First published Fri Apr 1, 2011

We discuss presupposition, the phenomenon whereby speakers mark linguistically the information that is presupposed or taken for granted, rather than being part of the main propositional content of a speech act. Expressions and constructions carrying presuppositions are called “presupposition triggers”, forming a large class including definites and factive verbs. The article first introduces the range of triggers, the basic properties of presuppositions such as projection and cancellability, and the diagnostic tests used to identify them. The reader is then introduced to major models of presupposition from the last 50 years, separated into three classes: Frege-Strawson derived semantic models, pragmatic models such as that offered by Stalnaker, and dynamic models. Finally we discuss some of the main current issues in presupposition theory. These involve accommodation, which occurs when a hearer's knowledge state is adjusted to meet the speaker's presuppositions; presupposition failure, which occurs when a presupposition is (known to be) false; the interaction between presuppositions and attitudes; and the triggering problem, i.e., the problem of explaining why presuppositions occur in the first place.

1. Introduction

Speakers take a lot for granted. That is, they presuppose information. As we wrote this, we presupposed that readers would understand English. But we also presupposed, as we wrote the last sentence, repeated in (1), that there was a time when we wrote it, for otherwise the fronted phrase “as we wrote this” would not have identified a time interval.

As we wrote this, we presupposed that readers would understand English.

We also presupposed that the sentence was jointly authored, for otherwise “we” would not have referred. And we presupposed that readers would be able to identify the reference of “this”, i.e., the article itself. And we presupposed that there would be at least two readers, for otherwise the bare plural “readers” would have been inappropriate. And so on and on.

Here note a first distinction: the presupposition that an interlocutor would understand English corresponds to an assumption we made in using English words, but it has nothing to do with the meanings of any of those words. On the other hand, the existence of a time when we wrote the article is a requirement associated with our use of a specific word, “as”. It is a requirement built into the meaning of the temporal preposition “as” that in a phrase “as X”, the “X” has to hold at some time. We say that “as” is a presupposition trigger. Similarly, “this” is a presupposition trigger requiring something to refer to, the bare plural is a presupposition trigger requiring existence of multiple individuals, and “would” is a presupposition trigger requiring a salient future or hypothetical circumstance.

We can say that the presupposition that the interlocutor speaks English, like the presupposition that the interlocutor is interested in what the speaker (or writer) has to say, is a conversational presupposition or, following Stalnaker (1972; 1974), speaker presupposition or pragmatic presupposition. The presuppositions associated with specific triggers are said to be conventional or semantic. In fact, this terminological distinction is of theoretical import: as we will see later, some theorists regard it as an open question whether there are any purely conventional presuppositions. A halfway house, suggested for example by Karttunen (1973) and Soames (1982), is to define a notion of utterance presupposition, thus involving both a specific form that is uttered, and a speaker who utters it.

It is important to note that to call presuppositional expressions “conventional” or “semantic” is not necessarily to imply that the presuppositions they trigger don't depend on the context in any way. For example, although “this” may be viewed as a conventional presupposition trigger, its interpretation very much depends on the context, obviously.

What makes presuppositions special? That is, to the extent that presuppositions are just a part of the conventional meaning of some expressions, what makes them sufficiently distinctive that they merit their own entries in handbooks and encyclopedias, as well as many hundreds of other articles and book chapters elsewhere? First, presuppositions are ubiquitous. And second, there are various respects in which the behavior of presuppositions differs sharply from other aspects of meaning.

As regards the ubiquity of presuppositions, at least the following lexical classes and constructions are widely agreed to be presupposition triggers:

  • factives (Kiparsky and Kiparsky, 1970)
    Berlusconi knows that he is signing the end of Berlusconism.
    → Berlusconi is signing the end of Berlusconism.
  • aspectual verbs (“stop, continue”) (Simons, 2001; Abusch, 2002; Lorenz, 1992)
    China has stopped stockpiling metals.
    → China used to stockpile metals.
  • temporal clauses headed by “before”, “after”, “since”, etc. (Beaver and Condoravdi, 2003; Heinämäki, 1974)
    The dude released this video before he went on a killing spree.
    → The dude went on a killing spree.
  • manner adverbs (Abbott, 2000)
    Jamie ducked quickly behind the wall.
    → Jamie ducked behind the wall.
  • sortally restricted predicates of various categories (e.g., “bachelor”) (Thomason, 1972)
    Julius is bachelor.
    → Julius is an adult male.
  • cleft sentences (Delin, 1995; Prince, 1986)
    It was Jesus who set me free.
    → Somebody set me free.
  • quantifiers (Roberts, 1995; Gawron, 1995; Abusch and Rooth, 2000; Cooper, 1983)
    I have written to every headmaster in Rochdale.
    → There are headmasters in Rochdale.
  • definite descriptions (strawson:ref, etc.)
    The Prime Minister of Trinidad and Tobago stood up and wagged his finger.
    → Trinidad and Tobago have a (unique) prime minister.
  • names (van der Sandt, 1992)
    The author is Julius Seidensticker.
    → Julius Seidensticker exists.
  • intonation (e.g., focus, contrast) (Jackendoff, 1972; Geurts and van der Sandt, 2004; Roberts, 1998)
    HE set me free.[1]
    → Somebody set me free.

And this is only a small sample of the words and syntactic constructions that have been classified as presupposition triggers, so even if in some cases there may be doubts about this diagnosis, it can hardly be doubted that presupposition triggers abound in everyday language. In the following sections we will discuss the behaviors which mark out presuppositions from ordinary entailments, and then introduce some of the theories that have been developed to account for those behaviors.

2. Projection

The hallmark of presuppositions, as well as the most thoroughly studied presuppositional phenomenon, is projection (Langendoen and Savin, 1971). Consider (2). This has all the presuppositions in (3). These presuppositions all follow from utterances of the base sentence in (2), as do the regular entailments in (4): someone who sincerely uttered (2) would certainly be expected to accept the truth of (3) and (4), as well:

It's the knave that stole the tarts.
There is a (salient and identifiable) knave.
There were (salient and identifiable) tarts.
Somebody stole the tarts.
The knave did something illegal.
The knave took possession of the tarts.

Now consider the sentences in (5):

It isn't the knave that stole the tarts. (negation)
If it's the knave that stole the tarts, he will be punished. (antecedent of a conditional)
Is it the knave that stole the tarts? (question)
Maybe/It is possible that it's the knave that stole the tarts. (possibility modal)
Presumably/probably it's the knave that stole the tarts. (evidential modal, probability adverb)
The king thinks it's the knave that stole the tarts. (belief operator)

In all these examples, sentence (2) is embedded under various operators. What is notable is that whereas the statements in (4) do not follow from any of these embeddings (and would not be expected to follow according to classical logics), the presuppositions do follow. We say that the presuppositions are projected. Certainly, the inference is more robust in some cases than in others: while it is hard to imagine sincerely uttering (5a) without believing some tarts to be salient, it is easier to imagine a circumstance in which (5f) could be uttered when in fact the tarts were not stolen, but hidden. But in the absence of special factors, to which we will turn shortly, someone who sincerely uttered any of the sentences in (5) might be expected to believe all of the presuppositions in (3a)(3b).

Projection from embeddings, especially negation, is standardly used as a diagnostic for presupposition (hence the term “negation test”). It makes sense to try several such embeddings when testing for presupposition, because it is not always clear how to apply a given embedding diagnostic. Thus, for example, we might be specifically interested in the presuppositions of the cleft construction in (2), but doubt whether the sentence in (5a) really involves the cleft being within the semantic scope of the negation. However, the other embeddings in (5) confirm that the it-cleft construction is a presupposition trigger. Similarly, although it is widely agreed that the additive particle “too” is a presupposition-inducing expression, the negation test is awkward to apply in this case:

Fred kissed BETTY, too.
Fred didn't kiss BETTY, too.

If we embed (6a), e.g., under a modal or in the antecedent of a conditional, it turns out that this sentence presupposes that someone other than Betty was kissed by Fred. However, as (6b) shows, the negation test is awkward in this case, because it is not immediately clear whether the negation outscopes the additive or vice versa. Such examples illustrate how important it is to consider several types of embedding when testing for presupposition.

3. Cancellability

What makes the “projection problem” problematic? If some part of the meaning of an expression α was never affected by the linguistic context in which α was embedded, that would be philosophically interesting, and would demand a theoretical explanation, but it would at least be trivial to completely describe the data: all presuppositional inferences would survive any embedding, end of story. But that isn't what happens. Presuppositions typically project, but often do not, and most of the empirical and theoretical work on presupposition since the 1970s has been taken up with the task of describing and explaining when presuppositions project, and when they don't.

When a presupposition does not project, it is sometimes said to be “canceled”. The classic cases of cancellation occur when the presupposition is directly denied, as in the following variants of some of the sentences in (5):

In this court, it isn't the knave that steals the tarts: the king employs no knaves precisely because he suspects they are responsible for large-scale tart-loss across his kingdom.
If it's the knave that stole the tarts, then I'm a Dutchman: there is no knave here.
Is it the knave that stole the tarts? Certainly not: there is no knave here.
The king thinks it's the knave that stole the tarts, but he's obviously gone mad, since there is no knave here.

Presuppositional inferences are typically subject to cancellation by direct denial only when the presupposition trigger is embedded under some other operator. When the presupposition is not embedded, such cancelation (by the same speaker) is usually infelicitous, just as is cancelation of entailed content which is not embedded. Thus the denial of a presupposition in (8) and the denial of an ordinary entailment in (9) both lead to pragmatically infelicitous utterances (marked by a “#”).

#It's the knave that stole the tarts, but there is no knave.
#It's the knave that stole the tarts, but he didn't do anything illegal.

The fact that presuppositions associated with unembedded triggers are not cancelable is one of the features that distinguishes most presuppositions from Gricean conversational implicatures (Grice, 1989). For example, an utterance of (10a) might ordinarily lead to the so-called scalar implicature in (10b). But while this implicature is cancelable, as in (10c), the presupposition that there is a knave, once again, is not cancelable, as shown by the oddity of (10d).

The knave stole most of the tarts.
The knave did not steal all of the tarts.
The knave stole most of the tarts—in fact, he stole them all.
#The knave stole most of the tarts, but there was no knave.

We can summarize the typical behavior of entailments, presuppositions, and conversational implicatures as follows:

Entailments Presuppositions Implicatures
Project from embeddings no yes no
Cancelable when embedded yes
Cancelable when unembedded no no yes

Because presuppositions are typically only cancelable when embedded, Gazdar (1979a, 1979b) argued that presuppositions are usually entailed when the trigger is not embedded.

The literature is choc-a-bloc with examples of presuppositional inferences apparently disappearing. Whether such examples are appropriately described as involving cancellation is partly a theoretical decision, and, as we will see, many scholars avoid using the term “cancellation” for some or all such cases. One reason for this is that the term “cancellation” appears to suggest that an inference has been made, and then removed. But in many cases there are theoretical reasons not to regard this as an apt characterization, and we will now consider one class of such cases.

4. Theories of presupposition

4.1 The Frege-Strawson tradition

Strawson (1950) famously argued against Russell's (1905) theory of definite descriptions by proposing that when a definite description fails to refer, the result can be a sentence which lacks a truth value. Thus presuppositions are understood as definedness conditions, necessary requirements for an expression to have a meaning. Strawson's intuition, which can be traced back to Frege (1892), leads to the following definition:[2]

Definition 1 (Strawsonian presupposition) .
One sentence presupposes another iff whenever the first is true or false, the second is true.

Another definition that is often used is this:

Definition 2 (Presupposition via negation)
One sentence presupposes another iff whenever the first sentence is true, the second is true, and whenever the negation of the first sentence is true, the second sentence is true.[3]

These two definitions are equivalent if negation maps true onto false, false onto true, and is undefined when its argument is undefined. However, the second definition is notable in the context of the above discussion of projection, because it seems to directly encode the projection properties of at least one operator, negation. Specifically, it says that presuppositions are inferences that survive embedding under negation.[4]

It is clear that if the above assumptions about presupposition are made, then the presuppositions of a sentence will be the same as the presuppositions of the negation of the sentence. But what about projection from embeddings other than negation? A very simple account of projection is based on the cumulative hypothesis, first discussed by Morgan (1969) and Langendoen and Savin (1971). This is the idea that presuppositions always project from embedding, as if there were no effects like cancellation. A trivalent semantics that yields this behavior is obtained by using the Weak Kleene connectives (Kleene, 1952). Assume (for all the partial/multivalued semantics given in this article) that for classically valued arguments, the connectives behave classically. Then Weak Kleene connectives (also known as the Bochvar Internal connectives) are defined as follows:

Definition 3 (Weak Kleene)
If any argument of a sentence with a Weak Kleene connective lacks a classical truth value, then the sentence as a whole lacks a truth value.

Weak Kleene fails as a theory of presupposition because it entails that presuppositions project uniformly, whereas in fact they do not. Another system of Kleene's, the Strong Kleene connectives, does not have this property:

Definition 4 (Strong Kleene)
If the classically-valued arguments of a sentence with a Strong Kleene connective would suffice to determine a truth value in standard logic, then the sentence as a whole has that value; otherwise it doesn't have a classical value.

For example, in classical logic a conjunction is bound to be false if one of its conjuncts is false, and therefore the same holds for Strong Kleene “and”. Similarly, since in classical logic a disjunction must be true if one of its disjuncts is true, the same holds for Strong Kleene “or”. We obtain the following truth tables for the main binary connectives:

φ ∧ ψ t f
t t f
f f f f
φ ∨ ψ t f
t t t t
f t f
φ → ψ t f
t t f
f t t t

Now consider the following example:

If there is a knave, then the knave stole the tarts.

Let's ignore all presuppositions triggers in (11) save “the knave”, and show that Strong Kleene predicts that the sentence as a whole does not presuppose that there is a knave. Using Definition 1, it suffices to find at least one model where (11) has a classical truth value, but in which there is no knave. This is easy: in such a model, the antecedent is false, and inspection of the above Strong Kleene table shows that when the antecedent of a conditional is false, the conditional is true, as would be the case classically. In fact, Strong Kleene predicts no presupposition for (11). This is in contradistinction to Weak Kleene, which would fail to give (11) a classical value in knave-less models, and hence predict that (11) presupposes the existence of a knave.

There are other cases where Strong Kleene does predict a presupposition, and the presupposition predicted is not what we might have expected. Thus Strong Kleene gives (12a) a classical truth value in all models where there is a knave, and in all models where there was trouble. So while we might have expected the presupposition in (12b), Strong Kleene predicts the presupposition in (12c).[5] We will return to this issue shortly.

If the knave stole the tarts, then there was trouble.
There is a knave.
If there was no trouble, then there is a knave.

Much of the discussion of partial and multivalent approaches to presupposition over the last three decades has centered on the treatment of negation. Specifically, the issue has been the treatment of cancellation examples like (13).

The tarts were not stolen by the knave: there is no knave.

A standard approach is to propose that negation is ambiguous between a presupposition-preserving negation and a presupposition-denying negation; see e.g., the discussion by Horn (1985, 1989). The presupposition-preserving negation (aka choice negation) we have already seen, and it is found in both the Weak and Strong Kleene systems. The presupposition-denying (or exclusion) negation is typically taken to map true to false and false to true, as usual, but also to map an argument lacking a classical value to true. Thus if (13) is interpreted in a model where there is no knave, but “not” is understood as a presupposition-denying negation, then “the tarts were stolen by the knave” would lack a classical value, but “The tarts were not stolen by the knave”, and (13) as a whole, would be true.

Note that in this analysis the presupposition triggered by the “the knave” is not literally cancelled; rather, the negation is interpreted in such a way that the sentence as a whole doesn't inherit this presupposition. However, the idea that negation is ambiguous between a presupposition-preserving and a presupposition-denying sense is controversial, e.g. because thus far no language has been found in which presupposition-affirming and presupposition-denying negations are realized by different lexical items.[6]

4.2 Pragmatic presupposition

Probably the most significant philosophical counterpoint to the Frege-Strawson approach to presupposition, other than the original non-presuppositional work of Russell, is due to Stalnaker (1972, 1973, 1974), and later clarified in Stalnaker (1998).[7] Stalnaker suggests that a pragmatic notion of presupposition is needed, so that the proper object of philosophical study is not what words or sentences presuppose, but what people presuppose when they are speaking. A pragmatic presupposition associated with a sentence is a condition that a speaker would normally expect to hold in the common ground between discourse participants when that sentence is uttered.[8]

One consequence of Stalnaker's view is that, contra semantic accounts of presupposition, presupposition failure need not produce a semantic catastrophe. There are, however, two weaker types of failure that can occur: (i) a speaker uttering some sentence S can fail to assume that some proposition P is in the common ground, even though most utterances of S would be accompanied by the presupposition that P; and (ii) a speaker can presuppose something that is not in the common ground. The former idea was used by Stalnaker to account for some tricky examples of Karttunen (1971b), involving a subclass of factive verbs that Karttunen referred to as “semifactives”. The naturally occurring examples in (14a) and (14b), which involve the (semi-)factive verb “know”, illustrate the point. The first sentence of (14a) involves a first person, present tense use of “know”, and there is clearly no presupposition that Mullah Omar is alive. On the other hand, (14b) involves a past tense, third person use of “know”, and in this case it does seem to be presupposed (at least in the fictional context of the story) that Luke was alive.

I don't know that Mullah Omar is alive. I don't know if he's dead either. (General Dan McNeill, Reuters, 19 May 2008)
Vader didn't know that Luke was alive, so he had no intentions of converting Luke to the Sith. (Web example)

Examples like (14) led Karttunen to propose that “know” only triggers a presupposition in some person and tense forms; whence the term “semifactive”. But, as Karttunen himself realized, such a stipulation is unmotivated. What Stalnaker noticed was that in the context of his pragmatic account of presupposition, these examples are not problematic. In the pragmatic account, the verb “know” need not presuppose that its complement is true. When an addressee hears the first sentence of (14a), he will realize that if it were in the common ground that Mullah Omar was alive, then the speaker would know this, and so the speaker's claim would be false. Therefore the hearer can reason that the speaker is not presupposing the complement of “know” to be true. On the other hand, when a hearer is confronted by (14b), it is consistent to assume that Luke was alive. Since speakers using “know” typically presuppose the truth of the complement, we can assume that this is the case here.

Stalnaker's work was part of an avalanche of pragmatic attacks on the semantic conception of presupposition. However, unlike Stalnaker's, many of these proposals had no distinctive role for a notion of presupposition. Working in the immediate aftermath of Grice's 1967 William James lectures,[9] many theorists attempted to reduce presupposition to various combinations of entailment and implicature. Thus Atlas (1976; 1977; 1979), Atlas and Levinson (1981), Kempson (1975), Wilson (1975), and Böer and Lycan (1976) all present detailed (and partly independent) arguments that presuppositions should be understood as something akin to conversational implicatures. Generally speaking, the approach is to justify presuppositional inferences using the maxims of relevance and quantity. Thus, for example, Atlas (1976) suggests that an embedding of a definite under a negation will tend to produce a meaning that is ruled out as insufficiently strong to satisfy the maxim of quantity, unless it is strengthened by treating the definite as if it had wide scope and could act referentially. Contemporary descendants of this pragmatic tradition include Abbott (2000; 2006; 2008), Simons (2001; 2003; 2004; 2006; 2007), and Schlenker (2007; 2008). Both Abbott and Simons are at pains to distinguish between different presupposition triggers, rather than lumping them all together. Thus Simons, for example, makes a case for deriving presuppositional inferences associated with factives and aspectual adverbs using a combination of Stalnakerian and Gricean reasoning, but does not argue for making the same reduction in the case of typically anaphoric triggers like the additive “too”. Schlenker does not make such fine-grained distinctions between presupposition triggers. Instead, he concentrates on deriving projection properties pragmatically, using both standard maxims and at least one rule specific to presuppositions.[10]

There is a contrast among pragmatic approaches to presupposition. Those discussed in the preceding paragraph attempt to derive presuppositional inferences from general conversational principles, thus explaining both the source of presuppositions, and the phenomenon of projection. But Stalnaker made no attempt whatsoever to explain where presuppositions came from, beyond indicating that they are inferential tendencies that might or might not be associated with semantic presuppositions. This emphasis on the projection of presuppositions rather than their source, which holds also of the contemporaneous work by Karttunen (1974; 1973), to which we shall turn shortly, lived on in much of the work influenced by these theories. It is particularly obvious in what we can collectively term cancellation-based theories of presupposition, led by Gazdar (1979a; 1979b), and including Soames (1979; 1982), Mercer (1987; 1992), Gunji (1981), Marcu (1994), Horton (1987), Horton and Hirst (1988), Bridge (1991), and, of particular note, van der Sandt (1982; 1988).

Cancellation accounts can be traced back in spirit to Stalnaker's account of semifactives, discussed above, in which presuppositions are defeated by competing conversational inferences: the general idea is simply to make presuppositions into defaults, and wipe them out whenever they would cause pragmatic embarrassment. Gazdar's account provided a remarkably straightforward formalization of this account, as well as extending to many other projection phenomena, based on a general principle he characterizes as “All the news that fits”. In Gazdar's model, the strategy for a hearer is first to identify sets of entailments, conversational implicatures, and presuppositions, and then to try adding them to the speaker's set of commitments.

Definition 5 (Gazdar: cancellation)
Implicatures and entailments defeat presuppositions, so a hearer adds to his or her commitments only those presuppositions that are compatible with both implicatures and entailments. All remaining presuppositions are cancelled.

Consider (15a), and assume there are no relevant pre-existing commitments:

If the king is angry, then the knave stole the tarts.
If there is a knave, then the knave stole the tarts.

According to Gazdar, (15a) entails is that if there is an angry king then there is a knave and he stole some set of tarts. (This much all theories agree on; some theories may predict stronger entailments.) The set of implicatures would include the clausal implicature that the speaker doesn't know whether a king is angry, and doesn't know whether a knave stole tarts. The presuppositions (or “potential presuppositions”, as Gazdar calls them at this stage) might be that there is a unique king, a unique knave, and a unique set of tarts. The hearer proceeds by adding the entailments to (his representation of) the speaker's commitment set, then adding whatever implicatures fit in, and then adding the presuppositions that fit after that. In this case, all the entailments, implicatures, and presuppositions are consistent, and all can be added without any being cancelled.

But now consider (15b), repeated from (11). Here there is an implicature that the speaker doesn't know whether there is a knave. The hearer accepts this and other implicatures, and then considers the presuppositions that there is a knave and that there are some tarts. The presupposition that there are tarts is unproblematic, and is added, but the hearer cannot consistently add the presupposition that there is a knave. So this presupposition is canceled, and (15b) does not presuppose that there is a knave. Hence, according to Gazdar, presuppositions are sometimes blocked by conversational implicatures.

Within the space of cancellation-based accounts of presupposition, it is hard to beat Gazdar's for its conceptual and technical simplicity, and its empirical coverage. Some conceptual questions remain, however, such as why it should be that presuppositions are the last things to be added in the process of updating commitments. Van der Sandt's (1982, 1988) reformulation of the cancellation model gives us an alternative way to think about this, for in this model presuppositions are considered in terms of whether they could have come first.

Definition 6 (Van der Sandt: cancellation)
Project only those presuppositions that could be conjoined to the beginning of the sentence while leaving the utterance consistent with (neo-Gricean) conversational principles.[11]

The intuitive idea underlying van der Sandt's proposal is that presuppositions are given information, and in this sense “precede” their carrier sentences, if not de facto then at least de jure. In the case of (15), fronting the presupposition that there are some tarts yields the sentences in (16).

There are some tarts and if the king is angry then the knave stole the tarts.
There are some tarts and if there is a knave, then the knave stole the tarts.

These do not clash with any Gricean principles, so the presuppositions are predicted to project. Similarly, adding the presupposition that there is a knave to (15a), as in (17a), produces no clash, so (15a) presupposes that there is a knave. But adding the presupposition that there is a knave to (15b), as in (17b), does result in a clash: since (17b) is truth-conditionally equivalent to the simple conjunction “there is a knave and the knave stole the tarts”, it is redundant. On van der Sandt's analysis, if fronting a presupposition would produce a redundant result, then that presupposition cannot project. So (15b) is correctly predicted not to presuppose that there is a knave.

There is a knave and if the king is angry then the knave stole the tarts.
There is a knave and if there is a knave, then the knave stole the tarts.

It should be noted, however, that even if (17b) is redundant, it is arguably a felicitous discourse, and therefore some subtlety is needed in applying van der Sandt's cancellation principle in the simplified form above. The issue is not simply whether a discourse is felicitous, but whether there is any clash with the maxims. And this will of course depend on how exactly the maxims are formulated. But for the purposes of understanding the intention of van der Sandt's analysis, we can take it that though an utterance of (17b) could be felicitous, it would be a case of flouting (in Grice's sense), a case where a maxim is disobeyed in order to preserve some greater conversational goal.

4.3 Local contexts and the dynamic turn

For the last fifty years, the philosophical literature on presupposition has been primarily focused on definite descriptions. But by the early 1970s, more linguistically oriented work had expanded the empirical domain of presupposition theory from definite descriptions to other trigger types, including factives (Kiparsky and Kiparsky, 1970), implicatives (Karttunen, 1971a), focus particles (Horn, 1969), verbs of judging (Fillmore, 1971) and sortal constraints (Thomason, 1972). Stalnaker's discussion of Karttunen's semifactives provides an early example of how this linguistic expansion of the empirical domain has impacted on philosophical work. Also by the early 1970s, linguists had expanded the empirical domain in another direction. The philosophical literature was largely oriented towards unembedded presupposition triggers and triggers under negation, but as we have already mentioned, Morgan (1969) and Langendoen and Savin (1971) generalized the issue by considering arbitrary embeddings. However, it was not until Karttunen (1973) that the full complexity of the projection problem became apparent. By methodically considering projection behavior construction by construction, Karttunen showed that there was more variation in projection behavior than had been previously described, making it quite clear that none of the extant Frege-Strawson derived systems could hope to cover every case.

4.3.1 Karttunen: first intimations of satisfaction

Karttunen (1973) presented a taxonomy of embedding constructions that divided them into three classes: plugs, holes and filters. Plugs comprise a class of predicates and operators which Karttunen claimed block the projection of presuppositions, while holes are a class of predicates and operators which allow presuppositions to project freely. So, since “told that” is a plug, according to Karttunen,[12] (18) is predicted not to presuppose that there is a King of France. On the other hand, since “perhaps” is a hole, (19) is predicted to presuppose that there is a King of France.

Mary told Jim that the King of France was bald.
Perhaps the King of France is bald.

