Practical Reason and the Structure of Actions

First published Wed Aug 24, 2005; substantive revision Mon Mar 26, 2012

A wave of recent philosophical work on practical rationality is organized by the following implicit argument: Practical reasoning is figuring out what to do; to do is to act; so the forms of practical inference can be derived from the structure or features of action. Now it is not as though earlier work in analytic philosophy had failed to register the connection between action and practical rationality; in fact, practical reasoning was usually picked out as, roughly, reasoning directed toward action. But for much of the twentieth century, attention moved quickly away from this initial delineation of the subject area, to the interplay of beliefs and desires within the mind (instrumentalist theories, including their Davidsonian and Williamsian variants), or to procedures for checking that a plan of action was supported by sufficient yet consistent reasons (Kantian theories), or to the ultra-refined sensibilities of the practically intelligent reasoner (Aristotelian theories). The hallmark of the emerging family of treatments to be surveyed here is, first, the sustained attention paid to answering the question, “What does it take to be an action (at all)?”, and second, the use made of a distinction between full-fledged action and its lesser relatives; characterizations and terminology vary, but often the less robust alternative is called “mere activity” or “mere behavior”. Very schematically, these arguments for a theory of practical reasoning try to show that reasons brought to bear on choice must have some particular logical form, if action is not to lapse into something less than that.

The current state of the dialectic is evidently transitional, because work of this sort for the most part does not yet speak to other work of the same kind (although it does speak to earlier but differently focused work in the field). Despite their shared agreement that practical reasoning is where the action is, and the consequent willingness to accord explanatory priority to action theory in developing theories of practical rationality, these theorists differ among themselves as to what the most central features of actions are, and accordingly they disagree about what the legitimate patterns of practical inference turn out to be. They also differ in their underlying philosophical motivations, as well as in what they take to be the upshots of their views for substantive moral theory. For that reason, the considerations in play do not have the sort of mutual coherence and organization characteristic of the discussion of some of the more settled philosophical problem spaces.

The purpose of this overview is to provide a map of this territory, and because interchanges between the theorists in it are infrequent, this is primarily going to mean describing the disparate research programs that have adopted its framing argument. Because the priority is to highlight both their common ground, and the ways in which these programs nonetheless talk past one another, this article will not press a number of problems internal to the several research programs. If you notice some obvious but unaddressed objection to some line of inquiry, don't assume you're making a mistake, but don't let it sidetrack you.

The features of action that have come in for the most attention are, first, its calculative structure, second, its attributability, third, its role in social practice, and fourth, its evaluative features, and they will be discussed in that order. That will permit us to conclude with remarks about the prospects and agenda of this approach to practical deliberation.

1. The Calculative View of Action

The most prominent advocates of the calculative view of action are Candace Vogler and Michael Thompson. We will start with Vogler's version of the view, and proceed to Thompson's.

Call psychologism the claim that the right way to do logic and theory of rationality more generally is first to figure out how the mind works. Since the early seventies, almost all mainstream work on practical reasoning has been psychologistic in this sense; a representative example might be Michael Smith's argument for the ‘Humean theory of motivation’, which turns on what desires — a psychological state — are, and how they work (Smith 1987). Vogler's treatment of practical rationality (Vogler 2002) is a sharp departure from the common approach, and an attempt to replicate in that field the anti-psychologistic turn which Frege and Husserl imparted to work on theoretical rationality in, respectively, the analytic and Continental traditions. She takes herself to be following G. E. M. Anscombe (Anscombe 1985, Vogler 2001), who was in turn following Aquinas. (I won't take up the historical background to the body of work under discussion here, but see the entry on medieval theories of practical reason.)

Vogler notices that instrumentalism — the view that all reasons for action are means-end reasons — is the default view in contemporary philosophy. There must, she infers, be a compelling insight at the bottom of it; but instrumentalism has been much-refuted over the past few decades. What the many refutations of instrumentalism really show, Vogler believes, is that formulating the underlying insight psychologistically (as a thesis about mental operations and the mental states involved in them) results in weak and unsustainable renditions of it. She concludes that in order to articulate what instrumentalism is getting right, you have to strip away the psychologism. The point being emphasized just now is that the motivation for this instance of the turn to action theory is anti-psychologism about practical rationality.

On one familiar reading of Frege (not the only reading, and we'll see an alternative to it shortly), the proper way to do logic is not to look inward, as it were to the gears of the mind, but outward, to the logical relations that hold between suitable abstract objects, and to read the correct inference patterns off of these. In the practical analog of this move, when you look outward, away from the beliefs and desires that preoccupy psychologistic theorists, what you find are actions, the external products of any successful deployment of practical reasons. So the logic of practical reasons is to be read off the structure of actions in something like the way that, say, truth-functional logic is to be read off the truth-functional relations between propositions. This form of anti-psychologism preempts a worry one might have had about what was described at the outset as the organizing argument of the action-oriented approach. The proposal, recall, was to read the inference patterns off the structure of actions; if one were to construe this as reconstructing the process of practical reasoning from its product, how far would the reconstruction be likely to get? (Compare: there are many ways to make a chair; you would not learn much about how chairs are fabricated by thinking about what chairs look like, or even about their conceptually necessary features.) But Vogler's anti-psychologism insists that questions about rationality are not questions about what processes of thought lead up to a decision.

Intentional actions are picked out and segmented into their parts by applications of Anscombe's ‘Why?’-questions. (‘Why are you chopping the nuts?’ ‘I'm making a salad.’) The internal structure of actions is consequently a series of steps towards a termination point (or ‘end’), a place where the action stops. When you make Deborah Madison's persimmon and hazelnut salad, you first coarsely chop the nuts; then you thinly slice three Fuyu persimmons crosswise and put them in a bowl along with the nuts; then you add in three handfuls of trimmed watercress; then you toss with the dressing — and you're done. A step can be shown to be rational by showing it to be a step on the way to the termination point of the action that you are in the course of performing. A step can be shown to be irrational by showing that it's not: for instance, if you've finished making the salad, but you obsessively keep chopping nuts. Vogler allows that there may be atomic actions, actions that do not have further actions as their parts; perhaps blinking is such an action. But just about any action we care about will be a complex action (i.e., an action that has further actions as parts); and since we don't usually notice what we don't care about, atomic actions, if there are any, are hard to come up with.

