The Donation of Human Organs

First published Fri Oct 28, 2011

Organ donation raises difficult ethical questions about people's claims to determine what happens to their bodies before and after death. What are these claims? What would it be to respect them? How should they fit with the claims of organ donors' families or the needs of people whose own organs have failed? As with other topics in applied ethics, satisfactory answers require knowing the relevant facts, in this case about organ transplantation.

In summary form, the following empirical claims about organ transplantation are widely accepted:

  1. Organ transplantation is a successful treatment for organ failure in many cases.
  2. Organ transplantation is cost-effective (Machnicki et al. 2006).
  3. Organ transplantation is routine, not experimental (Tilney 2003). The organs in question are the kidney, liver, heart, lung, pancreas, and intestine.
  4. Organs are scarce. Many people who would benefit from receiving a transplant do not get one.

Organs are taken from the dead and the living. Each category raises separate problems and we begin with dead organ donors.

1. Organ Retrieval from the Dead

The dead, in particular the brain dead, are the major sources of organs for transplantation. Even though far more people die than require new organs, organs are scarce. Numerous factors affect the retrieval of organs from the dead. These include: the nature of people's deaths (in only perhaps as few as 2% of deaths can organs currently be taken, and countries vary according to the number of car crashes, shootings, and other causes of death that lend themselves to retrieval); the number of intensive care units (ICUs) (most donors die there and fewer ICUs makes for fewer donors); the medical factors that determine whether organs are retrieved successfully; the logistical factors that determine the efficient use of available organs; the extent of public awareness of transplantation; and the ethical-legal rules for consent that determine who is allowed to block or permit retrieval. Although most of these factors do not raise philosophical questions, it is important to realize that the main factor that does—the ethical-legal system for consent—is only one of many that affect retrieval rates, and nowhere near the most important at that. One should also bear in mind that the variety of factors (plus unreliability or incomparability in statistics about retrieval) means that it is hard or impossible to have confidence in many of the causal claims about how consent rules affect retrieval rates.

In this section, we explain the rules for consent as they operate in practice in most countries. Then we outline certain reform proposals, mention the claims of the main affected parties, and, in the light of those claims, evaluate those reform proposals.

1.1 Organ retrieval in practice

In nearly all countries with a transplantation program, the following is a broadly accurate description of organ retrieval in practice, although different countries, and regions of countries, do differ in nuanced ways, for instance in how the option of donation is presented to families; and the nuances may affect retrieval rates (Price 2000; Wilkinson in press).

  1. If the deceased made a refusal known, either formally (e.g., on a register) or informally, organs will not be retrieved.
  2. If the family refuse, organs will not be retrieved.
  3. If the deceased is not known to have refused, suitable organs will be retrieved if the family agree (some jurisdictions) or do not refuse (other jurisdictions).

The first point to make from this description is that nearly all countries have, in practice, a ‘double veto’ system. Even if the family want to donate, the deceased's objection will veto retrieval. Even if the deceased agreed to donate, the family's objection will veto retrieval. The family's veto is in many countries, such as the US, the UK, and most nations of continental Europe, a creation of the medical profession. Transplanters will not take organs from consenting dead people whose families object even though the law permits retrieval. A lesson in method follows: when describing the practice of organ retrieval, looking at the law alone is inadequate.

A vital second point is that in virtually no country is the consent of the deceased required before organs may be taken (Price 2000). When the deceased has not refused, the family's agreement is enough to permit retrieval.

1.2 Proposals for reform

The persistent scarcity of organs has given rise to several proposals to reform the system for consent. Here are the main ones.

  1. Encourage or mandate clearer choices by the deceased.
  2. End the family's power of veto.
  3. Change defaults so that organs are taken except when the deceased formally objected.
  4. Conscript organs.
  5. Pay for organs.

We discuss (1)–(4) below and for (5) refer the reader to the entry on the sale of organs. Before evaluating the proposals, we describe the claims of the main affected parties. In determining what the rules for retrieval ought to be, three main claims are in play. These are the claims of the deceased, the deceased's family, and potential recipients of organs. Transplant professionals have claims too, which are probably best thought of as matters of professional conscience, but we do not discuss them further.

