William Penbygull

First published Wed Jul 25, 2001; substantive revision Fri Feb 24, 2012

Wyclif's logico-metaphysical works were very influential at Oxford at the end of the 14th century and the beginning of the 15th. Among the authors who followed his doctrines (the so called Oxford Realists), William Penbygull (+1420) was almost certainly the most faithful to the master, since his extant writings appear to be essentially devoted to a defence and/or explanation of Wyclif's main philosophical theses. Notwithstanding such an attitude, Penbygull gave an original contribution to logic by developing a new theory of identity, which solved the problems that Wyclif's analysis of predication had raised, and by refining Wyclif's theory of predication itself.

1. Life and Works

The information on the life and works of William Penbygull (or Penbegyll) is scanty. He was from Exeter diocese; he studied at Oxford, where he was fellow of Exeter College in 1399, and rector in 1406–07. He was licensed to preach in the diocese of Bath and Wells on 28 February 1410. He probably died at Oxford in 1420. According to Emden 1957–59, he wrote the following treatises on logic: De universalibus (On Universals), Divisio entis (The Division of Being), and Super Porphyrii Isagogen (On Porphyry's Isagoge).

2. The Oxford Realists

Realism and nominalism were the two major theoretical alternatives in the later Middle Ages concerning the reality and kinds of general objects, and the status and mutual relationships of the basic items of the world (individual and universal substances,individual and universal accidents) as well as their connection to language. Realists believed in the extra-mental existence of common natures (or essences); nominalists did not. Realists held that Aristotle's table of categories was first of all a partition of things grounded on ontological criteria and only secondarily a classification of (mental, written, and spoken) terms, and therefore that the world is divided into ten kinds of things (in a broad sense of 'thing'), not one of which can be reduced to any other. Nominalists maintained that the division into ten categories was a partition of terms on the basis of semantic criteria, and that there are only two or three real categories (substance and quality, and perhaps quantity too). Realists believed that thought was linguistically constrained by its own nature, and accordingly they considered thought to be related to reality in its elements and constitution, and deemed language, thought, and external reality to be of the same logical coherence. Nominalists sharply distinguished between things as they exist in the external world and the various forms by means of which we think-of and talk-about them, since for them our (mental, spoken, and written) language does not reproduce the world, but merely regards it, as our (mental, spoken, and written) language and the world are logically independent systems.

In the third decade of the fourteenth century, in his commentaries on the Categories and the De interpretatione and in the first part of his Summa logicae Ockham argued that the common realist account of the relationship between universals and individuals was inconsistent with the standard definition of real identity, according to which two items a and b are identical if and only if for all x, x is predicated of a if and only x is predicated of b. If universals are something existing in the world, really identical with their individuals considered as instances of a given type (e.g., the universal man qua man is identical with Socrates), but different considered as properly universals and individuals (e.g., man qua universal is different from Socrates considered qua individual), then whatever is predicated of the individuals must be predicated of their universals too, and so a unique general object (say, the human nature) would possess contrary attributes simultaneously via the attributes of different individuals. Furthermore, a same thing would be in different places at the same time, since, for example, the universal-man (homo universalis) would be present at the same time in this man here (in Rome) and in that man there (in Oxford) (cf. Ockham, Expositio in librum Praedicamentorum Aristotelis, cap. 8.1, in Opera philosophica, vol. 2, p. 166; and Summa logicae, p. I, cap. 15, in Opera philosophica, vol. 1, p. 51).

Later medieval Realists were persuaded that Ockham's criticism was sufficient to show that the traditional realist account of the relation between universals and particulars was unacceptable, but not that realism as a whole was untenable. Thus, they tried to remove the unclear and aporetic points stressed by Ockham by two fundamental strategies: (1) the real distinction between universals and individuals; (2) new notions of identity and distinction. The first strategy is that of Walter Burley, who in his later years (after 1324) many times claimed that universals fully exist outside the mind and are really distinct from the individuals in which they are present and of which they are predicated—so moving toward a sort of Platonism. The second strategy was that most commonly developed in the later Middle Ages all over the Europe. There were two main lines of this strategy. The first was that of some Italian Dominican masters, such as Francis of Prato and Stephen of Rieti in the 1340s, who worked out new definitions for identity and distinction that were inspired by Hervaeus Natalis's notion of conformity (see Amerini 2005). The second approach was that of the most important school of later medieval realists: the so-called “Oxford Realists,” started by John Wyclif. Besides Wyclif himself, this school includes the Englishmen Robert Alyngton, William Milverley, William Penbygull, Roger Whelpdale, and John Tarteys, as well as the German Johannes Scharpe (or Sharpe) and the Italian Paul of Venice. According to the Oxford Realists, universals and individuals are really identical but formally distinct. In addition, they claimed that (1) the two notions of formal difference and real identity are logically compatible; (2) predication is a real relation between things; and (3) the ten Aristotelian categories are ten really distinct kinds of things (res in the strict sense of the term).