Karttunen's filters include the binary logical connectives “if then”, “and”, and “or”. The intuition behind the filter metaphor is that these constructions allow only some presuppositions to project, and we have already seen examples of this phenomenon. Thus example (11) showed that sometimes a presupposition in the consequent of a conditional does not project: here the presupposition that there was a knave is, to use Karttunen's metaphor, filtered out. But the same example includes an occurrence of the definite “the tarts” in the consequent, and the presupposition that there are (or at least were) some tarts projects from the conditional. Karttunen concluded that the consequent of a conditional acts as a hole to some presuppositions, but filters out all those presuppositions which are entailed by the antecedent, or, more generally, by a combination of the antecedent and contextually supplied background information.

Karttunen's key example showing the role of context bears repetition:

Either Geraldine is not a mormon or she has given up wearing her holy underwear.

The second half of (20) contains (at least) two presupposition triggers: the definite description “her holy underwear” and the aspectual verb “give up”, which trigger the presuppositions that Geraldine used to have and wear holy underwear, respectively. Karttunen's filtering condition for disjunctions removes from the right disjunct any presuppositions that are entailed by a combination of the context and the negation of the left disjunct. Now consider a context supporting the proposition that all mormons have holy underwear which they wear regularly. It follows from this proposition and the negation of the left disjunct, i.e., the proposition that Geraldine is a mormon, that Geraldine has holy underwear and has worn it regularly. But these are exactly the presuppositions triggered in the right disjunct, so they are filtered out. It follows that (20) has no presuppositions.

Karttunen's (1973) account is of interest not only for its triptych of plugs, holes and filters, but also because it sets the background for a crucial shift of perspective in Karttunen (1974), and thence to the dynamic approaches to presupposition that have been dominant in recent years. What remained completely unclear in the 1973 paper was why certain presuppositions should be filtered out if they were entailed by other material. Karttunen (1974) suggests an alternative conception based on the idea of local contexts of evaluation. The idea is that the parts of a sentence are not necessarily evaluated with respect to the same context as that in which the sentence as a whole is evaluated: a local context may contain more information than the global context. For example, when evaluating a conjunction, the second conjunct is evaluated in a local context which contains not only the information in the global context, but also whatever information was given by the first conjunct. Karttunen (1974) defined local contexts of evaluation for a range of constructions, and suggested the following requirement: presuppositions always need to be entailed (or “satisfied”, as he puts it) in the local context in which the trigger is evaluated. Given this requirement, the overall presuppositions of a sentence will just be whatever propositions must be in a context of an utterance in order to guarantee that the presuppositions associated with presupposition triggers are satisfied in their local contexts of interpretation.

Karttunen spelled out how local satisfaction should be calculated separately for each connective and operator he considered. However, recent developments in Schlenker (2008) provide a general way of calculating what the local context should be. In the following reformulation of Karttunen's model we incorporate Schlenker's insights along the lines proposed by Beaver (2008).

Let us say that some clause in a complex sentence is redundant relative to some context of utterance if you can replace that clause by a tautology without affecting the amount of factual information conveyed by the sentence in that context. For example, in (21), the first conjunct is redundant in any context of utterance. Here, the same factual information would be conveyed by “Mary is Mary and Mary owns a sheep”, where the first conjunct is replaced by the tautology “Mary is Mary”.

Mary owns an animal and Mary owns a sheep.

Now let us say that a clause is left-redundant if it is possible to tell by looking at the material in the sentence to the left of the clause that the clause is redundant. So “Mary owns an animal” is not left-redundant in (21) (except if the context of utterance already entails that Mary owns an animal), because there is no material before that clause, implying that it is impossible to tell by looking at material to the left of the clause that the clause is redundant. On the other hand, “Mary owns an animal” is left-redundant in (22) and also in (23):

Mary owns a sheep and Mary owns an animal.
If Mary owns a sheep then Mary owns an animal.

Now we can put this to use to define the crucial notion in Karttunen's (1974) account.

Definition 7 (Karttunen/Schlenker: Presupposition via satisfaction)
A presupposition P is satisfied at point X in S iff P would be left-redundant if added at point X. A sentence presupposes whatever propositions must hold in global contexts of utterance such that each locally triggered presupposition is satisfied where its trigger occurs.

As an example, let us consider the presuppositions predicted for (20), repeated below:

Either Geraldine is not a mormon or she has given up wearing her holy underwear.

Note first that for all sentences of the form “A or B”, the negation of A is satisfied within the right disjunct. So “Geraldine is a mormon” is satisfied in the right disjunct of (20). And more generally, anything entailed by a combination of propositions in the context and the negation of the left disjunct will be satisfied in the right disjunct. Now, let us consider the clause “she has given up wearing her holy underwear”: we take this to trigger the presupposition that Geraldine has had holy underwear that she wore. This presupposition will be satisfied provided the global context of utterance, combined with the negation of the left disjunct, entails that she has had holy underwear that she wore. And classically this will be the case if and only if the context supports the conditional “if Geraldine is a mormon, then she has had holy underwear that she wore.” Hence, this conditional is the presupposition Karttunen (1974) predicts for (20).

One notable property of the Karttunen (1974) treatment of examples like (20), a property not found in his 1973 model, is that the presupposition predicted is conditionalized. That is, (20) is not predicted to presuppose that Geraldine has had holy underwear that she wore, but that if she is a mormon then she has had such underwear. We already encountered such conditionalized presuppositions in our discussion of Strong Kleene; in fact, Strong Kleene predicts exactly the same conditionalized presupposition in this case. Karttunen's 1974 model also predicts conditionalized presuppositions when the presupposition trigger is in the right conjunct of a conjunction, or in the consequent of a conditional.[13] Thus in (15a), the presuppositions predicted are that there is a king (since presuppositions triggered in the antecedent are not conditionalized), and that if the king is angry, then there is a knave. In (15b), the conditional presupposition (that if there is a knave, then there is a knave) is trivial, so in effect there is no net presupposition.[14]

If the king is angry then the knave stole the tarts.
If there is a knave, then the knave stole the tarts.

Although Karttunen's (1974) model seems quite distinct from any of its predecessors, we have already noted that it shares at least some predictions with Strong Kleene. An observation made by Peters (1979) showed that the 1974 model is surprisingly closely related to the semantic accounts of presupposition discussed above. In particular, Peters showed that Karttunen's way of calculating presuppositions for the truth conditional connectives is equivalent to what would be obtained within a three-valued logic, but with special non-symmetric connectives. Here is a general way of defining the Peters Connectives, inspired both by Schlenker (2009; 2008) and George (2008):

Definition 8 (Middle Kleene/Peters connectives)
Go from left to right through the sentence. For each argument X that takes a non-classical value, check whether on the basis of material on its left, assigning an arbitrary classical value to X could conceivably have an effect on the overall value. If so, the sentence as a whole lacks a classical truth value. If not, just assign X an arbitrary value, and carry on. If this procedure allows all non-classical values to be filled in classically, then the sentence can be assigned a classical value.

For example, this procedure makes a conjunction classical if both its arguments are classical, false if the left conjunct is false, and undefined otherwise. Thus undefinedness of the left conjunct forces undefinedness of the entire conjunction, whereas undefinedness of the right conjunct only sometimes yields undefinedness of the entire conjunct, as seen in the following comparison of truth tables in various systems. The net effect is that presuppositions of the left conjunct project in the Middle Kleene system, just as in the Weak Kleene system, but presuppositions of the right conjunct are conditionalized, just as in the Strong Kleene system. The net effect is behavior that precisely mirrors that of the Karttunen (1974) model.

Definition 9 (Trivalent truth tables for conjunction)

Weak Kleene
φ ∧ ψ t f
t t f
f f f
Middle Kleene/Peters
φ ∧ ψ t f
t t f
f f f f
Strong Kleene
φ ∧ ψ t f
t t f
f f f f

The equivalence between Peters' connectives and Karttunen's model paved the way for a more complete reformulation of the Karttunen model in Karttunen and Peters (1977; 1979), where certain types of presupposition (which Karttunen and Peters regard as conventional implicatures rather than presuppositions) are treated in a compositional grammar fragment. This fragment uses two dimensions of meaning, one for presupposition and one for assertion, and is effectively an implementation of the Peters connectives in a four-valued logic; see Krahmer (1994); Krahmer (1998), Beaver (2001), and Beaver and Krahmer (2001) for discussion, and the latter for a fragment that mirrors that of Karttunen and Peters, but allows for richer interactions between presuppositions and quantifiers.[15]

4.3.2 Satisfaction theories

Although Karttunen's (1974) model turned out to be equivalent to a system which, from a purely technical point of view, is in the Frege-Strawson tradition, Karttunen (1974) was one of the seminal papers of the dynamic zeitgeist that swept through semantics and pragmatics in the last decades of the twentieth century. Also relevant here are Hamblin (1970), Stalnaker (1972); Stalnaker (1974) and Lewis (1979), all of whom advanced dynamic models of pragmatics in which the (joint) commitments of speakers and hearers evolve as new assertions are made and their content becomes part of the linguistic context available for future utterances. It is against this background that Heim (1982; 1983) offered the first dynamic semantic account of presupposition. Heim's model utilizes Stalnaker's notion of a context as a set of all possible worlds compatible with what has been established at that point in a conversation, but involves a crucial twist adapted from Karttunen. In Stalnaker's model, a single global context is updated each time new information is asserted, but in Heim's model the context is updated locally in the process of computing the meanings of subparts of a complex expression.[16] We can define a simplified version of Heim's system as follows:

Definition 10 (Dynamic Semantics)
Assuming that the context set C is a set of possible worlds and S and S′ are sentences:
  1. C + S = the subset of worlds in C that are compatible with S, but this is defined iff S's presuppositions (if any) are true in all worlds in C.
  2. C + ¬S = C − (C + S)
  3. C + S S′ = (C + S) + S
  4. C + SS′, where ○ is some truth functional operator, is given by the simplest classical definition of ○ in terms of ¬ and ∧ that preserves the order of the two sub-clauses.
  5. S is satisfied in a context C iff C + S = C (i.e., updating C with S has no effect).
  6. S presupposes S′ iff S′ is satisfied in all contexts where update with S is defined.

