Supplement to Location and Mereology

1. Additional arguments concerning interpenetration

1.1 Arguments for the possibility of interpenetration

From thing-region dualism and conditional reflexivity

The argument has three premises, and its conclusion is inconsistent with No Interpenetration:

Premise 1: Thing-Region Dualism
There are material objects, and each of them is exactly located at some region, but material objects and regions are ‘separate entities’ in the following sense: no material object shares a part with any region. In symbols:
xM(x) & ∀x[M(x) → ∃y[R(y) & L(x, y)]] & ∀xy[[(M(x) & R(y)] → ¬O(x, y)]
Premise 2: Conditional Reflexivity
If some entity is exactly located at y, then y is exactly located at itself. ‘Locations are self-located’. In symbols:
xy[L(x, y) → L(y, y)]
Premise 3: The Reflexivity of Parthood
Each entity is a part of itself. In symbols: ∀xP(x, x)
Conclusion: Thing-Region Interpenetration
There is a concrete material object, x, and a region, y, such that:
  1. x is exactly located at y (given Thing-Region Dualism),
  2. y is exactly located at y (given Conditional Reflexivity), and
  3. y overlaps itself (given Reflexivity), but
  4. x does not overlap y (given Thing-Region Dualism).
In symbols:
xy[M(x) & R(y) & L(x, y) & L(y, y) & O(y, y) & ¬O(x, y)]

Put roughly: my location and I have the same location, and hence our locations overlap, but we ourselves do not overlap. (I am a material object, and my parts are all material objects in their own right—arms, legs, organs, cells, molecules, subatomic particles. My location is a spacetime region, and its parts are all spacetime regions, some of which may be simple spacetime points. None of its parts is a material object.)

Some will respond by denying Conditional Reflexivity, presumably in favor of the view that locations do not themselves have locations. (Conditional Reflexivity is an axiom of the theory of location due to Casati and Varzi (1999). For discussion of that system, see the appendix on An Interpenetration-Friendly Theory of Location.)

Others will deny Thing-Region Dualism (Schaffer 2009). For example, supersubstantivalists say that material objects are identical to (hence overlap) their exact locations; and thing-region coincidentalists say that material objects mereologically coincide with (hence overlap) their exact locations, though they are not identical to them.

Finally, some will accept the above argument and will drop No Interpenetration but will still insist that material objects (or perhaps non-regions more generally) cannot interpenetrate. As was noted in the body of the article, they are free to accept (13*).

From sets

Penelope Maddy (1990: 59) claims that a material object and its singleton (the set whose only member is the given material object) are co-located. This claim plays a crucial role in her defense of the view that we can acquire knowledge of mathematical entities by perceiving sets. More generally, she claims that if x has a location, then x and {x} have the same location (1990: 59). David Lewis also takes this view seriously, though he ultimately claims to be agnostic on the issue (1991: 31–33).

Let x be a material object that is located at region r. Given the Maddy view, {x} is exactly located at r as well. So x and {x} have overlapping exact locations. But presumably a thing and its singleton do not literally share parts, at least when the thing is a non-set. So: x and {x} are disjoint things with overlapping exact locations.

The view that non-sets, at least, are disjoint from their singletons seems to be standard and is defended by Lewis (1991: 3–10). Caplan, Tillman, and Reeder (2010) defend the view that singletons do have their members as parts and hence overlap their members.

Again, even if sets generate counterexamples to No Interpenetration, they pose no threat to the restricted principle (13*), since sets are not material objects.

From a more detailed recombination principle

Saucedo (2011) formulates a more detailed version of the recombination principle that is designed to overcome difficulties facing the recombination arguments due to Sider and McDaniel. Saucedo arrives at his principle by successive refinements of a vaguely Humean idea: there are no necessary connections between distinct fundamental properties or relations. Saucedo's principle allows that