3. Penbygull on Universals and Predication

Like any other Oxford Realist, Penbygull lists three main kinds of universals: (i) the metaphysical causes of everything, like God and the angelic intelligences; (ii) the general concepts abstracted by our mind, or mental universals; and (iii) the common natures existing in the singulars, or real universals (De universalibus, p. 178). Such common natures are type-forms naturally apt to be present-in and predicated-of a set of individuals, which therefore instantiate them. Real universals are the main metaphysical components of the individuals, but they have no being outside the being of their individuals, as universals and their individuals are really (realiter) the same and only formally (formaliter) distinct (De universalibus, p. 189). In fact, real universals are identical with their own individuals when considered as natures of a certain kind (for instance, man is the same thing as Socrates), but different from them when considered qua universals and qua individuals respectively, because of the opposite constitutive principles: generality for universals and thisness for individuals (De universalibus, p. 181).

Like Walter Burley and Wyclif, Penbygull holds that such formal universals exist in act (in actu) outside our minds, and not in potency (in potentia) only, as moderate realists (like St. Thomas Aquinas) thought, since for Penbygull the necessary and sufficient condition that a thing must meet for being a universal is the existence of at least one individual in which it is present (De universalibus, p. 178). So the actual existence of universals depends entirely on that of their individuals; without them, common natures could not be really universals.

On the logical side, this description of the relationship between universals and individuals in terms of real identity and formal distinction, entails that not all that is predicated of individuals can be directly (formaliter) attributed to their universals and vice versa. In particular, the accidental forms inhering in substantial individuals (for instance, the whiteness inhering in Socrates) can be predicated of the universal forms proper to these individuals (for instance, the form of humanity or that of animality) only indirectly (essentialiter), through and in virtue of the individuals themselves. As a consequence, a redefinition of the standard kinds predication and the introduction of a new type, unknown to Aristotle, was required, in order to cover the cases of indirect inherence of an accidental form in a substantial universal, admitted by this theory.

Wyclif, whose conception of universals is the source of Penbygull's, had therefore distinguished three main types of predication: formal predication, predication by essence, and habitudinal predication, each more general than the preceding one. Penbygull, like other Oxford logicians of his generation, tried to improve Wyclif's theory by excluding habitudinal predication and redefining the other two kinds in a slightly different way. Penbygull therefore divides predication (which he conceives as a real relation which holds between metaphysical objects [De universalibus, p. 188]) into formal predication (praedicatio formalis), predication by essence (secundum essentiam), and causal predication. Predication by essence shows a partial identity between subject and predicate, which share some, but not all, metaphysical component parts, and does not require that the form connotated by the predicate-term be directly present in the essence denotated by the subject-term. Formal predication, on the contrary, requires such a direct presence. If the form connotated by the predicate-term is intrinsic to the nature of the subject, then the predication is a case of formal essential predication, while if it is extrinsic, the predication is a case of formal accidental predication. “Man is an animal” is an instance of formal essential predication; “Socrates is white” is an instance of formal accidental predication. Unlike Wyclif, who applied predication by essence to second intentions only—since he admitted sentences like “(What is) universal is (what is) singular” (that is, universale est singulare) as well-formed and true—Penbygull thinks that it holds also when applied to first intentions. So he claims that it is possible to predicate of the universal-man (homo in communi) the property of being white, if at least one of its individuals is white. However he makes sure to use as a predicate-term a substantival adjective in its neuter form, because only in this way can it appear that the form connoted by the predicate-term is not directly present in the subject, but is indirectly attributed to it, through its individuals. Therefore he acknowledges the proposition “The universal-man is (something) white” (homo in communi est album) as a true one, if at least one of the existing men is white (De universalibus, pp. 186–87). Finally, there is causal predication when the item signified by the predicate-term is not present in any way in the item signified by the subject-term, but the real subject has been caused by the real predicate (De universalibus, p. 188).

According to him formal essential predication and formal accidental predication would correspond to Aristotle's essential and accidental predication. But, as a matter of fact, he agrees with Wyclif in regarding predication by essence as more general than formal predication. As a consequence, in his theory formal predication is a particular type of predication by essence. This means that he implicitly recognizes a single ontological pattern, founded on a sort of partial identity, as the basis of every kind of standard philosophical statement (subject, copula, predicate). But in this way, formal essential predication and formal accidental predication are very different from their Aristotelian models, as they express degrees of identity as well as predication by essence.