Clause (iv) entails that update with a conditional is defined via the equivalence AB ≡ ¬ (A ∧ ¬ B) (provided that the subordinate clause precedes the main clause). To see how this will work, let's consider the following example:

If the king is angry, then the knave stole the tarts. (=(15a))
It's not the case that [the king is angry and the knave didn't steal the tarts].
The king is angry and the knave didn't steal the tarts.
The king is angry.
The knave didn't steal the tarts.
The knave stole the tarts.

In order to update a context with (24), we must do the equivalent of updating with (25a). Now clause (ii) says that to update a context with (25a), we must first try updating with (25b), and subtract the result from the original context (so as to leave behind whichever worlds are not compatible with (25a)). But (25b) is a conjunction, so we must first update with the left conjunct (25c), and then with the right (25d). Updating with (25c) is only defined if the presupposition that there is a king is satisfied in all worlds in the context set. We immediately see that (24) and (25a), (25b), and (25c) all have this requirement, i.e., they presuppose that there is a king. Provided this presupposition is satisfied, updating with (25c) produces a subset of worlds where the king is angry. We use this reduced context set for update with (25d). But update with (25d) again uses the negation clause (ii) of the above definition. So we started off with a set of worlds where there is a king, we reduced it to a set of worlds where the king is angry, and now we must update that context with (25e). But this update will only be defined if there is a knave. So it turns out that update of a context with (24) is only defined for contexts where (a) there is a king, and (b) where all the worlds where the king is angry are worlds where there is a knave. Following the definitions through, it turns out that, once again, the original sentence carries both a non-conditionalized presupposition, that there is a king, and the conditionalized presupposition that if the king is angry, then there is a knave.

The satisfaction based model has seen considerable further development—see e.g., Beaver (1992; 2001), Chierchia (1995), Heim (1992), Zeevat (1992), and, for a rather different formalization of a dynamic semantic approach, van Eijck (1993; 1994; 1995).[17]

The most important feature of the satisfaction model not covered in the description above is accommodation. For Heim (1982), following Lewis (1979), this is a process whereby contexts are adjusted so as to make update possible when presuppositions are not satisfied. In terms of her treatment of accommodation, Heim's major innovation over Lewis was to allow this process to take place not only in the global context of utterance, but also on local contexts found midway through an update. However, Heim (1982) was not explicit about exactly how accommodation should work and what should be accommodated.

Beaver's model of accommodation, first published in Beaver (1992), was the first to make explicit how accommodation might operate in the satisfaction framework, and on this model accommodation is a type of filtering operation. Beaver suggests that due to uncertainty about what the speaker takes the common ground to be, the hearer has to entertain multiple alternative context sets, with some ranking of which is the most plausible. All these alternative contexts are updated simultaneously. Accommodation is then what happens when the update is not defined on what was previously considered to be the most plausible context, in which case the hearer drops that context from contention. What remains is a new set of contexts in which the most plausible one is a context that has been successfully updated. For example, a hearer who was not certain about whether the speaker took there to be a king would represent contexts where there was a king, and contexts where there was not. Regardless of which the hearer took initially to be more plausible, updating with (24) would then cause contexts in which there was no king to be thrown out, leaving only contexts in which there was a king.

Though we will not go into detail here, we should note that Beaver's proposal is one of several attempts to deal with the conditionalized presuppositions that arise in satisfaction accounts and other theories (such as Strong and Middle Kleene). See the discussion in Beaver (2001), the earlier solution to the problem of conditionalized presuppositions offered by Karttunen and Peters (1979), the criticisms by Geurts (1996); Geurts (1999a), and recent discussion of van Rooij (2007), Singh (2007) and Rothschild (2008).

4.3.3 Presupposition and anaphora

While a number of authors have noted that presuppositions behave in some respects like anaphors (e.g., Kripke 2009 and Soames 1989), it was van der van der Sandt (1989; 1992) who brought out the connection the most forcefully. He noted that for every case where a pronoun is interpreted anaphorically, but is not interpretable as a bound variable, a similar configuration is possible with presuppositions.[18] Thus in each of the following quadruples, the (a) and (b) cases exemplify a phenomenon, while the (c) and (d) cases show that a slight divergence from the original configurations (ie. those in (a) and (b)), produces infelicity. But also, the (a) and (c) examples include an anaphoric pronoun (“it”), and the (b) and (d) examples include the factive verb “knows”, triggering a presupposition that its propositional complement is true (i.e., that Fred left). So anaphora is felicitous in configurations in which presuppositions are felicitous, and anaphora is infelicitous in configurations in which presuppositions are infelicitous. It seems reasonable to conclude that connections between anaphoric pronouns and their antecedents on the one hand, and presupposition triggers and their antecedents on the other, are sensitive to very similar configurational requirements.

Inter-sentential (discourse) anaphora
There was a storm. It was fierce.
Fred left. Mary knows that Fred left.
#It was fierce. There was a storm.
#Mary knows that Fred left. Fred left.
Donkey anaphora
If a farmer owns a donkey then he beats it.
If Fred left then Mary knows that Fred left.
#If a farmer doesn't own a donkey, then he beats it.
#If Fred didn't leave left then Mary knows that Fred left.
Modal subordination
A wolf might come to the door. It would eat you.
Fred might have left. Mary would know that Fred has left.
#A wolf might come to the door. It's brown.
#Fred might have left. Mary knows that Fred has left.
Bathroom anaphora
Either there's no bathroom in this house, or else it's in a funny place.
Either Fred didn't leave, or else Mary knows that he left.
#Either there is a bathroom, or else it's in a funny place.
Either Fred left, or else Mary knows that he left.

In order to account for these parallels, van der Sandt proposed a unified treatment of presupposition and anaphora, extending Discourse Representation Theory so as to deal with both phenomena (see the SEP entry on DRT for an introduction). Presupposed information is information that is presented as given, and in van der Sandt's theory this means that presuppositions want to have discourse referents to bind to. However, whereas anaphoric pronouns are rarely interpretable in the absence of a suitable antecedent, the same does not hold for all presupposition-inducing expressions. For instance, a speaker may felicitously assert that he met “Fred's sister” even if he knows full well that his audience wasn't aware that Fred has a sister. In such cases, presuppositions are generally accommodated, which is to say that the hearer accepts the information as given, and revises his representation of the context accordingly. Accommodation, thus understood, is a form of exploitation in Grice's sense: the purpose of presuppositional expressions is to signal that this or that information is given, and if some information is new but not particularly interesting or controversial (like the fact that somebody has a sister) the speaker may choose to “get it out of the way” by presuppositional means.

Van der Sandt's theory incorporates the notion of accommodation as follows. Presuppositions, according van der Sandt, introduce information that prefers to be linked to discourse referents that are already available in the hearer's representation of the discourse, and in this respect they are like pronouns. Van der Sandt in fact uses the term binding to refer to configurations in which presuppositions have antecedents in the DRS, thus generalizing the standard notion of a bound pronoun to cases involving multiple discourse referents. However, if a suitable discourse antecedent is not available, a new one will be accommodated, and the presupposition is linked to that. Generally speaking, accommodation is not an option in the interpretation of pronouns, and one reason that has been suggested for this is that a pronoun's descriptive content is relatively poor (see Section 5.1 for discussion). Being told that “she” is wonderful is not particularly helpful if it isn't clear who the pronoun is meant to refer to. By contrast, if the speaker refers to “Pedro's sister” there is more to go on, and accommodation becomes feasible. Hence, van der Sandt hypothesizes that pronouns are a special class of presuppositional expressions: while all presupposition triggers prefer to be linked to antecedents, pronouns almost always must be linked to antecedents, because they are descriptively attenuated, and therefore cannot be construed by way of accommodation (see below for further discussion of the last point).

To get a better idea how this is supposed to work, let us consider an example with several presupposition triggers:

If Fred is gay, then his son is gay, too.

