Impossible Worlds

First published Thu Sep 17, 2009; substantive revision Tue Sep 24, 2013

It is a venerable slogan due to David Hume, and inherited by the empiricist tradition, that the impossible cannot be believed, or even conceived. In Positivismus und Realismus, Moritz Schlick claimed that, while the merely practically impossible is still conceivable, the logically impossible, such as an explicit inconsistency, is simply unthinkable.

An opposite philosophical view, however, maintains that inconsistencies and logical impossibilities are thinkable, and sometimes believable, too. In the Science of Logic, Hegel already complained against “one of the fundamental prejudices of logic as hitherto understood”, namely that “the contradictory cannot be imagined or thought” (Hegel 1931: 430). According to this alternative tradition, our representational capabilities are not limited to the possible, for we appear to be able to imagine and describe also impossibilities — perhaps, but not necessarily, without being aware that they are impossible.

Such impossibilities and inconsistencies are what this entry is about. In order to read it fruitfully, familiarity with the entry on possible worlds is presupposed. As we will see, many accounts of impossible worlds are best understood on the background (as extensions, or alternatives) of possible worlds theories — although, as we will also see, symmetries and similarities can sometimes break down in important respects. It is also suggested that the reader looks at the entry on modal logic in order to grasp some basic notions of worlds semantics.

We commonly speak of things being impossible in a relative, restricted sense. If you are stuck in a traffic jam in Paris Montparnasse at 2 PM, and your flight is leaving from airport Charles De Gaulle at 2:30 PM, you may moan: “There is no way that I can make it to the airport in time”. What you mean is that, given the timing, the means of transport available, and other circumstances, it is impossible for you to reach the airport in time. It is not unrestrictedly, absolutely impossible: if you had Star Trek's transporter, you could make it. But a Star Trek world in which you can be instantaneously disassembled into atoms, and re-assembled exactly with the same atomic structure in a different place, is a world quite different from ours. Some may doubt that such a world is physically possible, that is to say, compatible with the laws of physics holding at the actual world. We can, however, envisage it: the Star Trek stories describe a world with effective transporters. More generally, it is not too difficult to imagine worlds in which some fundamental physical law does not hold, e.g., where things move faster than the speed of light. Such situations may be regarded as physically impossible: impossible relative to the principles of physics that actually hold.

This entry is not about such worlds, though. For even if they can be deemed “impossible” in such restricted senses, they are not absolutely impossible. They still count as possible worlds, taking “possible” in an absolutely unrestricted sense (or at least, these are our intuitions; in fact, the claim that fictional worlds such as Star Trek's are possible turns on some subtle issues; but we can skip them here). This entry is about worlds that are not possible, with “possible” understood in a completely unrestricted sense. Start with the intuitive idea of the unrestricted totality of possible worlds, across which all and only the genuine possibilities are represented: the worlds we are interested in are not in there. These worlds are therefore often called logically impossible worlds, as logical laws such as the Law of Non-Contradiction or the Law of Excluded Middle are assumed to be the most general and topic-neutral: they are supposed to hold at all possible worlds. However, it is a matter of debate among philosophers whether there are other kinds of necessity, which are co-extensive with logical necessity on the totality of possible worlds (two such candidate unrestricted necessities are the mathematical and the metaphysical; we will come back to them in Section 5). From now on, we are therefore talking of impossible worlds simpliciter, meaning worlds that are not possible with respect to an unrestricted notion of possibility, however this is further characterized.

A look at the literature on impossible worlds (which is rapidly growing: see Nolan 2013 for a useful, comprehensive survey) presents us with a number of non-equivalent definitions. To put some order in the debate, these can be reduced to four main items.

Firstly, possible worlds are often introduced intuitively by referring to our common talk of “ways things could have been”. The actual world corresponds to the most general and comprehensive way in which things stand. But things could have been otherwise in lots of ways; and these alternative ways things could have been are (the other) possible worlds. Then, just as we identify possible worlds with ways things could have been, we can identify impossible worlds with ways things could not have been. Not everything is possible, that is, some things just (absolutely) cannot happen. Anything that just can't happen must be an absolute impossibility; and these ways the world could absolutely not be are impossible worlds (see e.g. Salmon 1984; Yagisawa 1988; Restall 1997; Beall & van Fraassen 2003).

Secondly, another definition has it that impossible worlds are worlds where the laws of logic fail. What these worlds will be depends, of course, on what we take the laws of logic to be. Given some logic L, an impossible world with respect to the L-laws is one in which those laws fail to hold (see e.g. Priest 2001, Chapter 9). An impossible world in this second sense will be an impossible world in the first sense, given that logical necessity is unrestricted. But not vice versa: supposing the Axiom of Choice of set theory is true, and that mathematical necessity is unrestricted, a world where the Axiom of Choice fails can be impossible in the first sense without thereby violating any law of our favourite logic.

Thirdly, another definition claims that impossible worlds are worlds where specifically the laws of classical logic fail (see e.g. Priest 1997a). A world complying with intuitionistic logic, and where instances of the Law of Excluded Middle fail, will be impossible in the third sense.

A still more specific definition has it that an impossible world is a world that realizes explicit logical contradictions - in the simplest case: where sentences of the form A and ¬A hold, against the Law of Non-Contradiction (see e.g. Lycan 1994). Impossible worlds of the fourth kind will be impossible in the third sense, but not perforce vice versa. Our intuitionistic world above will have the Law of Non-Contradiction hold unrestrictedly: it will be impossible in the third sense, but not in the fourth sense.

1. