social worth and eliminate the insecurity of being unable to provide for loved ones in times of crisis. Similarly, screening programs for sexually transmitted infections may improve health but, depending on features of the programs and the contexts in which they are implemented, they may result in social disrespect, decreased personal security and constraints on personal behavior.

The overlapping of effects and justifications is particularly clear in prevention. Immunization, water fluoridation, anti-smoking campaigns and motorcycle helmet laws are all paradigmatic preventive public health interventions. At the same time, however, interventions generally outside the purview of public health institutions and professionals such as early childhood education, income supports, literacy initiatives for girls and safe housing programs all can be effective in preventing illness and injury. In some cases, such interventions may be more effective and efficient in achieving health gains than paradigmatic public health programs. Morally responsible public health policy requires attentiveness to the multiple determinants of health. This requirement does not signal that public health has no boundaries. Rather, public health has a unique relationship of stewardship to one dimension of well-being, health, and to the particular determinants that have a special strategic significance for health. Some of those determinants are the classic focus of public health such as infectious disease control and the securing of safe food, water, and essential medications. However, exercising that stewardship requires responsiveness to the best available evidence about all the determinants, across the landscape of an interconnected social structure, that have a special strategic relation to health, including those outside the conventional remits of public health agencies and authorities. Policies governing education, foreign assistance, agriculture, and the environment can all have significant impact on health, just as health policies can have impact on international relations and national and global economies. Providing public health arguments in defense of particular environmental or educational policies, and recognizing that such policies can have profound effects on health, simply recognizes the complex interweaving of the multiple dimensions of human welfare.

One worry raised by this interconnectedness across spheres of social life and policy is that classifying something as a public health matter could be an effective way of taking it out of the realm of legitimate discussion. If the goal of protecting health is seen as clearly good, government actions aimed at securing health may be less scrutinized than actions aimed at more controversial ends, leaving public health officials with too much power and too little democratic accountability. As a practical matter, however, these concerns may not be realistic. Although data on this point are hard to come by, it is likely that the reverse is true: public health agencies and workers are more likely to have insufficient political power, authority and resources at their disposal to achieve important and pressing goals than to wield too much. It is not usually individuals' civil rights to which public health interventions stand in opposition, but rather private, corporate economic interests such as the tobacco industry, the meat and dairy industry, and so on. Nonetheless, it is worth raising these worries at least to keep them in view as a possible issue for public health ethics to address.

Even if the worry that expanding the classification of something as a public health matter in some way threatens civil liberties is nothing more than fear-mongering, the breadth of what falls under public health may raise concerns about democratic legitimacy. Insofar as health authorities have a public mandate to advance health, is it therefore appropriate for them to hue to strict guidelines as to what they can undertake in the name of public health based, at least in part, on the expressed or revealed preferences or values of those within their reach? Under what conditions are measures such as public health surveillance and the banning of certain food materials properly considered to be overreaching by public health authorities, and therefore to constitute a lack of adherence to their democratically-given mandate? Public health ethics has to give serious consideration to the question: how exactly should the mandate of public health authorities be specified such that they do not run afoul of the requirements of legitimacy in a democratic political system?

Particularly when government institutions are charged with promoting population health, a task of public health ethics is determining self-imposed limitations and restrictions on what can reasonably come under the auspices of public health authorities, for reasons having to do with concerns about individual liberty, about privacy and paternalism, about democratic process, and about the place of health in relation to other aspects of human well-being. Thus, public health ethics also has to engage more traditional philosophical questions about the scope of privacy, the reach of public policy, and the limits and legitimacy of government intervention for the public good. These issues are addressed next, in Section 2. Moreover, scarcity and priority setting always loom large in the context of public health, giving rise to a number of equity, justice, and fairness concerns. As already noted, these issues are especially acute with regard to global health. Justice and priority setting issues will be addressed in greater detail in Section 3.

2. Justifying Public Health Programs and Policies

Public health draws its foundational legitimacy from the essential and direct role that health plays in human flourishing, whether that role is understood ultimately in terms of maximizing health or of promoting health in order to advance social justice. This general justification is sometimes too broad, however, to provide sufficient moral warrant for specific public health policies and institutions, especially when, as is so often the case, these policies and institutions are implemented by the state and affect the liberty or privacy of corporate or individual persons. This section puts forward five justifications for public health interventions.