This sentence contains the definite NP “his son”, which in its turn contains the pronoun “his”, and the focus particle “too”. Assuming the pronoun's antecedent is “Fred”, the definite NP triggers the presupposition that Fred has a son, while the focus particle triggers the presupposition that someone other than Fred's son is gay. Note that in this example the presupposition triggered by the definite NP is “inherited” by the sentence as a whole, while the one triggered by “too” is not: normally speaking, an utterance of (30) would license the inference that (according to the speaker) Fred has a son, but not that someone else besides Fred's son is gay.

Van der Sandt's theory accounts for these observations as follows. We suppose that the grammar assigns (30) the intermediate semantic representation in (31) [a]. Here [ u1,…, um: φ1,…,φn] is a simple Discourse Representation Structure in linear form, with u1,…, um a list of discourse markers, and φ1,…,φn a list of conditions on those markers; connectives like ⇒ are used to build up complex conditions. We assume for convenience that most interpretative problems have been cleared out of the way already, and that the only thing that remains to be done is resolve the presuppositions triggered by “his”, “his son” and “too”, which are flagged by Beaver's (1992) trigger symbol, ∂.

[x: Fred(x), [: gay(x)] ⇒ [: ∂[z: ∂[y:], z is y's son], gay(z), ∂[u: uz, gay(u)]]]
…binding y to x…
[x: Fred(x), [: gay(x)] ⇒ [: ∂[z: z is x's son], gay(z), ∂[u: uz, gay(u)]]]
…accommodating x…
[x, z: Fred(x), z is x's son, [: gay(x)] ⇒ [: gay(z), ∂[u: uz, gay(u)]]]
…binding u to x
[x, z: Fred(x), z is x's son, [: gay(x)] ⇒ [: gay(z), xz]]

(31a) is the initial semantic representation associated with (30), in which three presuppositions remain to be resolved. The first of these, triggered by the pronoun “his”, is bound to the discourse referent representing Fred, which results in (31b). The second presupposition, that Fred has a son, cannot be bound, and therefore must be interpreted by way of accommodation. Van der Sandt's theory, like Heim's (Heim, 1983), stipulates that accommodation at the global level, as shown in (31c), is preferred to accommodation at other sites, as will be discussed in section 5.1, below. Finally, the presupposition triggered by the focus particle can be bound in the antecedent of the conditional; after simplification, this results in (31d), which represents the most natural way of interpreting (30).

5. Current issues in presupposition theory

5.1 Accommodation

Accommodation was first discussed by Karttunen (1974) and Stalnaker (1974), though only named as such by Lewis (1979). Karttunen introduces the concept as follows:

Ordinary conversation does not always proceed in the ideal orderly fashion described earlier. People do make leaps and shortcuts by using sentences whose presuppositions are not satisfied in the conversational context. This is the rule rather than the exception […] I think we can maintain that a sentence is always taken to be an increment to a context that satisfies its presuppositions. If the current conversational context does not suffice, the listener is entitled and expected to extend it as required. (Karttunen 1974: 191)

If this looks reasonably straightforward, the reader should be warned that accommodation is among the more contentious topics in presupposition theory.

To begin with, there are various notions of accommodation, some of which are stricter than others. To explain, consider the following example by Heim (1982):

John read a book about Schubert and wrote to the author.

In order to determine the intended meaning of “the author”, the hearer has to infer (i) that there is an author and (ii) that the said author wrote the book read by John. Whereas on a broad understanding of accommodation, all of this is accommodated, on a strict construal only (i) is, and (ii) is a bridging inference. This is not just a matter of terminology. If we choose to be strict, we can argue that there is something like an “accommodation module”, which as such has nothing to do with world knowledge; whereas if the notion is construed more broadly, accommodation is of a piece with bridging. To facilitate the following discussion, we will adopt a strict notion of accommodation, and take the naive view that what is accommodated is the presupposition as triggered by, e.g., a definite NP or factive verb.

With these preliminaries out of the way, we turn to the first major question: Where are presuppositions accommodated? Though it may seem odd at first, this question is inescapable if we assume, as is standard in dynamic semantics, that an expression may occur in several contexts at the same time (cf. Section 4.3.2). To illustrate, consider the following:

(c0) Maybe (c1) Betty is trying to give up drinking.
(c0) Maybe (c1) Wilma thinks that (c2) her husband is having an affair.

Here c0 refers to the global context in which a given sentence is uttered, and c1and c2 are auxiliary, or local, contexts. In (33a), the modal “maybe” creates an auxiliary context of possible states of affairs in which Betty is trying to give up drinking; the same, mutatis mutandis, for (33b). Now, the presupposition triggered in (33a), that Betty used to drink, can be accommodated globally, i.e., in c0, or locally, in c1. In the former case, the utterance is construed as meaning that Betty used to drink and may be trying to kick the habit; in the latter, it conveys that, possibly, Betty used to drink and is trying to give up drinking. Likewise, in (33b), the presupposition that Wilma is married may be accommodated globally, or locally in the most deeply embedded context. But here there is a third option, as well: if the presupposition is accommodated in c1, the sentence is read as “Maybe Wilma is married and she thinks that her husband is having an affair”, and we speak of intermediate accommodation.

It is widely agreed that the following empirical generalization, made explicit by Heim (1983), is correct:

PGA:  Global accommodation is preferred to non-global accommodation.

In the examples in (33b) the PGA (preference for global accommodation) clearly holds: non-global interpretations may be possible, but they require special contexts. One such context may be that the presupposition contains a variable which is bound by a quantifier:

Most Germans wash their cars on Saturday.

In (34), with the possessive presupposition trigger “their cars”, there is a global context (outside of the scope of “most”), a local context corresponding to the scope of the quantifier (occupied by the VP “wash their cars on Saturday”), and also an intermediate context in the restrictor of the quantifier (occupied by “Germans”). The most natural interpretation of this sentence surely is that most Germans who own a car wash it on Saturday. So in this case intermediate accommodation seems to be the preferred option, and this might be explained, following van der Sandt (1992), by supposing that the possessive pronoun contains a variable bound by the quantifier.

There are other cases where intermediate accommodation is virtually impossible:

(c0) If (c1) Fred is coming to the reception, (c2) he may (c3) bring his wife.

It is quite unlikely that this may be construed, with intermediate accommodation in c1, which is the antecedent of the conditional, as “If Fred is married and is coming to the reception, he may bring his wife.” More generally, we don't know of any clear-cut cases (i.e., cases in which accommodation is not forced by independent contextual factors) in which a presupposition triggered in the consequent of a conditional is accommodated in the antecedent.

The picture is rather confusing. While in some cases, e.g., (33b) or (34), intermediate accommodation seems possible and sometimes even preferred, in other cases it doesn't seem possible at all. And things get even more confused than this. Thus far, we have taken our examples at face value, but some authors have argued that we shouldn't because, as a matter of fact, intermediate accommodation doesn't exist. For instance, according to Beaver (2001), the presupposition in (34) is taken as evidence that the topic of conversation is car-owning Germans, and it is this topic that restricts the domain of the quantifier, making intermediate accommodation redundant. See also von Fintel (1995) and Geurts and van der Sandt (1999) for discussion.

Returning to the uncontested PGA, let us ask how it can be explained. Oddly enough, although virtually all theories of presupposition projection accept that the PGA holds, there haven't been that many attempts at explanation. One candidate is what Beaver (2001) calls the “Atlas Principle”, after Atlas (1976):

AP: One accommodation alternative is preferred to another if the former yields a stronger meaning than the latter (i.e., if the first meaning unilaterally entails the second).

Advocates of the Atlas Principle include, besides its eponym, Yeom (1998), Zeevat (1999), and Blutner (2000). One thing to note about the Atlas Principle is that it does not necessarily vindicate the PGA across the board: while the predictions made by the Atlas Principle will tend to comply with the PGA, they don't have to. However, it is surprisingly difficult to say where exactly the Atlas Principle deviates from the PGA, because this depends on various extraneous factors; see Geurts (2000) for discussion.

A major worry about the Atlas Principle is that it is ad hoc. Despite its soothing resemblance to Grice's second Quantity Maxim, it is questionable whether hearers generally prefer stronger interpretations to weaker ones. This suggests that the Atlas Principle may not be justified as an instance of a more general constraint, and is therefore stipulative. The sad and somewhat embarrassing truth seems to be that, thus far, we don't really know why the PGA should hold.

One last issue we would like to mention is that accommodation isn't always equally easy (or hard). For example:

Fred is looking for the person.
Wilma is pregnant, too.

In (36a) the presupposition triggered by “the person” clearly requires a salient discourse referent to hook on to; the sentence would be infelicitous when uttered out of the blue. The same goes for the presupposition triggered by “too” in (36b), viz. that some salient person different from Wilma is pregnant. This sentence would be very peculiar when uttered out of the blue, or in any context where no salient person was under discussion who could be pregnant. Put otherwise: unlike the presuppositions we have seen thus far, it is very hard to deal with the presuppositions of “the person” or “too” by accommodation alone.[19] Why should this be so?