Vogler's ‘calculative view’ is accordingly that whenever (or perhaps, almost whenever) you have a reason to do something, you have a calculative reason, that is, a reason whose force is: this is a step toward the termination point of my action. Vogler distinguishes two subclasses: means-end reasons, and part-whole reasons; buying the cress is best thought of as a means to making the salad, whereas chopping the nuts is properly part of making the salad. It is not that she is insisting that there are no other sorts of practical consideration. In fact, she provides what she takes to be an exhaustive list of the logical forms the remaining sorts of considerations can have. (See Millgram 2006 for a brief overview.) Rather, the claim is that when you have a reason of one of these further sorts, you must also have a calculative reason.

The connection only runs one way, however. Since considerations of other sorts organize, modulate and generally control actions, they presuppose calculative reasons. But calculative structures (and the reasons they give you) do not presuppose these other sorts of consideration: you can just tie your shoes, and Vogler regards theories on which such actions must be informed by, for example, a large-scale conception of the good as modeling rationality on a psychopathology akin to paranoia. This asymmetry is what Vogler takes to be the deep insight underlying instrumentalism. Because any action large enough to be something we care about must, if it is to work, be calculatively well-formed, the means-end/part-whole articulation of actions is nonoptional, and consequently, we have to pay due attention to calculative reasons. We cannot shrug off others' criticism of our calculative reasons, as we can shrug off their criticism of, say, our pleasures. Calculative reasons are thus nonoptional, or binding.

This appeal to the structure of action as the foundation for practical rationality has dramatic consequences for substantive moral theory, and an easy way to see how is to consider a terminological puzzle raised by Vogler's presentation. She argues that her view is internalist; Bernard Williams introduced the contrast between internal and external reasons via the connection, on the one hand, or lack of it, on the other, between reasons and an agent's motivational states (Williams 1981); motivational states are part of an agent's psychology; so how can an anti-psychologistic position like Vogler's be avowedly internalist? The answer to the terminological question has to do with Williams's own philosophical development. Following Korsgaard's attack on his view (Korsgaard 1996, ch. 11), Williams began (albeit without announcing the changeover) to use ‘internalism’ for the claim that reasons for action can differ from person to person; there's no level, however deep, at which they must be the same. (Williams 1995, which gives a still-psychologistic example: the alcoholic has a reason to lock up his liquor cabinet and throw away the key; the virtuous person does not; the explanation is that their characters rather than their desires differ.) So Vogler is claiming her view to be internalist in this newer sense: there are no reasons that have to be the same for everybody. Different people have different ends at different times; and since other sorts of reasons, she has argued, are optional, they vary from person to person as well. But if internalism is correct (and this was what had interested Williams in the thesis in the first place), then you can be, as the title of Vogler's book has it, reasonably vicious; immorality of even the most extreme kind need not entail irrationality.

Michael Thompson's equally anti-psychologistic account of calculative rationality (Thompson 2008, Part II) reverses the direction of argument we have observed in Vogler. In the alternative reading of Frege which it uses as a template, what comes first is our grasp of inference; the inferences in the relevant part of the — as Thompson occasionally puts it — “practical Begriffsschrift” have actions as their subject matter. So it is an account of action that is being read off the inference patterns (rather than the other way around), in something like the way that Fregeans of this stripe take us to read the logical form of propositions off our command of truth-functional and quantificational inference. The direction of argument notwithstanding, Thompson belongs to the group of theorists we are considering, in that the objective of the argument is to exploit an account of action in order to establish a thesis about calculative practical reasons, namely, that those reasons are not psychological states such as desires or intentions.

The argumentative strategy is adapted from Sellars (1997, pp. 37–41; it bears comparison to related arguments in Nagel, 1970, pp. 29–31, and Brandom, 2001). A core practice, in this case of reason-giving, is identified, one that adduces only actions (and not psychological states); Thompson then exhibits the point of introducing apparently psychological locutions (such as “because I want to…”) into such a practice. The explanation is supposed to demonstrate that these locutions do not really name anything on the order of desires or intentions, but are rather a roundabout way of conveying information about the progress of an ongoing course of action. We will first describe the way Thompson sets up the core practice, and then briefly reconstruct his argument for non-psychologistic renderings of apparently psychologically oriented reason locutions.

Like Vogler, Thompson uses Anscombian ‘Why?'-questions to pick out intentional actions. He then draws our attention to the way that grammatical aspect figures into their answers. Action descriptions can be either perfective (“I made the salad”) or progressive (“I'm making the salad,” “I was making the salad”). Notice that these grammatical forms are not merely ornamental; they carry different implications. From the perfective “I made a salad,” it follows that at some point there was a salad. From the progressive “I was making a salad,” it doesn't follow: perhaps I was interrupted by a phone call, and never got back to chopping. Thompson demarcates ‘naive rationalizations’ as those which deploy the progressive in placing one action as part of another. (“Why are you chopping the nuts?” “I'm making a salad.”) The contrast is with ‘sophisticated rationalizations’, which seem to invoke psychological states like desires (“I want to make a salad”).

We can imagine a society (call it the action-theoretic state of nature) getting by with only naive rationalization. But there is room for improvement in their practice of calculative reason-giving, and here's a short way to see how. Agents restricted to naive rationalizations will say “I'm Bing because I'm Aing,” when Bing is an action that is a part of Aing, and they are Aing. But such parts of actions often come in sequence, one after another. So such an agent can, at a particular time, be executing a containing action, i.e., Aing, but not executing a subsidiary action, Bing, if Bing is an action that is a part of Aing, but one which comes earlier or later on in the sequence. Now, if, at a particular time, an agent is not executing an action (again, Bing), then when someone asks if he's Bing, he'll say he's not. So it's easy to put agents restricted to naive rationalizations in the position of saying both that they're Bing, and that they're not Bing. (E.g., “I'm Bing because I'm Aing, but I'm not Bing.”) That's potentially confusing.