Two observations are worth making at the outset. First, public health policies are rarely defended by only one reason. Usually a mixed set of justifications can plausibly be provided. For example, tax policies intended to decrease cigarette consumption can be defended both by appeal to paternalism and by appeal to reducing the harms of second hand smoke to children in the home and in automobiles. Second, the impact of public health policies is often not uniform across all the individuals affected by the policy, and thus different justifications are sometimes put forward specific to these different people. This complexity is unavoidable, since it results from the nature of public health: the focus of public health is population health, but populations are rarely internally uniform with regard to all features that are morally relevant to any particular policy. Some people may stand to benefit from the policy while others may not. Moreover, in line with concerns about democratic legitimacy and state over-reaching, some members of the population may support the policy while others may object. Consider, for example, a New York City policy prohibiting restaurants from serving sugar-sweetened beverages over 16 ounces that was eventually struck down by the courts. Public opinion polling suggests that while more New Yorkers opposed the policy than supported it, the level of opposition varied from one borough of the city to another (Grynbaum & Connelly 8/21/2012; New York Times 8/21/2012).

The first three justifications for public health policies - overall benefit, collective action and efficiency, and fairness - speak specifically to the context in which some members of the affected population do not directly benefit from the policy or object to it. The next two justifications appeal to the significance of harm, both to others and to oneself. They apply more specifically to traditional concerns about balancing respect for liberty with advancing health and are more prevalent in the public health ethics literature than the previous three. In the fourth justification, the argument is from a relatively uncontroversial Millian harm principle, and in the fifth justification, from somewhat more tendentious paternalistic principles.

Depending on the specifics of the public health policy, any number of these justifications may be applicable, and they are generally used to best effect in combination. Section 2 closes with a look at the limits of frameworks that focus disproportionately on liberty considerations of the sort addressed in 2.4 and 2.5 and on the importance of considering the range of possible moral justifications in analyzing public health policies.

2.1 Overall Benefit

Ultimately, we all benefit from having public health interventions, and from having trusted regulatory agencies such as the Centers for Disease Control and Prevention (CDC) or the Food and Drug Administration (FDA) make decisions about such interventions and their reach. All things considered, having public health regulation is better than not having it. Public health decisions made on the basis of overall statistics and demographic trends are ultimately better for each one of us, even if particular interventions may not directly benefit some of us. Thus, the task of public health ethics is not necessarily to justify each particular intervention directly. Rather, public health interventions in general, as long as they stay within certain pre-established parameters, can be justified in the same way a market economy, the institution of private property, or other similarly broad and useful conventions that involve some coercive action but also enable individuals to access greater benefits can be justified: when properly regulated and managed, their existence is by and large better than their absence for everyone. So structured, the justification for particular public health interventions, requirements, or restrictions is derivative of or parasitic on a higher level justification.[9] This argumentative strategy has a lot of appeal, particularly as a way of justifying the existence of regulatory government agencies such as the FDA or CDC. However, it is ultimately insufficient on its own and needs to be supplemented by other kinds of ethical arguments, since it does not provide the basis for the parameters themselves, or for ethical oversight or scrutiny with regards to the particular decisions such agencies take.[10]

2.2 Collective Action and Efficiency

A related justification views health as a public good the pursuit of which is not possible without ground rules for coordinated action and near-universal participation. Thus, public health is viewed as having the structure of a coordination or collective efficiency problem. If one person (or at least, a sufficient number of such persons) decides to go when the traffic light is red and stop when the traffic light is green, it does not matter that everyone else is following the rules: this person will disrupt the smooth functioning of the system, with potentially dangerous results. Similarly, if one person (or a sufficient critical mass of such persons) decides not to abide by a public health regulation because the regulation does not directly benefit her or she otherwise objects, the ramifications will likely be felt by others in her environment and beyond.[11] Everybody has to participate because, failing their involvement, neither they nor anyone else can reap the benefit of a healthy society.

In many public health contexts, the only feasible or acceptably efficient way to implement a policy affects the entire population, leaving no or only very burdensome options open to individual non-cooperation. Perhaps the most celebrated such example is water fluoridation, but all safety regulations affecting food and drug supply and consumer products share this character, as do many environmental and occupational health standards. Here collective efficiency considerations loom large. Although we want healthy environments and products, individuals are simply not positioned to make independent decisions about the impact on health and safety of their environment and of the hundreds of thousands of products available in the modern market place. Ceding this function to government institutions staffed with health experts is prudent and essential to general welfare and social justice in the same respect as ceding protection of our interests in personal physical security to government institutions staffed with law enforcement and national defense experts is prudent and essential to general welfare (Mill 1869).