As discussed in Section 4.3.3, van der Sandt (1992) proposes that presuppositions whose descriptive content is relatively poor are hard to accommodate. This generalization is borne out by pronouns, names, and semantically attenuate definite NPs like “the person”. However, it is not very clear what “relatively poor” means. Definite NPs like “the water molecule” or “the lonely carpenter” don't strike us as particularly poor, but may be hard to interpret by way of accommodation. Similarly, the presuppositions associated with “too” may be quite rich, and nevertheless they are generally hard to accommodate. Geurts and van der Sandt (2004) propose to account for the latter by adopting Heim's (1992) idea that the presupposition triggered by “too” contains a pronominal element, which blocks accommodation, but this proposal has been criticised by Beaver and Zeevat (2007). Be this as it may, it seems clear that van der Sandt's generalization cannot be read as biconditional: even if poor presuppositions are difficult to accommodate, the reverse doesn't always hold.

Another problem with van der Sandt's generalization is that it is not clear how it can be justified. Even if it somehow makes sense that lack of descriptive content should make accommodation hard, we would like to know more precisely why this should be so. A possible answer to this question may be found in the work on definites by Hawkins (1978), Clark and Marshall (1981), Heim (1982), and others. As Heim observes, “accommodation in response to definites is not normally a matter of adding just the minimal amount of information that would restore felicity.” (Heim 1982, p. 372) It seems plausible that this holds for accommodation generally, and it arguably follows from the nature of accommodation. If a presupposition is to be interpreted by way of accommodation, new information is presented as if it were given, and it has often been observed that this will only work if the information is not contentious or otherwise remarkable. That is to say, it should always be possible to integrate the new information into the common ground: it has to be linked to what is already given. This will be hard with semantically attenuate NPs like “the thing” or pronouns like “he”, but also with richer definites whose content cannot readily be linked to anything in the common ground. Nevertheless, it will generally be easy with richer presuppositions, not because they have more content, but simply because they are more likely to contain anchors into the common ground.

5.2 Presupposition failure

What happens when a presupposition is false? The textbook story goes as follows. According to Frege (1892), if an expression A suffers from presupposition failure, then any sentence containing A will lack a truth value; Russell (1905) famously denied this, holding that such a sentence will always be true or false; and then Strawson (1950) reaffirmed Frege's position, more or less. What is less well known is that in subsequent work, Strawson partly recanted his initial view and came to doubt that presupposition failure invariably entails lack of truth value.

Taking a closer look at how speakers actually assess a sentence, Strawson's (1964) paper argues that presupposition failure may but need not cause a sentence to be infelicitous. Two of his examples are the following:

Jones spent the morning at the local swimming pool.
The exhibition was visited yesterday by the king of France.

If there is no swimming pool locally, it is “natural enough”, according to Strawson, to say that (37a) is false, and since the king of France doesn't exist, the same applies to (37b). And if these sentences are false, their negations must be true. So, if these subtle judgments are accepted, these are cases in which presupposition failure does not prevent us from saying that a sentence is true or false. But Strawson hasn't changed his mind about Russell's example:

Confronted with the classical example, “The king of France is bald”, we may well feel it natural to say, straight off, that the question whether the statement is true or false doesn't arise because there is no king of France. (Strawson 1964: 90)

Strawson goes on to observe, however, that speakers who subscribe to this judgment may want to reconsider their verdict if the context is set up the right way. For instance, if Russell's sentence is used to answer the question, “What examples, if any, are there of famous contemporary figures who are bald?”, we may be more inclined to say that the answer is simply false.

Strawson's explanation for these facts is given in terms of topicality. The most likely purpose of a sentence like (37a) is to describe what Jones has been doing in the morning, rather than, say, who the local swimming pool was visited by. That is, in the absence of further information about the context in which this sentence is uttered, its topic will be Jones's exploits. Similarly, a sentence like (37b) will normally be used to convey information about the exhibition. If so, although the sentence purports to refer to the king of France, it is not about him; the king of France is not the topic of discourse, nor part of the topic. Strawson's suggestion is that this circumstance influences the way presupposition failure is dealt with. On this view, presupposition failure results in infelicity only if it affects the topic of a sentence; otherwise the sentence will be judged true or false, as appropriate.

One of the appealing features of this analysis is that it takes into account the context-dependence of speakers' intuitions. As Strawson notes, Russell's sentence (38) will by default be construed as being about the king of France, whence a strong tendency to judge the sentence infelicitous.

The king of France is bald.

If, however, the discourse is about royal baldness in general, for instance, the grammatical subject of (38) is used to say something about that topic, and Strawson's account predicts that the sentence is more likely to be judged false, which seems correct. Another observation that neatly falls into place is that word order may have an effect on speakers' intuitions about presupposition failure. As Strawson observes, if we compare (37b) with (39), where the defective description is in subject position, we would be “a shade more squeamish” to say that the sentence is simply false (p. 91). This is precisely what one should expect if speakers' intuitions were topic-dependent.

The king of France visited the exhibition yesterday.

Assuming that Strawson's observations are correct, should we say (a) that non-topical definites are non-presuppositional, or (b) that they do have presuppositions, whose failure happens not to affect speakers' truth-value judgments? Some authors argue for the former (e.g., Reinhart 1982, Horn 1989); this is Strawson's view, as well. Von Fintel (2004) argues for the latter: topical or non-topical, “the king of France” always triggers the presupposition that there is a king of France; it's just our truth-value judgments that fluctuate.

Von Fintel's position is in line with what in theories of projection has been a working hypothesis for many years. According to these theories, presuppositions are never really cancelled: if a presupposition seems to disappear, it is because it projects to a non-global context. It bears emphasising that this view is not irrevocably linked to these theories. It's just that there is no need to assume that there are part-time presupposition triggers (in a sense we expand upon in section 5.4 below), because non-global projection can be relied upon to explain why presuppositions sometimes seem to disappear. However, this working hypothesis may have to be reassessed if we want to account for Strawson's observations, which might be taken to show that presuppositions are cancellable not only in complex sentences but in simple sentences, as well.

So far we've only talked about definite descriptions. Some other triggers show similar variability, but not all of them do. On the one hand, the domain presuppositions associated with strong quantifiers like “all” and “most” behave very much like definite presuppositons (de Jong and Verkuyl 1985, Lappin and Reinhart 1988, Geurts 2007). For example, when uttered out of the blue, (40) will sound odd, but when proffered in response to Strawson's question, “What examples, if any, are there of famous contemporary figures who are bald?”, it seems more likely to be judged false:

All South-American monarchs are bald.

On the other hand, consider the following:

#BENEDICT XVI is the incumbent pope, too.
#Carnap managed to be born on May 18, 1891.

Given that there is only one incumbent pope and that it can't have taken Carnap any effort to be born on May 18, 1891, both (41a) and (41b) suffer from presupposition failure. But if someone who knew that there was only one incumbent pope uttered (41a), it would not seem entirely natural to say that they had lied. One might even say that these sentences are true, and this intuition does not seem to be topic dependent. The reason for this may be that the presuppositions in question are incidental to the primary content of these sentences.

5.3 Presuppositions and attitudes

For nearly four decades, the Holy Grail of presupposition research has been to explain the behavior of presuppositional expressions occurring in embedded positions. Given that the theoretically most challenging mode of embedding is within the scope of an attitude verb, one might expect that the interaction between presuppositions and attitude verbs should have received a lot of attention. But it hasn't. And it can't be because this topic doesn't pose any problems—on the contrary.

Already the data are problematic. If we embed a presupposition trigger under, e.g., “believe”, we observe two types of inference. This is seen in the following examples, where “→” indicates that there is an inference, but of unspecified type:

Barney believes that his sister is drunk.
→ Barney has a sister.
→ Barney believes he has a sister.
Wilma believes that Barney knows that his sister is drunk.
→ Barney's sister is drunk.
→ Wilma believes that Barney's sister is drunk.

Both inferences are fairly robust, and both seem to exhibit projection behavior, as we illustrate here by applying various embedding tests to (42):

Barney doesn't believe that his sister is drunk.
Perhaps Barney believes that his sister is drunk.
If Barney has a sister, then he believes that his sister is drunk.
If Barney believes that he has a sister, then he also believes that his sister is drunk.

It is natural to infer from both sentences in (44) that Barney has a sister and that he believes that he has a sister, and these inferences can be blocked in sentences such as those in (45) , where “his sister” occurs in the consequent of conditional whose antecedent makes one or the other inference explicit. It may seem odd at first that (45a) should block the inference that Barney believes that he has a sister, while (45b) blocks the inference that Barney has a sister. Note however that, generally speaking, Barney has a sister iff he believes that he has a sister. We'll return to this theme below.

Interestingly, literally the same pattern of observations holds for other attitude verbs, like “want” for example:

Barney wants to phone his sister.
→ Barney has a sister.
→ Barney believes he has a sister.

The puzzling thing is that (46) does not license the inference that Barney wants to have a sister, but rather that he believes that he has one.