We can suppose that such agents will adopt devices to obviate the confusion. For instance, they'll learn to say (as we do), “I'm Bing tomorrow.” Against that background, however, “I'm going to B,” “I want to A,” and so on are evidently similar devices, and of a piece with “I'm Bing tomorrow.” Each such locution carries a different sort of additional information. For instance, “I'm going to B” positions one as being in the very preliminary run-up phases of an action; when one says, “I'm going to B because I'm Aing,” one is giving a naive rationalization, but one which registers that the Bing phase of Aing has not yet arrived, even though the reason for the former is that it is part of the latter. Likewise, “I intend to A” places one merely at the planning phase of Aing; “I want to A,” allows that one may be at a pre-planning phase. Briefly, the function of these locutions is to preempt confusion by placing the actions that make up a naive rationalization in their temporal sequence. But once we see that that is their function, the temptation to construe them as invoking psychological states (intentions, desires and so on) is evidently misguided. Desires, in Thompson's Sellarsian view, are a mistake on a par with sense-data; just as the sense-datum theorist treats a linguistic device for hedging one's commitments (“It appears to be…”) as naming a psychological state (a mere appearance), so the belief-desire theorist of practical rationality is treating a linguistic device for sorting out the order of subsidiary actions (“…because I want to…”) as naming a motivating psychological state (a desire).

Like Vogler's calculative view, Thompson's account of calculative practical reasons is motivated by anti-psychologism. Unlike Vogler, however, he is not arguing for restricting the mandatory part of practical rationality to calculative reasons; other parts of Life and Action discuss very different but evidently nonoptional forms of practical inference. Vogler, we saw, was concessive about the possibility of atomic actions; Thompson gives a surprising argument to the effect that all actions have further actions as their proper parts. (See Millgram 2009, sec. 9.4, for a brief reconstruction.) So although the two views are closely related, they also differ on many points.

2. The Authorship View of Action

A second approach takes the essential feature of action to be, not its stepwise structure, but that it is authored; there is no such thing as an action without an owner, in something like the way that there is no such thing as a belief without an owner. The two most developed positions of this kind are due to Christine M. Korsgaard and J. David Velleman.

On Korsgaard's view, what gives an action an owner is that it is attributable to the person as a whole (rather than to a subpersonal part, such as a drive or an especially strong desire). Whole-person attributions require a constitution, a form of psychic organization and regulation that is the smaller-scale analog of the political constitution of a state. Constitutions are made up of the procedures by which actions are to be produced; actions are owned, and so are full-fledged actions, only when they are so produced (Korsgaard 2008, ch. 3, Korsgaard 2009).

The principles of practical rationality are the procedures, at a suitably abstract level of description, of a satisfactory constitution. So, and in contrast to Vogler's view, Korsgaard's theory of practical rationality is psychologistic. Actions have explanatory priority, but actions are the starting point of an argument used to determine the proper structure of an agent's psychology: that is, we ask what psychological structure an agent must have in place for him to be able to author actions. And that psychology in turn determines what the correct forms of practical inference must be. The philosophical motivations of Korsgaard's position are in part forensic: the connection between actions and agents must be such that we can hold agents responsible for what they do. More importantly, however, the account is meant to explain why your reasons are binding: what their ‘normative force’ is.

Here is a first-pass thumbnail sketch of that explanation: We have to act, because anything we do will be an action. Chairs are to sit on, and so a chair you can't sit on is defective; being something you can sit on is a constitutive standard for chairs. Likewise, there are constitutive standards for actions, in just that way; a would-be action that did not conform to them would also be defective. In Korsgaard's view, the question of why an item should conform to the constitutive standards for its type ‘answers itself’ (Korsgaard 2008, p. 61). So if she can show that deploying reasons satisfying one or another requirement is a constitutive standard for action — and the requirements she is going to argue for are Kantian — that will amount to showing why you should act on reasons that satisfy those Kantian requirements. Before we proceed to that argument, notice that we are starting to see how the philosophical motivations of the work we are surveying differ from program to program; the contrast between psychologistic and anti-psychologistic agendas is not the only, or even the most important, dimension of variation.

Korsgaard contrasts acts (such as setting the table) with actions (such as setting the table to be ready before the guests arrive). Her view is that acts and the ends for which they are performed make up an action when they are bound together by a principle, which must be formally universal (e.g., always set the table before the guests arrive). We have already noted that actions must be attributable to agents, and an action is properly an agent's only when it is produced by the agent as a whole. For attribution to be contentful, there must be a real distinction between your actions, on the one hand, and events that resemble actions but are produced by your psychic parts, on the other; we can make out such a distinction only if you identify with a principle of choice, where that is universal in form. (Here I won't reconstruct her arguments for that last claim; Millgram 2011 gives a summary.) Consequently, reasons for action must be universal in form, and this entails, or so Korsgaard argues, the substantive correctness of Kantian moral theory, at any rate that part of it which imposes a universalizability requirement on practical reasons: very roughly, it must be possible for you and everyone else jointly to act on the basis of that universal-in-form principle, without assuring the frustration of the end it mentions. (For further description of Kant's account, see the section on the universal law of nature formula in the entry on Kant's moral philosophy.)

While it's no part of the present task to defend or resist the competing views about action and practical reason under review, in this case the easiest way to get Korsgaard's position into focus is by considering how it can address a handful of worries, and the first of these has already given rise to a small literature. Allow for the moment that actions, understood as Korsgaard proposes, involve constitutive standards. Still, why must we produce actions? The point that anything you do will be an action is likely to be granted only on the thinnest and most minimal reading of what an action is; but we have just seen Korsgaard distinguishing between more minimal ‘acts’ and more ambitiously structured ‘actions’. Actions are constituted by acts together with their ends; why can't you instead act aimlessly, like the characters in Richard Linklater's Slacker? If the penalty is that you will thereby be a defective agent, why can't the slacker shrug off that complaint, perhaps with the remark that agents and actions come with one set of constitutive standards, and slackers and their less-than-actions come with others? Why should the slacker be held to the standards for agency as opposed to those of slackerhood? Korsgaard's argument appears to involve the sleight-of-hand substitution of an ambitious and optional notion of action for a minimal and more plausibly nonoptional one. (For the back and forth, see Enoch 2006, Ferrero 2009, Tubert 2010.)