Formal accidental predication is then further divided into secundum motum and secundum habitudinem (De universalibus, pp. 187–88). The basic idea of this last division seems to be that modes of being and natures of the accidental forms determine the set of substantial items which can play the role of their substrate. Penbygull distinguishes between those accidental forms that require a substance capable of undergoing change (per se mobile) as their own direct substrate of inherence, and those ones which do not need a substrate with such a characteristic. Forms like quantity, whiteness, alteration, diminution and so on belong to the first group, while relations of reason and respectus, like causation, difference, and so on, fall under the secondo one. The forms of the first group bring about formal accidental predication secundum motum, and the forms of the second group formal accidental predication secundum habitudinem. The former necessarily entail singular substances as their substrates, since individuals alone can undergo change, while the latter can directly inhere in both individual and universal substances (insunt denominative tam communibus quam singularibusDe universalibus, p. 188).

4. Penbygull's Theory of Identity

This interpretative scheme of the nature and kinds of predication is ultimately grounded on a notion of identity, necessarily different from the standard one. According to the most common opinion the logical criteria for identity and (real) distinction were the following:

a is identical with b iff for all x, it is the case that x is predicated of a iff it is predicated of b;

a differs from (is [really] distinct from) b iff there is at least one z such that a is predicated of z and b is not, or vice versa, or there is at least one w such that w is predicated of a and not of b, or vice versa.

On this basis one can easily conclude that universals and individuals can never be the same, at least because of the forms of generality (which cannot be predicated of individuals) and of thisness (which cannot be predicated of universals). So Penbygull had to put forward new criteria for identity and distinction. First of all, he distinguishes between the notion of non-identity and that of difference (or distinction) and denies that the notion of difference implies that of non-identity (De universalibus, p. 190); then he affirms that the two notions of difference and (real) identity are logically compatible (ibid.); finally he suggests the following definitions for these three notions non-identity, difference or distinction, and (absolute) identity (De universalibus, pp. 190–91):

a is non-identical with b iff there is not any form F such that F is present in the same way in a and b;

a differs from b iff there is at least one form F such that F is directly present in a but not in b or vice versa;

a is (absolutely) identical with b iff for all forms F, it is the case that F is present in a iff it is present in the same way in b.

The criterion for non-identity is stronger than the common one for real distinction: two things can be qualified as non-identical iff they belong to distinct categories. On the other side, the definition of difference does not exclude the possibility that two things which differ from each other share one or more properties (or forms). Thus, there are degrees of distinction, and what is more, the degree of distinction between two things can be read as the inverse measure of their (partial) identity. For instance, if we compare the list of the forms (both substantial and accidental) which constitute Socrates and those which make up the universal-man, it is evident that Socrates and the universal-man differ from each other, since there are forms which directly inhere in Socrates and not in the universal-man and vice versa; but it is also evident that the two lists are identical for a long section, that is, that Socrates and the universal-man, considered from the point of view of their metaphysical composition, are partially the same. As a result, the copula of the propositions which Penbygull deals with cannot be extensionally interpreted, as it does not mean that a given object is a member of a certain set, nor that a given set is included in another, but it always means degrees in identity between two compound entities.


Edited works

  • De universalibus (On Universals), in A.D. Conti, “Teoria degli universali e teoria della predicazione nel trattato De universalibus di William Penbygull: discussione e difesa della posizione di Wyclif,” Medioevo, 8 (1982): 137–203 (see pp. 167–203).

Secondary literature

  • Amerini, F., 2005, “What is Real. A Reply to Ockham's Ontological Program,” Vivarium, 43(1): 187–212.
  • Conti, A.D., 1982, “Teoria degli universali e teoria della predicazione nel trattato De universalibus di William Penbygull,” Medioevo, 8: 137–203.
  • –––, 2005, “Johannes Sharpe's Ontology and Semantics: Oxford Realism Revisited,” Vivarium, 43(1): 156–86.
  • –––, 2008, “Categories and Universals in the Later Middle Ages,” in L. Newton (ed.), Medieval Commentaries on Aristotle's Categories, Leiden: Brill, pp. 369–409.
  • –––, 2010, “Realism,” in R. Pasnau (ed.), The Cambridge History of Medieval Philosophy, 2 volumes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 647–60.
  • Conti, A.D. (ed.), 1990, Johannes Sharpe, Quaestio super universalia, Firenze: Olschki, 1990. See the “Studio storico-critico,” at pp. 309–15.
  • de Libera, A., 1996, La querelle des universaux. De Platon à la fin du Moyen Age, Paris: Éditions du Seuil, at pp. 403–28.
  • Emden, A.B., 1957–59, A Biographical Register of the University of Oxford to A.D. 1500, 3 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press. (See Vol. iii, p. 1455.)

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Copyright © 2012 by
Alessandro Conti <alessandro.conti@cc.univaq.it>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.