So, in many cases at least, a presupposition φ triggered within the scope of “x VA…”, where VA is an attitude verb, gives rise to two inferences with a candidature for presuppositional status: (a) that φ and (b) that x believes φ. Hence, we have three possible ways of proceeding, all of which have been defended in the literature:

  1. Both inferences are presuppositions (Zeevat 1992, at least for certain triggers).
  2. Only φ is a presupposition (Gazdar 1979a; van der Sandt 1988; Geurts 1998).
  3. Only “x believes that φ” is a presupposition (Karttunen 1974; Heim 1992).

The first strategy seems to require a stipulation that certain presuppositions have to be accommodated twice, once inside a belief context, and once outside, and such a strategy is difficult to motivate. On the other hand, for (ii) and (iii), there is the obvious problem that if we adopt either one of them, we only account for half of the observed inferences. How to explain the other half? Three possible answers to this question have been discussed in the literature, mainly by Heim (1992):

  1. De re construal (Heim 1992) What at first looks like a presupposition projecting to the global context may in fact be due to a de re construal of the presupposition trigger. This solution has several serious drawbacks. In particular, it hard to see how this proposal can give us both inferences at the same time, rather than one (de re) or the other (presupposition). For this and other reasons (see Geurts 1998), we will not consider it any further.
  2. Exportation (Karttunen 1974, Heim 1992, Kay 1992) If Barney believes that he has a sister, then it may plausibly be inferred that he has a sister. Therefore, if it is presupposed that Barney believes that he has a sister, then it may plausibly be inferred that he has a sister.
  3. Importation (Heim 1992, Geurts 1998) If Barney has a sister, then it may plausibly be inferred that he believes that he has a sister. Therefore, if it is presupposed that Barney has a sister, then it may plausibly be inferred that he believes that he has a sister.

If our presupposition theory predicts that the inferences projected from “x VA” are of the form “x believes that φ”, then we can appeal to exportation to explain why φ is inferable, as well. Vice versa, a theory which predicts that φ is presupposed can use importation for deriving “x believes that φ”. So we have two options:

x believes that φ φ
Option A importation presupposition
Option B presupposition exportation

Which is it going to be? That's a hard question, which raises various issues, only some of which we can mention here. First, it should be noted that, whereas for theories of the satisfaction family it is hard to avoid making the prediction that presuppositions projected from attitude contexts are of the form “x believes that φ”, DRT-style theories are more flexible, and can predict either this or that the presupposition is simply φ. In other words, satisfaction theories are more constrained (which is good), but therefore practically forced to resort to Option B.

One of the issues that need to be addressed is that of the true nature of importation and exportation inferences. It seems reasonable to assume that, generally speaking, people's beliefs are consistent with the facts, and that we tend to assume by default that this is the case. But even if this much is true, it is most unlikely that, by default, people will infer φ from “x believes φ” (for arbitrary x and φ), or vice versa. Whatever importation and exportation are, they aren't general heuristics; rather, these inferences are almost certainly dependent on the context to some degree.

Bearing this in mind, we proceed to illustrate the kind of issues that arise when A-type and B-type theories are pitted against each other. Let's consider the following example from Heim (1992), focusing our attention on the reading of (47a) which implies (47b) as well as (47c) (which is also the most natural one, in our view):

John believes that it has stopped raining.
It was raining.
John believes it was raining.

According to an A-type theory, (47a) presupposes (47b), from which (47c) is inferred by means of importation. How plausible is this inference? Note, first, that this inference may not be needed, for it may be argued that (47c) is entailed by (47a) , in which case there is no issue about importation to begin with. On the other hand, it may be that, once (47b) has projected out, (47a) is left to mean something like:

There was a raining event e and John believes that e has stopped.

Now the question becomes: given that (47b) is presupposed and (48) is true, how likely is it that (47c) is true, as well? Quite likely, in our view. Granted, it is possible to imagine a scenario in which something that was in fact rain is believed by John to have stopped, even if he doesn't believe that it was rain. But surely this would be a pretty unusual state of affairs. Hence, the A-type approach seems quite plausible in this case.

Things are somewhat different for B-type theories. Here the question to ask is: Given that (47c) is presupposed and that (47a) is true, how likely is it that (47b) is true, as well? Possibly, it could be argued that, since it is presupposed that John believes that it was raining, it would be surprising if it wasn't raining. One problem with this proposal is that it is not in general the case that presupposing someone's belief in some proposition leads to the inference that the proposition is true. For example, (49), in which a belief statement is embedded under a factive verb, seems to presuppose that John thinks it is raining, and not that it is raining. So, at least in this case, the A-type importation account seems to be on stronger ground.

Mary knows that John thinks it is raining.

5.4 Part-time triggers

As we mentioned in §5.2 theories of presupposition projection tend to adopt the working hypothesis that presuppositions are associated with expression types: if an expression α triggers a presupposition φ, then φ will always be triggered by α. This is just a matter of economy: since a projection theory already provides a mechanism for explaining how presuppositions, once triggered, can seem to disappear, there is no need for supposing that there are part-time presupposition triggers. Indeed, it would be a bit of a nuisance if it turned out that that some expressions or constructions trigger their presuppositions on a part-time basis, because then we would have two ways of explaining why a given presupposition fails to appear: either it has projected to an embedded context or it wasn't triggered in the first place.

Are there compelling reasons for believing that there are part-time triggers? Not as far as we know. There are suggestive facts, though. The following example by Fauconnier (1985) is one. A and B are sitting in a bar observing a stranger who doesn't seem to be too happy:

A: I wonder why that guy is looking so glum.
B: Maybe his girlfriend jilted him.

The most natural interpretation of B's answer, in this context, is that it is possible that the stranger has a girlfriend who has jilted him; this construal will require local accommodation of the girlfriend if we assume that “his girlfriend” always triggers the presupposition that the pronoun's referent has a girlfriend.[20] The problem, according to some authors, is that if this is local accommodation, then it's too easy. Accommodation, according to these authors, is supposed to be hard, and therefore they prefer to assume that, in cases like (50), no presupposition is triggered to begin with. But why should accommodation be hard? The reason that is usually given is that accommodation is dispreferred, but that is not entirely convincing. Inferior coffee is dispreferred, too, yet it is easier to obtain than decent coffee. Examples like (50) may be suggestive, but they don't prove much.

There must be better ways of arguing that part-time triggers exist. For instance, if we could explain why this or that expression triggers such and such a presupposition, one of the corollaries might be that the expression in question is a part-time trigger. To see how such an argument might go, consider the presuppositions associated with aspectual verbs like “start” or “stop”:

Jill has started smoking pot.
→ Jill didn't use to smoke pot.
Jill has stopped smoking pot.
→ Jill used to smoke pot.

Aspectual verbs describe a transition from one state to another, and it is always the first state that is presupposed, as the standard projection tests will confirm. This is unlikely to be an accident, and the explanation might be sought in the fact that interlocutors are more interested in where the story is going than where it came from, and therefore tend to take the past as given. If a transition is described, the past state is in a sense demoted because we are more interested in the present and the future. The idea would be, of course, that demoted information is presupposed. This is admittedly vague, but if it is on the right track, then it is plausible to assume that it may depend on the context what parts of semantic content are demoted, which would imply that it may depend on the context whether or not a given presupposition is triggered. Examples like the following could then be explained along the same lines:

If anyone stops smoking before July 1, they are eligible for a payment from the Tobacco Indemnity Fund. (Example adapted from Abusch 2002.)

On a classical account, the aspectual verb triggers the presupposition that x used to smoke, which has to be accommodated locally, presumably because x is bound by “anyone”, as suggested by van der Sandt (1992). But it is also conceivable that there was no presupposition to begin with.

6. Concluding remarks

We have presented an overview of the major strands of work on presupposition. But we have not considered the question of whether presupposition triggers form a natural class in the first place: maybe all presupposition triggers are not alike. Like the topics discussed in the last section, this is a possibility that has only just begun to be explored in detail, with several authors proposing to dichotomize presupposition triggers in some way or other (e.g., Zeevat 1992, Geurts 1999b, Abusch 2002).

Our own suspicion, if we may end on an opinionated note, is that these first attempts to separate presupposition types from each other may turn out to be too cautious. There are several philosophically and linguistically interesting dimensions along which the set of presupposition triggers can be partitioned, such as referentiality, anaphoricity, ease of accommodation, ease of cancellation, and maintenance of truth under presupposition failure. So perhaps what will eventually emerge is not a straightforward dichotomy, but a more complex taxonomy of different types of trigger. And at that point, perhaps we may re-ask the question of whether the things that the different so-called “presupposition triggers” are triggering are in fact presuppositions, in any of the theoretical senses of the term “presupposition” that we have considered in this article.


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The authors would like to thank Dan Velleman for initially converting the article to html, and the editorial team at SEP for extensive help and advice with both content and form. Beaver's work was supported by NSF award 0952862 Semantics and Pragmatics of Projective Meaning across Languages, by NSF award 0904913 Modeling Discourse and Social Dynamics in Authoritarian Regimes, by BAA DCHC-BAA-000101 Tracking Secretive Behavior through Word Use, and by the NYCT TeXIT project.

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