Korsgaard's response comes in three laps. First, she inherits from Wittgenstein the thought that normativity involves the possibility of correction, and she infers that if there is to be any normativity, it must be possible to be in violation of a standard. Now, you can be counted as in violation of a standard only if you can't simply shrug the correction off. But if you can switch the kind an item counts as belonging to, at will, then you can shrug off any standard and any correction; as Korsgaard puts it, nothing will be defective, ‘everything will just be different.’ (E.g., ‘I've decided I'm not an agent but a slacker, so the standards for agents don't apply to me.’) Thus we must take there to be kinds such that you can't just shrug and say that you don't see why the constitutive standards of the kind apply. This first lap of the argument has the look and feel of an existence proof, and of softening up; in particular, it doesn't purport to show that the twin concepts, ‘action’ and ‘agent,’ are among these privileged kinds (Korsgaard 2009, sec. 2.1.8).

Before turning to the second lap of Korsgaard's response, let's introduce a second worry: that the argument's attempt to exploit the wholeness of the agent, allegedly the essential feature of agency, is taking a wrong turn. Recall Korsgaard's artifactual analogy: a chair is something you sit on, and so a chair is defective when you can't sit on it — and of course it's defective as a whole, because its job, as a whole chair, is to be a seat. For any constitutive standard, it's the thing as a whole that's supposed to live up to the standard; so what's distinctive about one standard or another is what the thing does or is, and not that it does it, or is it, as a whole. If, when it came to understanding chairs, you devoted your theoretical attention to that ‘as a whole,’ as opposed to the seating, something would clearly have gone wrong. (Imagine a theorist of chairs arguing that the constitutive standards for being a chair must be met by the chair as a whole, and thus the essential feature of chairs, and the key to understanding them, is that they hold themselves together.) Why isn't Korsgaard's focus on the shared unity condition some sort of red herring?

But people, Korsgaard claims, are not just like chairs. (Actually, there's a subplot in which she argues that chairs are more like people than you'd think, but here I'm going to leave it to one side.) Chairs don't dissolve into their parts when they're not seating anyone, whereas an agent constitutes itself by acting, or ceases to be an agent entirely. Imagine that Invasion of the Body Snatchers had it almost right: as in the film, pod creatures from outer space are eliminating us one by one, and replacing us with pod-grown impersonators; it is just that the films have gotten the size of the pods wrong. Instead of being as large as a person, each pod is roughly the size of a peapod, and so it takes a great many pod creatures working together to impersonate a single Earthling. (The illustration adapts the argument of Korsgaard 1996, ch. 13, to fit her later use of group agency as a model for individual agency.) If a colony of pod creatures is going to succeed in fooling the remaining Earthlings, it will have to behave as a single person, and to do that, the activities of the different pod creatures must be closely coordinated; after all, if the pod creatures making up the feet go off in one direction, and the pod creatures making up the torso go off in a different direction, no one will be fooled. When the pod creatures act together, and pull off the deception, they make themselves into a collective agent. (One mark of this is the first-person indexical, as when they whisper to each other, ‘We're now going to go off to the left'; their coordination induces a point of view which is not that of any particular one of them.) That's why action has to be generated by you-as-a-whole, rather than your psychic parts.

At this point we can see why you're not supposed to be able to opt for slackerdom. There are things we have to get done, in something like the way that the pod creatures have to fool Aunt Millie into thinking they're her husband Melvin; acting is our ‘plight, the simple inexorable fact of the human condition’ (Korsgaard 2009, sec. 1.1.1). And that means producing actions, not mere acts; you act because there are things you have to get done, and so when you act, you normally have an end in view; to act with an end in view is to perform an action. Acting is constituting yourself as an agent out of your desires and other psychological elements, in much the way that the pod creatures constitute themselves as a group agent. The necessity of agency is not metaphysical but practical. (This amounts to a reply to the objection that the argument for the ineluctability of action involved a sleight of hand: that a series of interlocking definitions, purporting to show that you have no alternative to acting because nothing will count as an alternative to action, could not amount to a reason not to live like a slacker. The objection is misconstruing Korsgaard's argument as turning on definitional rather than practical necessities.)

Now we can further see — although this is a shortcut rather than the argument — why constituting oneself as an agent involves endorsing a principle. Suppose one of the pod creatures whispers to its nearby fellows, ‘Off to the left!’ If enough of them follow to tilt the ersatz Uncle Melvin leftwards, was that an action, attributable to the group agent, or just that one pod creature momentarily getting its way? Suppose a moment later a different pod creature whispers ‘Off to the right!’ and ersatz Melvin teeters back; Aunt Millie will notice that something is amiss. To avoid this sort of back and forth, the pod creatures collectively have to adopt a general principle of action — perhaps, ‘When mimicking Earthlings, coordinate the movements of individual pods in such and such a way.’ And in acting on that principle, they thereby constitute themselves into a (in this case, collective) agent.

Let's pause to mark some of the contrasts between two of the theories of practical inference we have on the table. First of all, Kantian maxims — the structured intentions on which the universalizability requirement is imposed — have means-end or calculative structure: a maxim typically specifies not just what you are proposing to achieve, but how you propose to proceed. So Vogler's requirement, that one come up with actions that are calculatively well-formed, is compatible with Korsgaard's view. But because Vogler regards noncalculative reasons as optional, Korsgaard and Vogler differ over whether the universalizability of maxims is mandatory. Now because the universalizability test (the so-called CI-procedure) is to be applied to one's maxims as they arise, and because you may at any point consider an unprecedented maxim, it is still an open question just what the substantive moral theory generated by this theory of practical reasoning is. However, a handful of canonical dicta are usually thought of as constituting its core: not to lie; to adopt the end of helping others; to adopt the end of developing one's talents. So, second, we are seeing differing conceptions of action give rise to starkly differing views of the moral demands of rationality; on Vogler's view, the solely calculative conception of action allows for rational agents who lie, cynically exploit others, and don't bother to improve themselves. So Korsgaard's account is morally more demanding, and it is morally more demanding because it is more demanding about what it takes to be an action, as opposed to mere bodily or mental goings on.