The dead. The ‘claims of the dead over their bodies’ is almost invariably shorthand for ‘the claims of the living over their post-mortem bodies’, and that is how it will be understood here. While it is widely accepted that living people have strong claims over their own bodies, especially when it comes to vetoing invasions of their bodily integrity, it is much less widely accepted that the dead have such claims. Among the views that the dead have claims, we may distinguish between those which hold that events after death can harm the interests of the formerly-living and those which hold that it is only the fears and concerns of the living that have weight. Thus if it is asked why we should attach weight to a person's refusal of organ retrieval, the first sort of view may say ‘because to take the organ of a person who refused damages his interest’ and the second sort may say ‘because the anticipation of retrieval against his wishes will be bad for the living person’. The first sort of view is the subject of posthumous interests (see separate entry on Death).

Even if we accept that people may have posthumous interests, the content of those interests will often be unknown or indeterminate. Many people do not think about organ donation, which is quite reasonable given the low chance that they will die in such a way as to permit organ retrieval. In cases where they have not thought or not revealed their thoughts, it seems plausible to say that they have no interest for or against retrieval.

In some cases, the claims of the deceased will be in conflict with those of his or her family and/or the claims of potential recipients. The question arises of how to weigh the claims of the deceased. Some writers accept that the deceased can have posthumous interests, but believe them to be of little weight, particularly compared with the needs for organs of those with organ failure (Harris 2002, 2003). They may believe that people are not affected by their posthumous interests being set back or they may think the fear of retrieval is of little weight. In their view, any roughly consequentialist calculation would justify setting aside the objections of the deceased to organ retrieval. Other writers argue that if we accept posthumous interests and accept that people have strong claims over their bodies while alive, we have grounds to attribute rights to the living over their post-mortem bodies (Wilkinson in press). Such a view needs to explain how posthumous rights are possible, since some writers in political and legal theory believe that rights could not protect posthumous interests for technical reasons to do with the nature of rights (Steiner 2004; Fabre 2008).

The family. If one accepts that the deceased has a claim, then families may acquire a claim by transfer. That is, the deceased may delegate decision-making power to their families, as is possible in some jurisdictions. Acquiring a claim by transfer is no more controversial than the deceased's having a claim in the first place. What is the subject of dispute is whether the family should have a claim in their own right which could be set against the claims of the deceased or potential recipients.

Some argue for family decision-making on cultural grounds (Chan 2004, in the context of medical decision-making generally). For them, giving priority to the deceased is unacceptably individualist either in all cases or in cases where individualism is culturally abnormal (Boddington 1998). Among the difficulties for such views is to explain why, if individualism is mistaken, the decision about retrieval should be made by individual families rather than in the interests of the wider community, which may well require taking organs against the families' wishes so as to meet the needs of potential recipients.

If families were overridden, it is reasonable to suppose that they would suffer extra distress: that is, even more distress than they would already be experiencing upon the often untimely and unanticipated death of the relative. Few writers deny that avoiding distress would be a good reason, although some believe (without much evidence) that a norm of taking organs and overriding families' opposition would come to be accepted (Harris 2003). What is controversial is how strong a claim the family would acquire not to be distressed.

Finally, families are not monolithic, and sometimes they disagree among themselves about whether to endorse organ retrieval. How internal disagreement affects the families' claims is something not widely discussed.

Potential recipients. As was said at the start of this entry, potential recipients stand to gain a great deal from receiving an organ in terms of both the quantity and quality of their lives. They are also badly off, in a medical sense, in that they suffer from organ failure. Utilitarian, prioritarian, and egalitarian views of justice and benevolence would, therefore, give considerable weight to the needs of potential recipients.

We now turn to consider the proposals for reform listed above.

1.2.1 Encourage or mandate clearer choices by the deceased

According to some, an important cause of family refusal of organ retrieval is uncertainty about the wishes of the deceased. Families that do not know what their relatives wanted often default to ‘no’ (den Hartogh 2008a). To avoid the default, some writers would encourage people to decide about donation in a way others will know, for instance by paying them (De Wispelaere and Stirton 2010) and others suggest mandating choice by, for instance, withholding driving licenses from those who do not choose. The suggestion is not, or not in all cases, that people be steered into agreeing to donate or penalized if they refuse. It is that people be steered to make clear choices, yes or no.

Some ethical questions are raised by penalizing people for not choosing or for introducing monetary encouragement. It may be replied that no one is pressured to donate, as opposed to choose; that the penalties or encouragement are slight; and that transplants are of such value to the needy that any ethical objections are easily overridden. The real difficulty for the proposal is that in the few places it has been tried (such as the US states of Virginia and Texas), people who are pressured to choose themselves default to ‘no’ (den Hartogh 2008a). While the underlying idea is often correct and families do default to ‘no’ when uncertain about the deceased's wishes, neither mandated choice nor its cousins seems likely to increase retrieval rates by much.

1.2.2 End the family's power of veto

Families have at least the de facto power to veto retrieval from the deceased, even those who adamantly wanted to donate their organs. Does this power not give excessive weight to the interests of families as against the interests of both the deceased and potential recipients?

As it happens, it appears that families rarely override the donors' known wishes. Furthermore, it seems unlikely that many people would want to donate no matter how upset their families were, so allowing families to veto retrieval is unlikely to be against the all-things-considered wishes of many of the deceased.

In any case, transplant professionals have a practical reason not to override the family: they fear bad publicity. One version of their argument is this: ‘there are already urban myths about people having their deaths hastened so as to make their organs available; few people understand brain-death; donation would fall if families publicly claimed that their views were overridden and their relatives were not dead; thus ending the family veto would reduce the supply of organs, not increase it.’

If the practical argument is correct, it is understandable why families have a medically-created power of veto. Moreover, it is hard to see that the veto is contrary to the claims of the deceased. While the deceased may have a claim to block retrieval, no one has a claim that other people use his or her organs. If the veto is in the interests of potential recipients, doctors may refuse the offer of organs by the deceased without infringing on the deceased's claim (Wilkinson 2007).

1.2.3 Change defaults so that organs are taken except when the deceased formally objected

This proposal favors what is variously called ‘opt-out’ or ‘presumed consent’. A ‘hard’ version would take organs even when the deceased's family objected (with all the problems mentioned in the previous sub-section); a ‘soft’ version would allow the family to veto retrieval. The leading argument in favour of opt-out claims that many people favour donation but through inertia do not get round to opting in. In an opt-out system, inertia would prevent them opting out so their organs could be taken and, since most people do want to donate, the deceased would be more likely to get what they want and more organs would be available (Thaler and Sunstein 2008).

The proposal envisages taking organs without the explicit consent of the deceased. One may object that people's rights over their bodies establish a duty of non-interference which can be lifted only with the consent of the rightholder (Kluge 2000). A different objection points out that taking organs without consent will sometimes be against the wishes of the deceased; and while not taking will be against the wishes of the deceased who had wanted to donate, taking in error is a worse mistake than not taking in error, because people have a right not to have their organs taken but no right to have their organs taken (Veatch 2000). As against these views, we must dispose of the bodies of the dead in some way, even if not consented to; and we give unconsented medical treatment to the unconscious even though some would have opposed treatment (Gill 2004; Wilkinson in press).

Using the bodies of the deceased without either their consent or knowing that they had wanted the use raises an important and difficult ethical question. It is very important to note, however, that this question is raised by virtually all existing organ procurement systems (see above on organ retrieval in practice). Moreover, the simple inertia argument for shifting defaults cannot be right as it stands because there is no default of non-retrieval in the absence of the deceased's consent. Other arguments for variations of opting out turn on the empirical question of effects on retrieval. Since many different factors affect retrieval rates, it is often hard to be confident about the difference that changes to consent would make.