Collective efficiency arguments rely on claims about the sheer number and technical complexity of the decisions that need to be made to protect health in the environment and in the market place, as well as the indivisible character of responses to some health threats. These arguments are buttressed by claims about the cognitive limitations and bounded rationality of individual human decision makers, and by the disproportionate political power of corporate interests and the practices they use to manipulate and exploit our cognitive weaknesses against our health interests (Ubel 2009).

2.3 Fairness in the Distribution of Burdens

Yet another appeal that can be used to defend certain public health interventions that impose unequal burdens on different members of a population relies on considerations of fairness. The basic premise of this line of argument would be that burdens should be roughly equivalent for everyone. This justifies taxing different income brackets at different rates. The same could be said for certain public health “burdens,” understood as both the burdens of disease and disability and the burdens of public health interventions. Based on considerations such as a particular group's likelihood to contract a certain disease, and their overall health status, other parts of the population can legitimately be asked to “contribute,” as it were, in order to make the distribution of disease burdens more equitable. For example, part of the rationale for requiring child immunization prior to enrollment in school is that this is a way to ensure that low-income children, who are generally less healthy than other children, have access to the needed vaccines (Orenstein & Hinman 1999; Feudtner & Marcuse 2001). Perhaps a more pertinent example is Japan's seasonal influenza immunization policy, between 1962 and 1994 where children were immunized against influenza explicitly in order to protect the elderly, for whom contracting seasonal flu is more likely to be fatal, and immunization more likely to be burdensome (Reichert et al. 2001; Sugaya 2014). Yet another example of public health interventions that appear to be guided by this justification is rubella vaccination of children for the sake of pregnant women and their fetuses (Miller et al. 1997; ACIP 2010 in Other Internet Resources). This reasoning can help explain why individuals are sometimes asked to bear public health burdens that do not directly benefit them. However, as with the tax case, the question of how far we can go in redistributing health-related burdens will likely continue to plague any proponent of this justificatory strategy. Moreover, questions about the plausibility of viewing health-related burdens as subject to distribution in this manner may also arise.

2.4 The Harm Principle

Likely no classic philosophical work is cited more often in the public health ethics literature than John Stuart Mill's essay “On Liberty” (Mill 1869). In that essay, Mill defends what has come to be called the harm principle, which has been interpreted as holding that the only justification for interfering with the liberty of an individual, against her will, is to prevent harm to others. The harm principle is relied upon to justify various infectious disease control interventions including quarantine, isolation, and compulsory treatment. In liberal democracies, the harm principle is often viewed as the most compelling justification for public health policies that interfere with individual liberty. For example, a prominent view in the United States is that it was not until the public became persuaded of the harmful effects of “second hand smoke” that the first significant intrusion into smoking practices—the banning of smoking in public places—became politically possible. Perhaps because of the principle's broad persuasiveness, it is not uncommon to see appeals made about harm to others in less than obvious contexts. Defenders of compulsory motorcycle helmet laws, for example, argued that the serious head injuries sustained by unprotected cyclists diverted emergency room personnel and resources, thus harming other patients (Jones & Bayer 2007). The harm principle has been interpreted to include credible threat of significant economic harm to others as well as physical harm. Returning again to smoking policy, various restrictions on the behavior of smokers have been justified by appeal to the financial burden on the health care system of caring for smoking-related illnesses.[12]

As with all such principles, questions remain about its specification. How significant must the threat of harm be, with regard to both its likelihood and magnitude?[13] Are physical harms to the health of others to be weighted more than economic harms or other setbacks to interests? Whether interpreted narrowly or broadly, there are limits to the public health cases that can plausibly be addressed by the harm principle. Moreover, in the context of commitments to social justice and general welfare, and the other justifications described above, too exclusive a focus on the harm principle can undermine otherwise justifiable government mandates and regulation. It is undeniable that individuals have much broader and more multi-dimensional interests than narrowly self-directed physical ones, and in that sense, it is not unreasonable to have a fairly expansive understanding of “harm” in a public health context. However, adherence to the—admittedly somewhat artificial—heuristic of construing individuals' interests as exclusively their self-regarding ones for purposes of determining what sacrifices they may be asked to make is an important way of ensuring checks on potential abuses.