An important contrast between these views has to do with how the attributability of action is understood. Anscombian accounts construe the attribution of action as having to do with the special way in which you know what you're doing — that is, without looking to see, the way other people have to (Rödl 2007, ch. 2). Since you just know what you're doing, its being your action takes care of itself; whereas we've seen that in Korsgaard's picture, action attribution is a task each agent has to take care of for himself, and arises out of meeting the exigencies of agency. If Kantian moral theory is to be nonoptional — something we can't just turn our backs on — the noncalculative Kantian reasons must be nonoptional. If the noncalculative reasons are what it takes to have action that is authored, then the ownership of actions must be demonstrably nonoptional. That necessity, we have seen, is practical; that is, it's the necessity of ‘gotta go, right now!’ But if that is the right way to reconstruct Korsgaard's position, there is a final worry to register, one that we are not yet able to meet, but to which we will return briefly when the time comes to assess the state of play of the field we are surveying.

We generally take arguments built around practical necessity to be responsible to and modulated by the urgency and force of the necessity. The point is once again easier to see when we are considering collective agents, so let us take up Korsgaard's political analogy once more. A state that aspires to having all activity within its jurisdiction be its own actions is totalitarian. Democratic states as we are familiar with them sometimes do mobilize themselves in a way that approximates this extreme: usually, in times of all-out war. (For instance, during WWII, the American government imposed rationing, managed a great deal of industrial production directly, and so on.) But when there is no such occasion, liberals regard totalitarianism as an unreasonable and immoral mode of political organization, and prefer a state in which most activity within the state is not attributable to it. Markets are a familiar instance of an alternative form of coordination: in a market economy, market outcomes are less than choices on the part of the government, and are not directly attributable to the state. Recall that the argument for action attribution turned on the need to avoid mutually frustrating activities, as when the pod creatures pull in different directions. A market economy, however, pits competitors against each other; in this approach, coordination of activities does not consist in forestalling competition, but in creating a regulatory framework for it. If the analogy goes through, action in Korsgaard's sense is inevitable only to the extent that practical pressures on human agency are such as to make totalitarian rather than, say, market-like approaches to the organization of individual activity mandatory. So the final worry is that we do not yet understand the ongoing practical demands warranting forms of coordination that underwrite the full attributability of action, making the latter a demand always to be met.

Korsgaard's response to this worry, which is also the final lap of her response to the initial worry, is an argument that you cannot choose to have a character with fault lines in it, one whose unity is ‘contingent and unstable’ (2009, 8.5.2). That argument is too opaque to permit an uncontroversial reconstruction, and instead I will conclude the exposition of her position by describing the challenge the argument is meant to meet. On Korsgaard's view, the practical necessity of reconstituting one's agency, from moment to moment, must be a formal feature of any human personality. However, in our ordinary ways of thinking, practical necessities are substantive and contingent pressures (in our earlier example, the demands of wartime, as experienced by a state). When ersatz Uncle Milton is out of sight, it looks like the pod creatures get to relax; but you are never allowed to take breaks from being an agent. The formal feature of agency that replaces those substantive pressures is the commitment to sustain one's agency in any circumstances whatsoever: ‘our principles, moral principles, are supposed to hold us together in any environment, any circumstance, come what may’ (Korsgaard 2009, sec. 5.5.3). That commmitment is supposed to be what makes action, rather than a more loosely organized alternative to it, always our plight.

We turn now to the second of the positions that takes authorship to be the essential feature of action. Like Korsgaard, Velleman takes action — “human action par excellence,” as contrasted with mere activity — to be owned (Velleman 2000, esp. chs. 1, 6–8, 10). Like Korsgaard, he takes ownership to require a definite structure in an agent, and again like her, he takes the forms of practical reasoning (and what practical reasons substantively will turn out to be) to be determined by the agent's structure. However, he disagrees with Korsgaard as to what the structure of an agent is, as to what its practical reasons are, and incidentally with Korsgaard's insistence that being authored by the agent as a whole means not being authored by a proper part of the agent.

The sense of ownership in play in Velleman's view is inherited from an older debate about freedom of the will and autonomy, and it has to do with whether the agent can honestly dissociate himself from his action or motivation (e.g., “It wasn't really me speaking; it was just the alcohol”). One might think that this sort of dissociation could be overcome by a further endorsement (“It really was me speaking”), but a familiar difficulty is that many forms of endorsement merely raise the problem anew: ownership cannot be identified with an endorsement when the agent can dissociate himself from that endorsement as well. There is by now an extensive literature on agency built up of rounds of this back-and-forth, and here is a very quick taste of it. Harry Frankfurt had suggested that a desire is full-fledgedly yours when you have a suitable second-order desire (a desire that the initial desire motivate you to act; Frankfurt 1971); Gary Watson pointed out that Frankfurt's proposal merely pushed the question back to whether that second-order desire was full-fledgedly yours, and he proposed fit with your values as an alternative account (Watson 1975). But the rejoinder was of course to ask what makes a set of values full-fledgedly your own (Benson 1987), and the problem seemed to take on the shape of a hard-to-halt regress. (For more on this debate, see Section 2 of the entry on free will.)

Velleman's way of terminating the regress is to locate a psychological element from which an agent cannot dissociate himself. Because to act is to act for reasons, an agent cannot dissociate himself from a desire to act for reasons — not, that is, without ceasing to be an agent. (Treat the content of that desire as a temporary placeholder; we'll return to it shortly.) When such a desire contributes in the canonical manner to producing an action (say, by weighing in on the side of other desires that it endorses, and so tipping the decision toward that action), we say that the agent produces the action (in something like the way that when your intestines digest food, we say that you are digesting the food). So, to recapitulate, actions are in the first place owned; an action is owned, in the relevant sense, when it cannot be disowned; the only anchor for an action that an agent cannot disown in turn, without ceasing to be an agent, is (roughly) the desire to act for reasons. So what it takes to be an action is to be (appropriately) produced by such a desire.