1.2.4 Conscript organs

The idea of conscription is to take organs in all suitable cases even when the deceased or family objected (except, perhaps, in cases of conscientious objection). Unlike the other reform proposals, conscription seems to have little political support. Nonetheless, some powerful philosophical arguments can be given for it. One argument, mentioned above, compares the strength of the interests of the deceased, families, and potential recipients, and claims that the need for transplants of those with organ failure is much greater than the needs of the deceased or their families (Kamm 1993; Harris 2002, 2003). Another argument draws an analogy with the relief of poverty. Many think the state may use its coercive powers to transfer material resources from those with a surplus to those with little. In other words, we think that people have welfare rights to resources. One way to fulfil those rights is to tax the estates of the deceased. By parity of reasoning, because organs are also resources and no longer of use to the dead, they too should be coercively transferred to fulfil the welfare rights of those with organ failure (Fabre 2006).

Conscription may be politically infeasible or be subject to practical objections. But what of principled ethical objections? One could point to the distress that families would suffer (Brazier 2002), but what of the distress of the families of people who die for want of an organ? One could point to the interests of the deceased, but the arguments above do not deny that the deceased have interests; they claim that those interests are outweighed. One could claim that the deceased have rights that protect their interests and deny that potential recipients have rights to organs. Even if the deceased have rights and potential recipients do not, it would have to be shown that the rights of the deceased are not outweighed by the needs of those with organ failure.

2. Organ Retrieval from Living Donors

The successful early transplants used organs taken from living donors. For a long time, the hope was that, when technical problems were overcome, enough organs would be supplied by dead donors (Price 2009). That way, healthy living people need not undergo the risk and discomfort of non-therapeutic organ retrieval. That hope however was false and the persistent shortage of donors has led to the increasing use of living donors. Living donors are now the source of almost half the kidneys transplanted in the US and nearly a third in the UK. It has been estimated that 27,000 living donor kidney transplants occur worldwide each year and constitute 39% of all kidney transplants (Horvat et al. 2009). Not only are kidneys transplanted from living donors; so too are parts of livers and lungs. The rules governing donation have generally become more permissive, allowing donations from close genetic relatives, then spouses, then partners and friends, and, in some jurisdictions, even strangers.

The primary ethical question raised by living donation is to do with the risk of having an organ taken. Having an organ taken imposes risks of death, disease, and discomfort from trauma, infection, the use of a general anaesthetic, and the loss of all or part of an organ (although the liver will usually regenerate, replacing the part removed). These risks are not negligible. However, the risk of death is not enormous. It has been estimated that the risk of death from kidney retrieval is 1/3000. There appears to be no difference between healthy screened living kidney donors and the general population in long term survival and the risk of kidney failure. (Ibrahim et al. 2009). The mortality risk of liver donation is higher, about 1/500–1/200 for donation from adult to adult. (ASERNIPS–2004).

Under what conditions, if any, is it permissible to impose such a risk on someone who will receive no therapeutic benefit? For competent people, it is overwhelmingly accepted that their valid consent is a necessary condition of morally permissible retrieval. (A very few writers disagree, e.g., Rakowski 1991 and, less clearly, Fabre 2006). But even if consent is necessary, it may not be sufficient, and a further question is how much risk it is permissible to impose even on those who consent. Living donor transplantation also raises important questions about the validity of consent and about whether organs may ever be taken from healthy non-competent people, such as children.

2.1 “Do no harm”

Medical ethics traditionally instructs clinicians not to harm people. Taking organs from healthy people does seem to harm them, so living donor transplantation appears contrary to traditional medical ethics. One reply is to say that the do no harm rule is a relic of the medical profession's paternalism; if people want to donate their organs and know what they are doing, why stop them (Veatch 2000)? This reply raises the difficult problem, discussed below, of how far consent justifies harm. Another reply is to say that taking organs from living donors may not be all-things-considered harmful to them.