Because the impact of J.S. Mill on public health ethics cannot be overstated, it is important to recognize that Mill does not hold that in the formulation of public policies all liberty interests enjoy an equal presumption in their favor. Mill draws a distinction between interests that are so important that they are immune from state interference, interests that enjoy a presumption in favor of liberty, and interests that enjoy no such presumption. It is presumably the second kind of liberty interest where the harm principle figures prominently (Powers, Faden and Saghai 2012). Moreover, what many understand to be core to Mill's view, that individuals are generally best positioned to know what is in their own best interests, is increasingly being challenged (Conly 2014; Sunstein 2013).

2.5 Paternalism

Not surprisingly, paternalism—understood classically as interfering with the liberty of action of a person, against her will, to protect or promote her welfare—is as controversial in public health policy as the harm principle is uncontroversial (Dworkin 2005; Feinberg 1986). Few public health interventions are justified exclusively or even primarily on unmediated, classic paternalistic grounds, although many more public health programs may have paternalistic effects. By contrast, other classes of arguments that are sometimes described as paternalistic, including soft paternalism, weak paternalism, and libertarian paternalism, are evoked more frequently.

Soft and weak paternalism are usually interpreted as interchangeable, though they have sometimes been taken to denote different concepts (Dworkin 2005). A common interpretation defines this kind of paternalism as interferences with choices that are compromised with regard to voluntariness or autonomy. Though a person might voice or hold a preference different from the one that is sought for her, her preference is not entitled to robust respect if it is formed under conditions that significantly compromise its autonomy or voluntariness, such as cognitive disability or immaturity and, in very limited cases, ignorance or false beliefs.[14] Adaptive preferences are also considered compromised with regards to autonomy: sometimes, individuals modify their preferences in order to be able to adapt to difficult, unjust, or undesirable circumstances.[15] Such preferences also do not have the same standing as preferences formed under just or normal background conditions and are therefore viewed as subject to interference.

It is important to note that in all these cases, justified interference would be based on a finding of significant compromise of autonomy or rationality in the formation or continued holding of particular preferences. This should not be confused with interference based on the content of the preferences. Only the former would be justifiable under soft or weak paternalism, whereas the latter would constitute true or strong paternalism. As always, the demarcations are not as clear in practice as they are in theory - the content of preferences is often precisely what is appealed to in illustrating that a particular preference is compromised - but by and large, what distinguishes soft paternalism from strong paternalism is the requirement that the decision or preference be fundamentally compromised, and not simply that it be mistaken or ignorant. This principled distinction remains important not least because it reflects a difference in approach or attitude: in the case of strong paternalism, the interference is based on the content of a preference not reflecting what is ostensibly in the preference holder's interest.[16] In the case of soft or weak paternalism, persons might hold all manner of preferences not in their best interest that are nonetheless not justifiably interfered with because the relevant compromising conditions do not obtain. In public health policy, soft paternalism has been evoked to justify interventions that limit the ability of adolescents to act on preferences for alcohol, drugs, sexual activity and driving.

In recent years, public health policy and liberal governments have increasingly looked to interventions called 'nudges' to influence health behaviors in desirable directions. Nudges, understood typically as interventions in choice architecture, are the focus of libertarian paternalism. Libertarian paternalism defends interventions by planners (such as public health authorities) in the environmental architecture in which individuals decide and act in order to make it easier for people to behave in ways that are in their best interests (including their health), provided two conditions are satisfied (Thaler &Sunstein 2003; Thaler & Sunstein 2008). First, individuals are steered by these interventions in ways that make them better off, as judged by themselves. Thus, in libertarian paternalism there is no attempt to contravene the will of individuals, in contrast to what some hold to be a necessary feature of paternalism. Second, the interventions must not overly burden individuals who want to exercise their freedom in ways that run counter to welfare. In this sense, libertarian paternalism claims to be liberty-preserving, hence libertarian.

A key conceptual question about paternalism is whether the interference with individual liberty must be against the person's will (Beauchamp 2010). If this feature is a necessary condition of paternalism, then libertarian paternalism is inappropriately titled. From the standpoint of public health ethics, however, whether libertarian paternalism is appropriately titled is less important than any moral issues it raises and how it is justified. There is a growing literature on the ethics of 'nudges,' much of it focusing on health (Saghai 2013a; Saghai 2013b; Quigley 2013; Hollands et al. 2013).