An action is what is produced by the operation of this desire, and so this desire amounts to the constitutive aim of action (in something like the way, Velleman thinks, that truth is the constitutive aim of belief). It will thus serve to determine what putative reasons for action are (good) practical reasons (in something like the way that truth determines what reasons for belief are good reasons). But then its content cannot quite be: to act for reasons. For that would amount to a viciously circular and vacuous specification of the constitutive aim of action.

Velleman's alternative specification of the content is (roughly again, because there is some room for variation) to know what one is doing when one acts, or to make sense to oneself when one acts (Velleman 1989). So what counts as a (good) practical reason is that which will make one's actions intelligible to one, when one performs them. Velleman seems to have something like the following schema in mind as a default: desires motivate, and so explain actions; so when you act on the basis of a desire, your action makes sense to you; so when your desire to make sense to yourself, together with more occasion-specific desires, produces an action serving the occasion-specific desires, that is a full-fledged action on your own part, and not mere activity. The default schema suggests that we have here a version of the authorship view of action supporting an instrumentalist or means-end (rather than, as in Korsgaard's development of it, a Kantian) account of practical reasons. This may, however, be the wrong conclusion to draw, although explaining why will involve extrapolating from what Velleman says to consequences he might well not want to endorse.

Because my reasons for action are picked out as what would explain my actions, we cannot, on pain of circularity, gloss what it is to be a satisfactory explanation of an action as being a practical reason. So we must instead rely on an already available notion of explanation, and it must be theoretical, i.e., logically the same sort of explanation that would account for any matter of fact. Accordingly, desires are reasons because they (potentially) explain action, and they explain action because (it is supposed) they causally explain it.

Thus the question of what counts as a practical reason gets deferred, in Velleman's position, to a philosophical account of theoretical explanation. We don't know how that will come out (for some of the options, see the entry on scientific explanation), but we ought not to assume that one's desires will turn out to be the sole or even primary explainers of action. (The presumption that desires or more generally motivations explain action is plausibly a legacy of a theory of practical reasoning on which desires are reasons for actions — and therefore, it is concluded, their causes — but that theory is off-limits to Velleman's project, and should not be appealed to by it, however indirectly.) Velleman himself mentions narrative explanations (2000, 160–62), but there are many other candidate forms of explanation.

To get a sense of how wide the range of options is, notice the following startling possibility: that what intuitively seem to be mistakes could turn out to be reasons, because they figure into satisfactory theoretical explanations of action. For example, demographic studies showing that people in your cohort and income bracket exhibit such-and-such a type of self-destructive behavior might explain your actions; as might situationist studies that show choices of people like yourself to be predicted by trivial and intuitively irrelevant features of their circumstances; as might work in evolutionary psychology, showing that currently pointless behavior of such-and-such a type would have been selected for among our Pleistocene ancestors; as might studies showing that humans commonly commit cognitive errors of such-and-such a kind. For all we know (i.e., pending the adoption of the correct theory of explanation), these will count as good reasons for actions, by Velleman's lights, even if you do not desire to perform those actions, and even if you understand the actions to be, respectively, self-destructive, or driven by trivial and irrelevant circumstances, or by cognitive errors, or having had no point since the days of the Pleistocene.

Briefly, then, Velleman's complicated account of what it takes to be an action doesn't at this point give us a univocal theory of what our practical reasons are — not, at any rate, at the level of formal specificity of Vogler's or Thompson's or Korsgaard's views. But although it is open-ended in that respect, it promises (given likely views about what sorts of facts can be adduced as explanations) to be quite surprising on that front.

If these speculations are on target, then, one authorship view of action can be argued to induce a surprising view of practical reasons, on which any theoretically satisfactory explanation of a prospective action will count as a reason for it. And a second such view is held to support a theory on which only universalizable maxims count as practical reasons. We are also seeing that authorship views of action may have strikingly different philosophical motivations: in one case, to account for the bindingness or normativity of reasons; in the other case, a need to make room for a certain sort of first-person authority about one's will.

3. The Practice View of Action

In an early, influential, and Wittgenstein-influenced paper, John Rawls introduced the notion of a practice as a generalization or extension of the notion of a game (Rawls 1955). The important feature of a practice for our purposes is that it introduces statuses which are internal to it. For instance, in baseball, such statuses might include being a ‘foul’, a ‘strike’, and so on; whatever what you're doing looks like, it can't be a (baseball) foul if you're not playing baseball. A practice thereby introduces standards; since something is a ‘home run’ only by virtue of the fact that what is being played is baseball, there are standards, given by the rules of baseball, to which a home run has to live up. A practice also introduces reasons which are internal to it; these reasons may be means-end or calculative reasons (as when the rules specify the object of the game: in baseball, as Yogi Berra famously put it, to win, by scoring more points than the opposing team), or reasons of other kinds. (In squash, that the other player's head is between your racquet and the ball is a reason to call a ‘let’, but not because it is the best way to win; if you were to exercise your option of hitting your opponent in the head, you would win the point. In squash, calculative reasons are modulated by gentlemanly reasons.)

Tamar Schapiro has extended Rawls's treatment, developing it into a theory of action (Schapiro 2001; she attributes the view to Kant, but again the historical question will not be taken up). On her view, ‘actions’ are just moves in the completely generic practice; that is, ‘action’ is a status within the generic practice in something like the way that ‘move’ is a status within chess. Schapiro does not name the generic practice, but because it will be convenient to have a short way of referring to it, let's call it ‘Intendo’. Intendo is the game you are playing whenever you do anything at all; ‘agent’ is thus the generic role in the generic game (the analog of ‘player,’ in chess or baseball). Practices specify standards and reasons, and so ‘practical reason’ turns out to be a practice status as well. Intendo consequently determines what forms practical reasons can take, and so patterns of practical inference are to be read off of what turns out to be the theory of action.