  • logical truths (sentences whose negations do not have models) are necessary, e.g.,
    • x[Mass-two-grams(x) v ¬Mass-two-grams(x)]
      For each thing x, either x is two grams in mass or it is not two grams in mass
  • some sentences that are not logical truths but that contain certain non-logical predicates (predicates aside from the identity symbol) expressing non-fundamental properties or relations may be necessary, e.g.,
    • x[Bachelor(x) → Male(x)]
      All bachelors are male
  • some sentences that contain non-logical predicates expressing properties or relations that are related as determinate to determinable, or as determinates of the same determinable, may be necessary (even if these sentences are not logical truths and all of their predicates express fundamental properties or relations), e.g.,
    • x[Mass-two-grams(x) → Massive(x)]
      Anything that is two grams in mass is massive.
    • ¬∃x[Mass-two-grams(x) & Mass-three-grams(x)]
      Nothing is both two grams in mass and three grams in mass.
  • some sentences that contain just one non-logical predicate may be necessary (even if these sentences are not logical truths, and all of their non-logical predicates express fundamental properties or relations, and no two of their predicates express properties or relations that related as determinate to determinable or as determinates of the same determinable), e.g.,
    • xyz[[P(x, y) & P(y, z)] → P(x,z)]
      Parthood is transitive
    • xyz[[L(x, y) & L(x, z)] → y=z]
      Nothing has more than one exact location

But Saucedo's principle claims that there are no necessary truths that are not logical consequences of the collection of necessarily true sentences in the above categories. Here is a somewhat streamlined statement of Saucedo's principle:

Let L be a first-order language containing standard logical vocabulary: the truth-functional connectives, first-order variables and quantifiers, and the identity predicate, and suppose that each non-logical predicate of L expresses exactly one fundamental property or relation, and that each fundamental property or relation is expressed by exactly one predicate of L. Let T be the set of metaphysically necessary sentences of L that contain occurrences of at most one non-logical predicate, and let φ be a sentence of L that does not contain occurrences of two or more predicates expressing properties or relations that are related as determinate to determinable or as determinates of the same determinable. Finally, suppose that the union of {φ} and T has a model. Then φ is possible, i.e., there is a metaphysically possible world at which φ is true.

RP purports to set out an informative sufficient condition for metaphysical possibility. It does not purport to analyze the notion of possibility or to give conditions that are both necessary and sufficient for possibility.

Saucedo argues that given RP, we should admit that the sentence

xyzw[L(x, z) & L(y, w) & P(w, z) & ¬∃u[P(u, x) & P(u, y)]]
For some x and some y, x has an exact location that is a part of an exact location of y, but x and y themselves do not share any parts

is true at some possible world. After all, the only non-logical predicates in ψ are ‘L’ for the exact location relation and ‘P’ for the parthood relation, it's plausible that both relations are fundamental, and they do not seem to be related as determinate to determinable or as determinates of the same determinable. Moreover, the negation of ψ is not a logical truth (ψ has a model), and it's doubtful that the negation of ψ is a logical consequence of any set of necessary truths of the appropriately restricted types. For example, ψ does not seem to violate any ‘purely locational’ axiom or any ‘purely mereological’ axiom. Indeed, ψ is presumably logically consistent with T, the set of necessarily true sentences each of which contains at most one non-logical predicate, and each of whose non-logical predicates expresses a fundamental property or relation; that is, the union of {ψ} and T presumably has a model. (Saucedo attempts to establish the existence of such a model more rigorously on the basis of some very weak possibility claims, but the argument is complex and resists compression.)

If there is such a model, then, given RP, it follows that ψ is true at some possible world. If it is, then it's possible for disjoint things to have exact locations one of which is a part of the other. Given that Reflexivity is necessary, such locations must overlap, which yields a violation of No Interpenetration.

One might object to Saucedo's version of the recombination argument by denying the assumption that parthood and location are both fundamental and are ‘determinably-distinct’—i.e., not related at determinate-to-determinable or as determinates of the same determinable (Donnelly 2010: 204, note 3).

For example, if one thinks that it is a necessary truth that entities are identical to their exact locations, then one deny Saucedo's assumption that the relation of exact location is fundamental. For in that case one will find it natural to offer the following definition or analysis of that relation (where ‘is a region’ is treated as undefined):

x is exactly located at y =df (i) y is a region, and (ii) x=y

Clause (i) is needed to avoid the result that the number 17, e.g., is exactly located at itself.