Libertarian paternalism is grounded in the extensive empirical literature in cognitive psychology and the decision sciences that support claims about our cognitive limitations, bounded rationality and weakness of will. Although it raises challenging epistemic and political questions about how planners know what individuals judge is in their interest in specific policy contexts, libertarian paternalism may be well suited to public health contexts in which there is broad public consensus in favor of health-promoting behaviors such as eating more fruits and vegetables or getting more exercise, and a general recognition that it is difficult for people to act as prudentially as they would like. Thaler and Sunstein suggest, for example, that salads rather than French fries could be made the default “side” on restaurant menus, with diners free to request fries if that remains their preference. At the same time, libertarian paternalism has been criticized for failing to take account of the manipulative effects on choice of some market place forces. It has also been seen as too restrictive in its conditions (and therefore too weak) to be applicable or adequate for many public health contexts (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007; Ubel 2009).

2.6 Liberty-limiting Continua and A Central Task of Public Health Ethics

Part of the appeal of libertarian paternalism in public health policy is that, at least in certain contexts, it appears to sidestep or in some cases resolve the tension between liberty and health. This tension takes center stage in some analyses of the ethics of public health, as when public health policies are placed on autonomy-limiting continua and the fourth and fifth justifications dominate the analysis. An influential such continuum is the Nuffield Council's “intervention ladder” (Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007), which is presented as a way of thinking about the acceptability and justification of public health policies. The ladder is anchored at one end by what is presented as the least intrusive option, doing nothing, and at the other end by the what is presented as the most intrusive option, eliminating choice altogether (as in compulsory isolation). The Council makes plain that all rungs on the ladder, including doing nothing, require justification and that the ladder is to be taken only as a tool in the moral analysis of public health policies. However, the structure of the ladder and its attendant imagery reinforce the misleading view that balancing individual liberties with achieving health benefits is the primary moral challenge of public health while at the same time appearing to emphasize ethical concerns about over-reaching the mission of public health over ethical concerns about under-serving it.

Continua of this sort also oversimplify the complex impact of interventions on choice and liberty and on relations between citizens and the state. Incentives are not always less restrictive of choice than disincentives, and health promotion campaigns, which are generally ranked at or near the least intrusive end of the continuum, are not always without significant moral concern. Ad campaigns that are transparently sponsored by public health agencies to prevent transmission of influenza by promoting personal infection control practices or reduce obesity by encouraging exercise and healthy eating do not raise the same moral issues as the embedding of anti-drug or abstinence messages in the story lines of entertainment television programming by these same authorities (FCC 2000; Forbes 2000 (Other Internet Resources); Goodman 2006; Krauthammer 2000; Kurtz & Waxman 2000). While the latter poses important questions about respect for liberty, government over-reaching and democratic legitimacy, the limited effectiveness of many ad campaigns raises important questions about whether the state is under-serving its public health mission. Moreover, in the case of public health problems like obesity, a reliance on health promotion campaigns and other strategies focused on influencing the behavior of individuals may fail to place appropriate burden on the corporate interests and structural social inequalities that arguably account for much of the problem. Thus, depending on the circumstances, health promotion campaigns may be unjust as well as ineffective (Buchanan 2008; Crawford 1977; Faden 1987; McLeroy, Bibeau, Steckler, & Glanz 1988).

An important task of public health ethics is not only to provide different moral justifications, but also to critically examine their relationship to one another in the context of particular public health issues and activities so as to ensure a more complete moral picture of what is at stake, and to point out where no sufficient justification exists. In this way, public health ethics can play a more immediate practical role in public life: by raising challenges to and providing moral scrutiny of public health policies, it can contribute to creating an environment of accountability where both abuses and deficiencies are less likely. Thus, in addition to its intellectual significance, public health ethics can be an important element in the scheme of checks and balances that help keep public health authorities from overreaching or under-serving their mission.

3. Justice and Fairness in Public Health

Whether social justice is viewed as a side constraint on the beneficence-based foundation of public health, or as foundational in its own right, there is broad agreement that a commitment to improving the health of those who are systematically disadvantaged is as constitutive of public health as is the commitment to promote health generally (Powers & Faden 2006, Institute of Medicine (USA) 2003; Thomas, Sage, Dillenberg & Guillory 2002; Nuffield Council on Bioethics 2007; Kass 2001; Venkatapuram 2011; Gostin 2012).