Practical reasons are practical only if they could be brought to bear on some decision resulting in action; being an action is a status (the generic move) within Intendo; so there could be no practical reasons coming from outside the practice of Intendo. (Other, more local practices have to accommodate reasons that come from outside the practice; for instance, in chess, the object of the game is to win, but I may have personal reasons for not playing to win.) Therefore, if you can show that Intendo imposes some standard on its reasons (for instance, and to anticipate, that they have to be universalizable), then you will have shown that all reasons have to meet it.

An important metaethical question about practical reasoning has to do with the modality (roughly, the force) of the family of operators that includes ‘may’, ‘must’, ‘should’, and so on, when what is at issue is what you have reason to do. (Call this the ‘modality of freedom’.) Schapiro's approach provides a surprising answer to this question: the modality of freedom is that of the ‘can’ in ‘Can he do that?’ — said of someone who has just run the bases backwards. Freedom of the will ranges over the allowable moves in the game of Intendo.

In extending Rawls's view, Schapiro has departed from it in some ways. Rawls thought that ‘relatively few actions of the moral life are defined by practices’ (op. cit., 32n), and worried about the conservatism implicit in taking ‘the social practices of [each person's] society to provide the standard of justification for his actions’ (32). On Schapiro's view, being an action tout court is a status in Intendo, and being a reason is a status in Intendo. Rawls objected to the ‘summary’ conception of rules characteristic of utilitarianism, that it allowed only ‘one office and so no offices at all’ (28). But in Intendo, the sole office is that of ‘agent’. Rawls took it to be ‘essential to the notion of a practice that the rules are publicly known and understood as definitive’ (24). This cannot be true of Intendo; if what reasons for action could be was public knowledge, and understood as definitive, there would not be a cottage industry of philosophers arguing about the forms of practical reasoning. And finally, the Wittgensteinian roots of Rawls's treatment suggest that he would have been skeptical of a strategy that turned on finding the deepest common features of all practices. The notion of a practice, again, is an extension of the notion of a game, and Wittgenstein famously pointed out that there is no nontrivial feature common to all games (see Section 3.4, on language games, in the entry on Ludwig Wittgenstein). However, to point out that Schapiro's position differs from Rawls's is of course not thereby to criticize it; rather, it is to warn against too quickly assuming her position to inherit all of the structural features of the older and more familiar one.

Schapiro's article is evidently the first piece of a project whose finish line is some version of Kantian morality. She writes that ‘if it is right to think of universal laws on the model of practice rules, then the law of freedom can be thought of as an indeterminate practice rule, one which simply requires us to make every movement as if it were to count as a move in some possible global practice’ (108); this is a paraphrase, in the vocabulary of this theory, of the Kantian demand that one act only on maxims of which one could will that they be universal laws. The patterns of practical reasoning are to be those acknowledged by Kantian theory of practical rationality, and the substantive moral consequences, those endorsed by Kantian moral theory.

Schapiro's position is motivated in the first place by the history of action theory. She identifies two older conceptions of action, a consequence-oriented view, on which actions are simply ways of producing effects in a given, natural world, and an expressivist view, on which actions function more or less as evaluative pronouncements. The practice view of action is meant to capture the truth in each of these, while avoiding their defects; it is, as it were, their Hegelian synthesis. But Schapiro is also motivated by an appreciation of the importance and value to us of a world enriched by practice statuses. It is not just that the predecessor theories are wrong about what an action is; it is that forgoing the textured world created by our practices would be a terrible mistake. Korsgaard, we saw, developed her action-theoretic account of practical rationality psychologistically, and one might have jumped to the conclusion that psychologism was a deep feature of the Kantian position. However, while Schapiro's position is not motivated by anti-psychologism, it is nonetheless non-psychologistic. When you assess the reasons a practice generates, you can leave the psychology of the players out of it. For instance, when the king is in check, then the chess player has a reason to move it out of check; you don't look inside anyone's head, as it were, to determine that, but rather, at the constitutive rules of chess.

As before, if the Kantian moral conclusions are to be binding, then not only must the practice conception entail the Kantian conclusions, but the practice conception of action must be shown to be nonoptional. The game of baseball gives its players reasons, but you can always choose not to play in the first place, and you can choose to stop playing; what's more, the rules of baseball themselves bring baseball games to a close. In either case, the reasons of baseball do not — or cease to — apply to you. Intendo must therefore be a game that you cannot walk away from. But why can't you simply stop playing Intendo, and start producing — not perhaps ‘actions’, but activity of some other kind — that is not practice-governed? We have already gestured at one answer: the importance of living in a practice-informed world. One further answer Schapiro might give is that you can't do that — where the modality of the ‘can't’ is the modality of freedom. (Since reasons are a practice status, questions having to do with practical reason do not arise for the alternative forms of activity.)

The question is especially pressing in view of a further philosophical motivation for Schapiro's project. Non-ideal theory is concerned with guidelines for action and moral thinking in a world that is not very moral at all, and Schapiro 2006 takes up a traditional Kantian test case, that of the murderer at the door. Kantian moral theory prohibits lying, and in a world in which there were no murderers, perhaps that would be fine; but here he is, asking if his intended victim, to whom you have just served a cup of tea, is at home. The casuistical exercise is that of providing an explanation, consistent with the moral theory, of the legitimacy of lying to him, and Schapiro's solution draws on the idea that moral reasons, like all reasons for action, are statuses in the game of Intendo. If the murderer at the door is refusing to play the game, then your own moves cannot be responses to his moves in the game. In this case, honesty meant as a contribution to the ‘co-legislation game’ (the game that properly played Intendo turns out to be) is simply not an option. And if proper honesty is not an available move, perhaps other moves are available to you.

The tension is this: On the one hand, you must act out of the moral law because you cannot opt out of the game of Intendo; that is why morality is binding. On the other hand, however, you may lie to the murderer at the door, because he has opted out of the game of Intendo. Schapiro provides a label for what she intends as a way of splitting the difference: the murderer is betraying the generic practice without opting out of it. But the distinction marked by the label is as yet unexplained. The further development of the practice view will be shaped by the need to accommodate these apparently conflicting theoretical constraints.