Alternatively, one might object to Saucedo's by rejecting his recombination principle, RP. Perhaps the most distinctive feature of Saucedo's argument for the possibility of interpenetration is the way it generalizes. The core idea underlying RP is that there are no brute necessary connections between determinably-distinct fundamental relations, such as parthood and location. Parthood has its purely mereological axioms, exact location has its purely locational axioms, and there are the logical consequences of these, but there are no basic ‘mixed’ axioms that link parthood and location. This probably means that No Interpenetration is not a necessary truth. But if so, then it also probably means that even Weak Expansivity,

xyzw[(P(x, y) & L(x, z) & L(y, w)) → P(z,w)]

is not a necessary truth, since it too is a mixed principle and does not seem to be a logical consequence of any collection of necessary truths that are either purely mereological or purely locational. Likewise for all other basic ‘mixed’ principles, no matter how plausible.

Indeed, as Saucedo notes, if RP yields an argument for the possibility of violations of No Interpenetration, then it yields a parallel and equally forceful argument for the possibility of worlds in which an object x is a part of an object y, but xs lone exact location is disjoint from (and, for vividness, say 10 miles away from) ys lone exact location! Saucedo himself accepts the relevant possibilities, but others may prefer to reject any recombination principle strong enough to lead to them.

1.2 An argument against the possibility of interpenetration

From thing-region coincidentalism

Supersubstantivalism+ is the view that necessarily, each entity is identical to anything at which it is exactly located. A related but weaker view is

Thing-Region Coincidentalism ⃞∀xy[L(x, y) → CO(x,y)]
Necessarily, if x is exactly located at y, then x mereologically coincides with y
(See Hawthorne 2006, 118, note 18; Schaffer 2009.)

Thing-Region Coincidentalism is similar to Supersubstantivalism+, in that it holds that all located entities are ‘fundamentally made up of spacetime’, but it is consistent with the view that in some cases an entity—even a material object—is not identical to its exact location. (One might hold that Descartes' body is not identical to its exact location, on the grounds that his body but not its exact location could have had a 70-year-long time span.)

Thing-Region Coincidentalism entails No Interpenetration. Take any objects x and y in any possible world, and suppose that they have exact locations, r1 and r2 respectively, that overlap. Then, given Thing-Region Coincidentalism, x overlaps exactly the same things as r1, and y overlaps exactly the same things as r2. So, since r1 overlaps r2, x overlaps r2 as well. And since r2 overlaps x, y overlaps x. Hence x and y are not disjoint.

Like the friend of Supersubstantivalism+, the friend of Thing-Region Coincidentalism can respond to Saucedo's recombination argument against No Interpenetration by treating the relation of exact location as non-fundamental. As Hawthorne notes (2006: 118, note 18), something like the following definition is available:

x is exactly located at y =df
(i) y is a region and (ii) x mereologically coincides with y.

As in the case of (DL), the first clause is needed to avoid the result that if the number 17 coincides with itself, then it is exactly located at itself.

It is worth pointing out that Thing-Region Coincidentalism is no better off than Supersubstantivalism+ with respect to examples involving universals, tropes, or sets. Those who take such entities to be spatiotemporally located will presumably want to say that there are cases in which two or more tropes [universals, sets, …] that do not mereologically coincide with each other nevertheless have the same exact location. But if there are such cases, then (given the symmetry and transitivity of mereological coincidence) at least one of the located entities in question must fail to coincide mereologically with the location in question.

2. Additional arguments concerning extended simples

2.1 Arguments against the possibility of extended simples

From reference

The argument from reference appeals to the view that if an entity is extended, then we can successfully think and talk about (e.g.) its top half or bottom half. The argument can be framed as follows:

Let o be a material object, and suppose that it is extended and, say, ball-shaped. Then it must have proper parts. For surely the sentence ‘o's top half has the same shape as its bottom half’ is true. Moreover, that sentence is subject-predicate in form and the expression ‘os top half’ serves as its subject term. When combined with the Tarskian principle that a subject-predicate sentence s is true only if each of s's subject terms refers to something, this gives us the result that:

There is an x such that ‘o's top half’ refers to x.


For any x, if ‘o's top half’ refers to x, then: x is a part of o and xo.

Taken together, (R1) and (R2) entail that o is complex, not simple. So, from the assumption that o is ball-shaped, we have derived the conclusion that x is not simple. This line of reasoning seems perfectly general; presumably some similar and equally forceful argument would apply to any extended entity (regardless of its specific shape) in any possible world.