In this regard, there is an intimate connection between public health and the field of health and human rights (Mann et al. 1994; Mann 1996; Beyrer et al. 2007; Beyrer & Pizer 2007; Tasioulas & Vayena 2014; Tasioulas & Vayena 2015; Gostin & Friedman 2013). Many in public health accept that there is a fundamental right to health, as codified in the United Nations Universal Declaration of Human Rights or otherwise, although there is less agreement about the justification for such a right or what precisely the right entails (General Assembly 1948). A key question for public health ethics is on whom the duties generated by a right to health fall. Because so many of these duties require collective action of the sort described in Section 2, governments are obvious candidates, but so, too, are other social institutions in the private sector as well as those global in structure that bear on the right to health. A failure on the part of these institutions to ensure the social conditions necessary to achieve a sufficient level of health is an injustice that on the view of many violates a basic human right. Note that as a basic human right, the claims of the right to health are not in any fundamental respect restricted to national borders but rather fall on the human community, as a whole. Thus, as we discuss later in this section, the extraordinary disparities in life expectancy, child survival and health that distinguish those who live in rich and poor countries constitute a profound injustice that it is the duty of the global community to redress.

One task of public health ethics is to identify which inequalities in health are the most egregious and thus which should be given high priority in public health policy and practice. That the life expectancy of some of world's poorest populations is over twenty-five years less than the life expectancy of those living in some affluent countries is a clear injustice of particular moral urgency. Not all inequalities are so obviously egregious, however, and different accounts of justice and of the relevance of individual responsibility for health may yield different conclusions. Different approaches to conceptualizing and measuring health inequalities have different ethical implications (Eyal, Hurst, Norheim & Wikler 2012). On the view that Powers and Faden defend (2006), social justice demands that, insofar as possible, all children achieve a sufficient level of health. Thus, inequalities in the health of children are a particular moral concern. The health of children is dependent on the decisions and actions of others and on features of the social structure over which children have no control. The value of health to children thus does not depend on what children can do for themselves, as it sometimes does for adults. Moreover, the level of well-being attainable in adulthood is in important respects conditioned by the level of health achieved in childhood. Compromised health in childhood has profound effects on health in adulthood, as well as on the development of the cognitive skills necessary for reasoning and self-determination.

When inequalities in health exist between socially dominant and socially disadvantaged groups, they are all the more important because they occur in conjunction with other disparities in well-being and compound them (Wolff & de-Shalit 2007; Powers & Faden 2006). Reducing such inequalities are specific priorities in the public health goals of national and international institutions (Department of Health 2009; EuroHealthNet 2014 (Other Internet Resources); Healthy People 2020 (2014, in Other Internet Resources); Kettner & Ball 2004; WHO 2015). Whether through processes of oppression, domination, or subordination, patterns of systematic disadvantage associated with group membership are invidious and profoundly unjust. They affect every dimension of well-being, including health. In many contexts, poverty co-travels with the systematic disadvantage associated with racism, sexism, and other forms of denigrated group membership. However, even when it does not, the dramatic differential in material resources, social influence and social status that is the hallmark of severe poverty brings with it systematic patterns of disadvantage that can be as difficult to escape as those experienced by the most oppressed minority groups. Even when these patterns are lessened, the life prospects of persons living in severe poverty or in dominated groups often continue to be far below that of others. A critical moral function of public health is to vigilantly monitor the health of systematically disadvantaged groups and intervene to reduce the inequalities so identified as aggressively as possible. Keeping obligations to such groups at the forefront of public health thinking can result in significant changes in public health policy. For example, which countries should top the list for the expansion of childhood vaccine programs from low to middle income countries can be profoundly affected by how vigilant we are in keeping systematic disadvantage squarely in mind (Shebaya, Sutherland, Levine & Faden 2010).

One of the most difficult challenges for public health ethics emerges when this important moral function conflicts with the injunction to improve, if not maximize, aggregate or collective health outcomes. Although the health of the world's most desperately poor can in many cases be improved by extremely cost-efficient interventions like basic childhood immunizations and vitamin supplementation, reducing other unjust inequalities in health can consume significant resources. For example, in the United States, infant mortality rates are higher than in many other wealthy nations, and they are higher still among poor and minority children. Some state public health authorities have made reducing racial disparities in infant mortality a top priority, accepting the view that redressing this unjust inequality is an urgent moral concern. Other states have chosen the goal of improving infant survival statistics overall, on grounds that the same resources will produce greater aggregate health outcomes while at the same time pointing to the special place that all children should hold in public health policy (HRSA 2014 in Other Internet Resources).

Still another challenge in social justice for public health ethics emerges when the health needs of systematically disadvantaged groups conflict with other dimensions of well-being as well as with considerations of collective efficiency. Targeting a public health program to poor and minority communities can sometimes both serve social justice concerns and be efficient if, for example, the health problem the intervention targets occurs disproportionately in these groups. At the same time, however, if the health problem is itself associated with stigma or shame, targeting the poor and minorities may reinforce existing invidious stereotypes, thereby undermining another critical concern of social justice, equality of social respect. In such cases, public health authorities must decide whether a commitment to social justice requires foregoing an efficient, targeted program in favor of a relatively inefficient, universal program that also may produce less improvement in health for the disadvantaged group (thus failing to narrow unjust inequalities) in order to avoid exacerbating existing disrespectful social attitudes.