4. Evaluation as Essential to Action

Sarah Buss distinguishes between mere “movements of the human body” and full fledged intentional action by requiring, for the latter, that agents endorse their actions at the time they are initiated; the content of the endorsement must in one way or another come to allowing the agent's reasons to be sufficient for performing the action (Buss 1999). Anything short of that, she argues, amounts to adopting a spectatorial stance towards your own actions: if you identify a number of desires, notice that you could satisfy them by performing an action, but then don't arrive at an evaluative belief with roughly the content that that's good enough to go ahead, you will be doing no more than sitting back to see what happens — to see whether the desires actuate your body.

Buss then considers a Humean moral psychology on which reasons for action are drawn from two mutually exclusive classes of psychological states, desires and beliefs, where beliefs are understood to have no properly evaluative content (e.g., Smith, 1987). Since such a moral psychology has no room for evaluative beliefs, and since intentional action requires one particular sort of evaluative belief, Humean moral psychology is, she concludes, incompatible with there being intentional actions. It evidently follows that a theory of practical reasoning which presupposes Humean moral psychology cannot allow for intentional action, either. (There is a little bit of slippage here: one might allow for the evaluations, but then insist that these could not figure into practical reasoning. But this would be an awkward way of resisting the conclusion.) Theories of practical reasoning which identify reasons for action solely with desires and beliefs so characterized — so-called Humean theories — are directed towards choosing actions, yet incompatible with actions being chosen. The conclusion we are invited to draw is that Humean theories of practical reasoning are incoherent. A dramatic way of putting it might be: if your will is to be free, instrumentalism must be false.

There is evident overlap between Buss's view and Velleman's: both pivot on the concern that one act for one's (sufficient or good enough or best) reasons. (In Velleman, that concern appears as a desire, where in Buss, it appears as an evaluation.) But the concern is differently motivated: where Velleman is trying to halt a regress in the structural analysis of agency, Buss is trying to express the philosophical thought that action is active rather than passive. Once past the conclusion that a theory of practical rationality had better not presuppose a Humean theory of motivation, Buss is open-minded both about what one's practical reasons might turn out to be like, and thus about the consequences for moral theory. And worries about psychologism do not seem to figure into her view.

5. Prospects and Outstanding Issues

The turn to action theory is producing some of the most interesting recent work on practical reasoning. As we have seen, however, their shared methodology notwithstanding, these theorists disagree on just about everything else: on their philosophical reasons for adopting the approach in the first place, on what the correct theory of practical reasoning is, on why one form or another of practical inference is nonoptional or binding, and on what the upshots are for morality or ethics. As awareness of the shared agenda grows, we can expect to see positions that attempt to take on board elements from more than one of the theories currently in play, or alternatively, that take up the task of explaining why competitors are misguided.

The primary source of the disagreements just mentioned is a further disagreement, as to what it takes to count as an action. On one view, intentional actions are centrally characterized by their stepwise or nested internal structure; on another, by their being authored or owned; on the third, by their location in a practice; on a fourth, by entailing an evaluation of one's reasons. As we have seen, some of these characterizations come with supporting arguments, and this is a dramatic advance on the state of play as of about a decade back; however, the norm in this subfield is still to omit explanations of why arguments for competing conceptions of action are incorrect. In a famous essay that kicked off discussion of a different topic in practical reasoning, Robert Nozick observed that advocates of the alternative responses to Newcomb's Problem were prepared to explain why they thought their own position correct, but not what was wrong with arguments for the other alternative; such a posture is unsatisfactory, and Nozick emphasized that in such debates ‘it will not do to rest content with one's belief ... nor will it do to just repeat one of the arguments, loudly and slowly’ (Nozick 1997, p. 48).

It follows that the most important item on the agenda of this research program is to produce arguments that will decide between the competing conceptions of action in play. One can't very well hang one's theory of practical reasoning, and one's moral theory to boot, off an account of action that is treated as obviously false by other researchers in one's discipline, when one has no story to tell about why one's own account is correct, and theirs is not. We may conclude by observing that there are two modes of argument one must choose between. One might try to establish that, as a matter of metaphysical fact, actions are as this or that theory says; alternatively, one might argue that one is to (ought to, had better) produce actions which are as the theory says; that is, the top-level argumentation might be either theoretical or practical.

The choice between the two modes of argument is tied to a further strategic choice. On the approach we are examining, theories of practical inference inherit their bindingness from the non-optionality of the associated conception of action. That entails that any such theory needs an answer to the question, ‘Given what is meant by “action”, why not produce activity of some other kind?’ To quickly canvass the forms this question takes for the theories we have on the table: Why shouldn't I look for noncalculative control structures, and manage my activity by using them? What's wrong with answering the question, ‘Did you really do (i.e., author) that?’ with, ‘Well, no, it just kind of happened'? What's wrong with engaging in activities that compete with each other or frustrate themselves — that is, with behaving as though you were a market on the inside, rather than a totalitarian state? Why shouldn't I opt out of the game of Intendo, in something like the way I might decline a round of pinochle? (And if it's simply not possible, how is it that I have to cope with people who seem to have opted out themselves?) Why bother with evaluating the reasons for my action? Isn't the fact that I am responsive to them enough? Notice that we should not assume without argument that one or another mode of action must be nonoptional; if the pressures toward one or another form of action amount to less than practical necessity, pluralism about action might be the appropriate conclusion (Millgram 2010).

A theoretical answer would involve showing that there is nothing else that you can — metaphysically — do: that whatever you do (in the thinnest possible sense) is action (in the theory's thicker and more substantive sense). A practical answer would involve showing that, given the alternatives, the suggestion that you produce actions (in the substantive sense of one's favored theory) is, as they used to say, an offer you can't refuse. The type of force or bindingness that one's theory of practical reason will inherit from one's theory of action will be determined by the choice between these two modes of argument.


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Other Internet Resources


I'm grateful to Chrisoula Andreou and Sarah Buss for comments on earlier drafts of this entry. An early version was read at a Rosenblatt Free Lunch at the University of Utah, and I'm also grateful to the audience for their feedback.

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Elijah Millgram <>

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