Friends of extended simples have a variety of replies. One might say that ‘o's top half has the same shape as its bottom half’ is false, though nearly as good as true for all practical purposes. (An eliminativist about holes might say something similar about ‘the hole in that doughnut is round’.) Alternatively, one might deny (R2). In particular, one might say that ‘o's top half’ refers not to any part of o, but to: (i) a certain region, namely, the top half of o's exact location, or (ii) a certain portion of stuff, namely the top half of the portion of stuff that constitutes of o. (See Markosian (1998 and 2004a) for discussion.)

From divisibility

This argument is based on the thought that being extended entails being divisible, which in turn entails having proper parts. One version of the argument runs as follows:

Necessarily, if x is extended, then it is possible for x to be divided (where to be divided is to undergo a topological change of a certain sort).
Necessarily, if it is possible for x to be divided, then x has proper parts.
Necessarily, if x is extended, then x has proper parts.

In response, friends of extended simples have raised doubts about both premises. With regard to (DV1), one might think that there could be extended entities that, as a matter of metaphysical necessity, cannot be divided. Further, one might argue that (DV1) depends upon reading ‘extended’ as ‘spatially extended’. For consider an object is extended only temporally: it is temporally extended but spatially point-like. How does its being extended contribute to its being divisible? Consider Judith Jarvis Thomson's remark: ‘Homework: try breaking a bit of chalk into its two temporal halves’ (1983: 212). Thus the argument from divisibility shows at most that spatially extended simples are impossible. With regard to (DV2), one might argue that (i) when a ball is divided into two separate halves, these halves need not have existed prior to the division. Hence the ball may well have been simple (though divisible) before it was actually divided. Alternatively, one might claim that (ii) simples can be scattered. In that case one could say that the ball was simple even after it was divided, not to mention before! (See Markosian 1998; Carroll and Markosian 2010, 203–210 for more on these issues.)

2.2 Arguments for the possibility of extended simples

From Avogadro

Josh Parsons claims that extended simples not just possible but actual on the basis of what he calls the ‘Argument from Avogadro’ (2000: 404):

All mereological simples are extensionless. (Assume for reductio)
There are only finitely many [material] simples.
All [material] objects are mereological sums of [material] simples.
All [material] objects are sums of finitely many extensionless things (from V1, V2, and V3)
All sums of only finitely many extensionless things are extensionless.
All [material] objects are extensionless (from V4 and V5)
But of course some [material] objects are extended!
Some simples [indeed, some material simples] have extension. (reductio against V1).

Parsons thinks that V2 and V3 are empirically well-confirmed. Some will deny this. A natural thing for supersubstantivalists to say, e.g., is that some complex material objects are sums of continuum-many spacetime points. But let us grant V2 and V3 for the sake of argument.

Even so, one might find the argument unconvincing. In order for V5 to be plausible, ‘extensionless’ cannot mean ‘having the size and shape of a point’: after all, the sum of two spatially separated things each of which has the size and shape of a point will not itself have the size and shape of a point! Instead, ‘extensionless’ will need to mean something like ‘having zero length, zero area, and zero volume’. This makes V7 questionable. It may be obvious that some material objects do not have the same size and shape as a point; that is, it may be obvious that some material objects are at least scattered. But is it obvious that some objects have non-zero length, non-zero, or non-zero volume? Is it obvious that some objects are not merely scattered, but actually fill up a continuous 1-, 2-, 3-, or 4- dimensional region?

From Planck

David Braddon-Mitchell and Kristie Miller suggest that considerations from quantum theory count in favor of extended simples:

Here … is the physical hypothesis about our world that we will consider. Our world contains objects—little two-dimensional squares—that are Planck length by Planck length (an area of 10−66 cms). Are such objects in any sense extended? We think it is plausible that they are. … Is [there] any robust sense in which [such a square] has spatial parts? … [P]lausibly, it is at least necessary that a proper spatial part is an object that occupies a region of space that is a sub-region occupied by the whole… But if proper parts occupy sub-regions of space occupied by the whole, then we have good reason to suppose that given the actual physics of space-time, our Planck square has no such parts. For physicists tell us that we cannot divide up space into any finer-grained regions that those constituted by Planck squares (Greene 2004: 480; Amati, Ciafaloni, and Veneziano 1989; Gross and Mede 1988; Roveli and Smolin 1995). … Hence we know that talking about something occupying a sub-region of a Planck square makes no sense: there is no such sub-region. … But if it makes no sense to talk about the sub-regions of the Planck square, then given our minimal necessary condition of proper parthood, it follows that Planck squares do not have proper mereological parts: they are spatial simples. (2006: 223–224)

Braddon-Mitchell and Miller's argument is, in the first instance, an argument for extended simple regions, and only derivatively an argument for extended simple objects that are exactly located at those regions. As a result, they are able to retain the principle NXS, which says that it is impossible for a simple object to be exactly located at a complex region. Since they find NXS plausible, they see this as an advantage of their argument. (For further discussion of extended simple regions of space or spacetime, see Tognazzini 2006, Spencer 2010, and Dainton 2010: 294–301.)