As noted in Section 2, one of the structural features of public health is that the individuals and groups affected by its policies and programs are not uniformly benefited or burdened. When the burdens of a policy fall heavily on those who are already disadvantaged, the justificatory hurdle is particularly high. This concern is at the heart of many environmental justice controversies such as the locating of hazardous waste facilities and hazardous industries in low-income communities and countries. Global efforts to prevent and contain pandemic influenzas have also placed significant burdens on the world's poor. For example, a principal strategy employed to prevent avian influenza H5N1 from becoming a human pandemic is the destruction of infected birds and the banning of household poultry in urban settings. Many families and women affected by this policy relied on their backyard poultry as their only disposable source of income and have been economically devastated as a consequence. Without express focus on the interests of disadvantaged people, the moral concerns this policy raises, particularly in the absence of appropriate compensation and alternative livelihood opportunities, might well go unnoticed (Bellagio Working Group 2007 in Other Internet Resources; Faden & Karron 2009; Uscher-Pines, Duggan, Garoon, Karron, & Faden 2007).

Public health resources are always in short supply and priority setting in public health policy and practice is always morally challenging. Yet another important set of tasks for public health ethics is working to ensure that considerations of justice are prominent in the setting of public health priorities in health care services and in prevention and health threat programming (Norheim et al. 2014). In that regard, one focus for public health ethics is evaluating the role that formal economic and decision theory methods such as cost benefit, cost effectiveness and cost utility analysis should play in public health, including the continuing examination of the moral assumptions embedded in these methods. Formal methods have been used to varying degrees by public health authorities in numerous countries in such diverse contexts as determining what risks should be regulated in environmental health and injury prevention policy and in setting priorities for public health goals and coverage decisions for health care systems. Embedded in these methods are morally controversial assumptions. If the discount rate applied to future financial costs and benefits is also applied to future health benefits, preventive interventions are disvalued relative to interventions whose health benefits occur in the present (Schwappach 2007). Also problematic are “willingness to pay” measures as proxies of the value of benefits or risk reduction. Arguably, these measures reify the preferences of the privileged and fail to provide sufficient moral justification when risks materialize (Gafni 1991).

Some formal methods, including most notably cost-utility analysis, rely on what are referred to as summary health measures in which mortality and diverse morbidities are combined in a single metric such as a quality-adjusted or disability-adjusted life year. These measures, and the formal methods that employ them, sometimes rely on assessments of what may be only vague individual preferences for trade-offs between different states of health or different kinds of benefits. Moreover, they make morally problematic assumptions including, for example, whether to differentially value years saved in different stages of life and how to disvalue specific disabilities. Depending on how these and other assumptions are determined and specified, summary health measures have been criticized as being ageist or not ageist enough, as discriminating unfairly against people with disabilities, as failing to capture the moral uniqueness of life-saving, as treating as commensurable qualitatively different losses and benefits, and as failing to take adequate account of the claims of those who are most disadvantaged (Brock 2002; Daniels 2008; Kappel & Sandoe 1992; Nord 2005; Powers & Faden 2006; Ubel 1999; Williams 2001; Whitehead & Ali 2010; Soares 2012).

Because formal methods and summary measures do not reflect these and other considerations of justice, one widely recognized view is that formal methods should be used solely as aids in public health policy and not as determinative in their own right (Lipscomb, Drummond, Fryback, Gold, & Revicki 2009). That said, there is a powerful bias in favor of quantification and the empirical in public health policy. Thus, there is the risk that the findings emerging from these formal analyses will have determinative influence in policy circles. One response to this risk has been to empiricize moral considerations by, for example, measuring and aggregating the value preferences of the public about moral tradeoffs such as prioritizing by age or life-saving potential (Mason, Baker & Donaldson 2011; Baker et al. 2008; Menzel et al. 1999; Nord 1999). These aggregated preferences or other approaches to quantifying equity considerations can then be used in various ways to structure policy guidance. For example, they can be transformed into weights intended to incorporate moral values directly into the structure of the formal methodology, a move that continues to attract considerable interest (Johri & Norheim 2012) but that is open to criticism on methodological as well as substantive grounds. Moves of this sort may obscure controversial moral considerations from public view and deliberation, undermining democratic values and political legitimacy. An important role for public health ethics is to continue to look critically at both the role and specific methods of economic and decision theory strategies for establishing priorities and regulatory standards in public health, recognizing that considerations of cost-benefit and efficiency are essential to public health programming and policy, and at alternative approaches for incorporating equity considerations in priority setting and regulatory decision-making (Cookson, Drummond & Weatherly 2009; Global Health Priorities 2014 (Other Internet Resources); NICE International 2014 (Other Internet Resources)).