Suppose a person were prevented from donating an organ. On the one hand, the person would avoid the risks of physical harm. But, on the other, the person may suffer what are, in the medical literature, called ‘psychosocial harms’. These could include loneliness from losing a relative, having to act as caregiver to a person with organ failure, and survivor guilt. In philosophical terms, a person may also suffer vicarious harm. People whose welfare is intertwined with others suffer a loss when the other person does (Feinberg 1984; Raz 1986). Quite possibly, then, a person who donates may not suffer harm all-things-considered, that is, when all the different instances of harm are weighed up.

The argument about psychosocial and vicarious harms may support only living donation when donor and recipient do share a relationship. It may not support retrieval from altruistic strangers (den Hartogh 2008a).

The do no harm argument against living donation is not widely accepted—that is why living donation proceeds apace. Nonetheless, even if the physical harm can be outweighed by the need to avoid other harms, or by consent, or both, one may think that as a matter of policy living donation should be discouraged. One fear is that increasing the use of living donors relieves the pressure to find ways to get more organs from other sources, notably the deceased.

2.2 Valid Consent

Assuming consent is ethically necessary before taking organs from living competent people, questions arise about what makes consent valid. The usual answer in medical ethics is that consent must be free (voluntary), sufficiently informed, and made by someone with the capacity (competence) to consent. Thus, in the context of living donation, people must know what living donation involves, including the risks to them and the chances of success for the recipient, they must be able to decide freely whether to donate, and they must be competent to do so.

Can people freely give consent when considering whether to donate to a close relative? It may be thought that consent in such a case is suspect because potential donors would be: (1) desperate to save their relatives (2) subject to a feeling of moral obligation or (3) subject to family pressure. The first two reasons are not good ones. People give valid consent in other desperate circumstances, for instance to a lifesaving operation, and acting out of a reasonable sense of moral obligation is a way of exercising one's freedom rather than a constraint upon it (we consider below unusual senses of obligation in the context of religious stranger donation).

Family pressure is different. Family pressure may take the form of credible threats of violence, in which case the potential donor is coerced and any consent invalid. Family pressure may be felt as a form of moral obligation on the part of the donor, in which case (see above) consent would not be made invalid for that reason. Somewhat harder to think through is family pressure that consists of the implicit threat of ostracism. On the one hand, that pressure may be very effective. On the other, it works by family members withdrawing their goodwill, something people are generally entitled to do. Some views of coercion and valid consent would imply that consent to avoid ostracism would be valid (e.g., Nozick 1974); others not (e.g., Cohen 1988). As it happens, transplanters will often furnish reluctant donors with ‘white lies’ to enable them to avoid donating while retaining the appearance of honour. For instance, reluctant donors may be told to say they are clinically unsuitable on anatomical grounds. Whether ‘white lies’ are mandatory or even permissible depends partly on resolving the question of when family pressure undercuts valid consent (den Hartogh 2008b).

Many living donor programs use extensive psychosocial screening as well as a lengthy consent process (Price 2000). Potential donors are screened for physical health, which is largely uncontroversial, but they are also screened for their motivations. The typical advice is to screen for excessive sense of duty, undue influence, unconscious internal neurotic influences, and abnormal emotional involvement. Screening of this nature is more controversial since it involves making difficult judgements about what counts as excessive in a sense of duty, undue in influence, and abnormal in emotional involvement, and it requires spotting neurotic influences. At least in the past, some critics have thought that transplant professionals have overused their power to refuse people as donors (MacFarquhar 2009).

To take one example, consider whether a member of a religious sect, such as the Jesus Christians, should be allowed to donate to a stranger. It may be thought that such a person could not be giving valid consent, perhaps because of what a sect has done (the ‘brainwashing’ worry) or because of some psychological vulnerability. However, it is often difficult to decide whether a way of influencing someone is illegitimate or whether motivations and beliefs are signs of mental illness (see entry on Mental Illness).