From sets

The argument from sets turns on the claim (endorsed by Maddy 1990: 59 and sympathetically entertained by Lewis 1991: 32–33) that if x is exactly located at y then so is xs singleton, {x}:

My body is exactly located at a complex, spatially extended spacetime region.
For any x and any y, if x is exactly located at y, then {x} is exactly located at y.
For any x, {x} is simple.
There is a simple entity (namely, {my body}) that is exactly located at a complex, spatially extended spacetime region.

The argument has no force for those who deny that sets are spatiotemporally located or for those who say that even singleton sets have proper parts. And of course one is free to say that while some entities in certain categories can be both extended and simple, material objects cannot.

From a more detailed recombination principle

Saucedo's recombination argument for the possibility of extended simples is very similar to his argument for the possibility of interpenetration discussed earlier. Roughly put, he appeals to (i) the principle that there are no necessary truths linking parthood and exact location that cannot be derived from purely mereological necessary truths and purely locational necessary truths, together with (ii) the claim that the sentence

xy[L[(x, y) & C(y)] → C(x)]

cannot be so derived. From this it follows that the negation of the above sentence is true with respect to some possible world, i.e., that it is possible for a simple entity to be exactly located at a complex location. As we noted earlier, his recombination principle is subject to the objection that it proves too much. (Other works on extended simples include: Rea 2001; Scala 2002; Zimmerman 2002; Markosian 2004b; McDaniel 2003a; McKinnon 2003; Hudson 2005, 2007; Sider 2007, 2011: 79–82; and Horgan and Potrč 2008. Simons 2004 offers a wide-ranging and scientifically informed defense of extended simples, with special attention to the history of the idea.)

3. Additional arguments concerning multilocation

3.1 Does Saucedo's recombination principle yield an argument for the possibility of multilocation?

Interestingly, Saucedo's recombination principle, which he uses to argue for interpenentration, extended simples, and a range of more exotic possibilities, cannot be used to argue for the possibility of multilocation. The reason for this is that the ban on multilocation can be stated as a ‘purely locational’ axiom, with ‘L’ as its lone non-logical predicate:

Functionalityxyz[[L(x, y) & L(x, z)] → y=z]

Hence, so far as Saucedo's recombination principle is concerned, Functionality may well be a necessary truth.

3.2 Arguments against the possibility of multilocation

From Three- and Four-Dimensionality

Stephen Barker and Phil Dowe argue that if a thing is exactly located at more than one region, then it will have incompatible shapes:

Take a multi-located entity O, be it enduring entity or universal. Say that O is multi-located throughout a 4D space-time region R. Thus there is a division of R into sub-regions r, such that O is wholly located at each r. If O is an enduring entity, the rs will be temporal slices of R. If O is a universal, the rs will either be temporal slices or spatio-temporal slices of R, say points. Consider then the following paradox:

Paradox 1:
At each r that is a sub-region of R, there is an entity—a universal, or enduring entity—of a certain kind. Call it Or. Take the fusion, or mereological sum, of all such Ors . Call the fusion F(Or):
  1. Each such Or is a 3D entity, since it is located at a 3D sub-region r. Or is an entity with non-zero spatial extent and zero temporal extent. Each Or is identical to every other. So each Or is identical with F(Or). So, F(Or) is a 3D entity.
  2. F(Or) has parts at every sub-region of R. So it has non-zero spatial and temporal extent. F(Or) is a 4D entity.
Conclusion: F(Or) is both 3D and 4D, but that is a contradiction since being 3D means having no temporal extent, and being 4D means having temporal extent. (Barker and Dowe 2003: 107)

McDaniel (2003b) argues that the endurantist should respond by distinguishing between two ways of having a shape: an object can have a shape intrinsically (by virtue of the way the object is in itself) or extrinsically (by virtue of occupying a region that has the given shape intrinsically). In that case, he suggests, the endurantist can say that Barker and Dowe's entity O is intrinsically three-dimensional and only extrinsically four-dimensional, where there is nothing impossible about having one shape intrinsically and an incompatible shape extrinsically.

A different response, variants of which have been defended by Beebee and Rush (2003), Gibson and Pooley (2006: 193, note 17), Gilmore (2006: 201), and Sattig (2006: 50), runs as follows. The object O is three-dimensional at each of the rs, since it is exactly located at each of them and each them is three-dimensional. If it could be shown that O is also exactly located at R, the sum of the rs, then we would need to say that O is four-dimensional at R. But this has not been shown, and the friend of multilocation is under no apparent pressure to accept it. Moreover, even if it were shown, the most that would result (given a relativizing approach to shapes) is that O is three-dimensional at each of the rs and four-dimensional at R. But there is nothing obviously impossible about this, since none of the rs is identical to R. (Barker and Dowe 2003 offer additional arguments against multilocation that we will not discuss here, as does Lowe 2002, 382–383. For further relevant discussion, see Barker and Dowe 2005, D. Smith 2008, and Benovsky 2009.)

From time travel and weak supplementation

Nikk Effingham and Jon Robson (2007) have argued that the possibility of backward time travel gives rise to mereological problems for multilocation, at least in its endurantist form. They consider a case in which a certain enduring brick, Brick1, travels backward in time repeatedly, so that it exists at a certain time, t100, ‘many times over’. At that time there exist what appear to be one hundred bricks, call them Brick1 … Brick100, though in fact each of them is identical to Brick1 (on one or another of its journeys to the time t100), and a bricklayer arranges ‘them’ into what appears to be a brick wall, Wall. Effingham and Robson write that

There is a principle of mereology known as the Weak Supplementation Principle (WSP) which states that every object with a proper part has another proper part that does not overlap the first. If Brick1, Brick2, …, Brick100 composed a wall, WSP would be false. Consider: any object that was a part of the wall would have to overlap some brick, and as every brick is Brick1 if that object overlaps some brick it overlaps Brick1. Therefore if at t100 Brick1, Brick2, …, Brick100 composed a wall, there would be no object that could be a proper part of the wall that does not overlap Brick. Given Brick is a proper part of that wall, WSP would then be false (2007: 634–635).

Effingham and Robson take this case as a reason to reject locational endurantism. Donald Smith (2009) replies by rejecting WSP and arguing that this is independently motivated, though see Effingham (2010) for a reply. Maureen Donnelly (2011a) offers a response similar in spirit to Smith's.

Cody Gilmore (2009) replies by conceding for the sake of argument that WSP is correct, modulo considerations about the adicy of parthood: if the fundamental parthood relation is two-place, then WSP itself is correct, if the fundamental parthood relation is three-place and time-indexed (Thomson 1983), then a time-indexed version of WSP is correct, and so on. (Recall our provisional assumption in section one that parthood is two-place. We are now considering a reason for dropping that assumption.)

Gilmore then argues that friends of multilocation have independent reasons—reasons having nothing to do with time travel or WSP—to treat the fundamental parthood relation as a four-place relation. (This view has been independently developed and criticized by Shieva Kleinschmidt; see, e.g., Kleinschmidt 2011.) The relation in question can be expressed by the open sentence ‘x, at y, is a part of z, at w’ or, in symbols, ‘P4(x, y, z, w)’. It is naturally taken to be governed by the following ‘mereo-locational’ principle (among others):

LLPxyzw[P4(x, y, z, w) → [L(x, y) & L(z,w)]]
If x at y is a part of z at w, then: x is exactly located at y and z is exactly located at w.

Gilmore suggests that the relation is governed by the following ‘four-place analogues’ of the reflexivity and transitivity of parthood:

Reflexivity4Pxy[L(x, y) → P4(x, y, x, y)]
If x is exactly located at y, then x at y is a part of x at y.

Transitivity4Px1x2y1y2z1z2[[P4(x1, x2, y1, y2) & P4(y1, y2, z1, z2)] → P4(x1, x2, z1, z2)]
If x1 at x2 is a part of y1 at y2 and y1 at y2 is a part of z1 at z2, then x1 at x2 is a part of z1 at z2.