4. Global Justice

Just as in the economic, environmental, political and security arenas, it has become increasingly difficult to discuss ethical issues in public health without considering questions of justice, rights and responsibilities beyond borders. What duties do the more fortunate, wealthy, or developed nations owe to promote or protect public health in more impoverished, less developed countries or localities? What interventions are justified and how should they be undertaken so as not to breach respect for national sovereignty? And how should they be undertaken so that they also create lasting improvements in health infrastructures abroad, and not just a temporary external solution that leaves another vacuum in its wake? The recent outbreak of Ebola in west Africa illustrates both the factually interconnected, global nature of public health and the normative reasons for considering public health a matter of global concern.

Three types of reasons can be advanced in favor of viewing public health as transcending national boundaries: self-interest; humanitarian considerations; and justice, rights and duties (Wolff 2012). The recent Ebola crisis again provides a helpful illustration. The most common argument publicly advanced for assisting countries affected by the outbreak is that addressing the crisis in West Africa is critical to our own health and well-being in the developed world, as evidenced by the few well-publicized cases of Ebola in the United States. Because diseases are not constrained by national boundaries, we are at risk unless we provide sufficient resources to contain and eradicate Ebola in Africa. Thus, we should always consider public health a global matter and should work to shore up health infrastructures and resources abroad in order to avoid negative consequences in our own backyards.

The next most common reason advanced is a humanitarian one: that we should provide resources to care for victims of Ebola abroad because it would be wrong to stand by and allow others to suffer in a crisis when we have the resources to help. Under this framework, we have positive duties to help those in desperate circumstances, and those positive duties can sometimes transcend borders. On this view, anything we do to promote public health abroad is essentially a charitable action.

Far less common in public and academic discussions of Ebola is the third view: that Ebola-stricken communities have a claim in justice against the world's wealthy countries and persons for the resources necessary to not only contain the current epidemic but also prevent future ones. Under this view, everyone has a right to health and the responsibility for the realization of that right crosses national boundaries, at least when nations cannot or will not secure it for their own citizens. On one of the most compelling arguments for this view, we all are responsible for institutional structures that contribute to and exacerbate unjust global inequalities, including global health inequalities. Consequently, we have a duty to ensure that the effects of these inequalities are mitigated, by providing resources to resolve crises and also by helping to build effective public health infrastructures in impoverished countries so that crises can be averted in the future. Failing to do so is an injustice and not merely a failure to act charitably or in accordance with humanitarian obligations.[17] Ultimately, that is why we cannot escape responsibility for intervening when something like an Ebola outbreak occurs, even if concerns about disease transmission and humanitarian sentiments did not hold sway. One of the most difficult unanswered questions of this line of reasoning, however, is assignment of responsibility. Who has the responsibility to realize the right to health, and how can that responsibility be operationalized? This remains a pressing but under-addressed question in global public health ethics (Millum & Emanuel 2012; Tasioulas & Vayena 2014; Tasioulas & Vayena 2015).

As was emphasized in Section 1, public health is and ought to be about much more than simply medical care and classic public health interventions. This observation naturally extends to the international arena. Improving the health of the world's poor is indelibly tied to economic, social, educational, and environmental improvements as well, and health-related justice claims are also not easily separable from justice claims that arise in those other contexts. The mere fact that there are people who live in such poverty and deprivation that they and their children die of starvation and the simplest infection should be a sufficient indicator that there is something seriously wrong with global institutional schemes, and that a justice-based obligation to remedy that situation, both from a public health point of view and more broadly, exists (Pogge 2008). How exactly to characterize and operationalize that obligation remains the single biggest challenge for public health ethics, and for global justice.


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Section 4 draws heavily on Powers & Faden 2006, Chapters 4 and 6. We gratefully acknowledge JP Leider, TE Schall, and AA Pridgen for their invaluable assistance in preparing this manuscript.

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Sirine Shebaya <>

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