2.3 The moral force of consent

Assuming a potential donor would give valid consent, how far would that justify retrieval of organs? The do no harm rule implies that people should not be harmed even with their consent although, as was said earlier, some living organ donation may not harm the donor all-things-considered. Suppose a man wanted to donate his second kidney to his second son, having already donated a kidney to another son, thus paying the price of a life on dialysis. Suppose a parent wanted to donate her heart to her child, thus causing her own death. Would transplant teams act wrongly if they took organs in such cases? And—what is a separate question—should they be allowed to?

It cannot be assumed that, in these desperate cases, the parents would be all-things-considered harmed by retrieval. Whether they are would depend on how the correct specification of harm handles vicarious harms and psychosocial harms. Perhaps a parent could be better off dead than to have to live without her child (which is not to say that her reason to donate is self-interest).

Suppose, though, that genuinely consensual organ retrieval would all-things-considered harm the donor. One way to try to decide when retrieval should nonetheless be permitted is to compare the values of autonomy with well-being. The question would then become an aspect of familiar debates about paternalism and the limits of consent. Living donation does have the unusual twist that, if one were to prevent donation, one would prevent an act of considerable value to a badly off person, the potential recipient. Moreover, to prevent living donation would be dissimilar to many acts of state paternalism, such as mandatory wearing of seat belts or the prohibition of certain drugs, in that donating an organ would not generally be the result of inattention, weak-will, addiction, or excessive short-sightedness. Because of its value to the recipient and because donors' choices are not obviously flawed, living donation of the sorts that actually take place should be allowed and seems ethically permissible.

What about organ donation that goes beyond what is currently permitted, such as the donation of the second kidney or donation of an organ necessary for life? Liberal democracies do not generally allow consent to be a defence to bodily harm at or well below the level of death (Price 2000), but should they? The answer turns in part on how far third parties—transplant teams in this case—may inflict harms on those who genuinely give autonomous consent or, to put it another way, the extent to which autonomous people can waive their rights of bodily integrity. But policy considerations are also relevant. Can one be sure that consent is genuine? Would some people be forced into consenting in a way that a screening process would fail to detect? If so, how much weight should be attached to cases where organs are taken without genuine consent? These questions arise for living donation in general, but the errors are worse in cases where severe harm or death is the certain consequence of donation. (The questions also arise in the debates about whether voluntary slavery or euthanasia should be permitted (Feinberg 1986)).

2.4 Incompetent living donors

Although rules and practices governing living donation have generally become much more permissive, they have become stricter in the case of incompetent donors (Price 2000). In fact, live children have never been used as a source of organs in the UK (Brazier 2003) and there have been only 60 cases in the US between 1987 and 2000 (out of approximately 40,000 live kidney donations) (Ross et al. 2008). As the discussion above of psychosocial screening implies, competence is not always easily determined, but let us assume in this section that we are considering clearly incompetent donors, namely relatively young children and people with severe mental disabilities or illnesses.

If valid consent were a necessary condition of ethically permissible organ retrieval from the living, then retrieval from incompetent donors would be wrong. However, it is not clear why consent should be a necessary condition in all cases rather than only in those cases where people are capable of giving it.

Several arguments have been given for permitting retrieval from incompetent people. Utilitarian arguments appear to permit retrieval because the donor loses less than the recipient gains. On the face of it, however, that argument would support organ conscription from living competent people too. Some people have argued in specific cases that the person would have wanted to donate, thus using the idea of substituted judgement familiar in other cases of deciding for incompetent patients. However, substituted judgement is misapplied in cases where the person is not, and never has been, competent (Buchanan and Brock 1990). More plausibly, it may be thought that, at least in some cases, incompetent donors are not harmed by donating an organ. If a child's donation would save the life of a sibling with organ failure, the donor may gain in the psychosocial and vicarious senses described above in the discussion of the ‘do no harm’ rule. Donors may be no worse off for donating, in which case organ retrieval would not infringe on the ‘do no harm’ rule (Wilkinson 2011).

Even if organ retrieval from an incompetent donor were ethically permissible in a given case, it may be that policy considerations, such as the risk of abuse, would justify an outright ban. Some writers, though, believe that legal safeguards would be enough to protect incompetent donors from abuse (Munson 2002).


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