Finally, Gilmore argues that Effingham and Robson's case respects the most natural four-place analogue of WSP, viz.:

WSP4Px1x2y1y2[[P4(x1, x2, y1, y2) & [x1y1x2y2]] → z1z2[P4(z1, z2, y1, y2) & ¬∃w1w2[O4(z1, z2, x1, x2)]]
If x1 at x2 is a part of y1 at y2 and either x1 is not identical to y1 or x2 is not identical to y2, then for some z1 and some z2: z1 at z2 is a part of y1 at y2 and z1 at z2 does not overlap x1 at x2,

where the four-place predicate for overlapping is defined via:

Overlapping4P O4(x1, x2, y1, y2) =dfz1z2[P4(z1, z2, x1, x2) & P4(z1, z2, y1,y2)
x1at x2 overlaps y1 at y2’ means ‘some z1, at some z2, is a part both of x1 at x2 and of y1 at y2

To see why Effingham and Robson's case respects WSP4P, according to Gilmore, consider Figure 1, which depicts a different and somewhat more complicated case:

Figure 1
Figure 1: Two rows of five boxes each.  The first row boxes are a light shaded box labeled 'a', a medium shaded box labeled 'b', a dark shaded box labeled 'c', a small gap, a medium shared box labeled 'b' and a dark shared box labeled 'f'.  Boxes 'a' and first 'b' are bracketed and labeled 'd'; Boxes first 'b' and 'c' are bracketed and labeled 'e'; Boxes second 'b' and 'f' are bracketed and labeled 'e'.  The second row boxes are all white with dotted borders; they are labeled 'ra', 'rb1', 'rc', a small gap, 'rb2', 'rf'.  Boxes 'ra' and 'rb1' are bracketed and labeled 'rd'; Boxes 'rb1' and 'rc' are bracketed and labeled 're1'; Boxes 'rb2' and 'rf' are bracketed and labeled 're2'.  Arrows connect each top row box to the corresponding box below.

Some facts about the case:

  • af are material objects
  • rarf are regions
  • b and e are multilocated
  • all other objects are singly located
  • e varies mereologically between locations: at re1, it is composed of b (at rb1) and c (at rc); at re2, it is composed of b (at rb2) at g (at rgr)


The crucial concept in WSP4P is the four-place concept of overlapping. To see how this concept applies, note that d at rd overlaps e at re1, since b, at rb is a part both of d at rd and of e and re1. However, d at rd does not overlap e at re2. There is no ordered ⟨x, r⟩ pair such that x at r is a part both of d at rd and of e at re2.

Turn now to a simplified version of Effingham and Robson's case, depicted in Figure 2:

Figure 2 Figure 2: Two rows of three rectangles each.  The first row the rectangles are shaded and labeled 'Brick1', 'Brick2', 'Brick3'; all three are bracketed and labeled 'Wall'.  The bottom row rectangles are white with dotted borders and labeled 'r1', 'r2', 'r3'; all three are bracketed and labeled 'rw'.  An arrow goes from each rectangle in the top row to the corresponding rectangle in the bottom row.

Here, Brick at r1 is a part of Wall at rw. Moreover, Brick at r1 is, in the relevant sense, a ‘proper part’ of Wall at rw, since either Brick1Wall or r1rw. (In fact both disjuncts hold.) So, we have a case in which WSP4P applies: its antecedent is satisfied. Accordingly, that principle tells us that there must be an ⟨x, r⟩ pair such that x at r is a part Wall at rw but does not overlap Brick1 at r1. One such pair is ⟨Brick1, r3⟩: Brick1 at r3 is a part of Wall at rw, but Brick1 at r3 does not overlap Brick1 at r1. There is no ⟨x, r⟩ pair such that x at r is a part both of Brick1 at r1 and of Brick1 at r3. (Contrast this with the case of overlapping involving d and e represented in the previous diagram.) So, Gilmore concludes, Effingham and Robson's case generates no apparent violation of WSP4P.

Kleinschmidt (2011) considers a variety of multilocation-based counterexamples to other popular mereological principles. She independently proposes the suggestion that they can be handled by taking parthood to be a four-place relation, though she ends up rejecting the four-place view.

Copyright © 2014 by
Cody Gilmore <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.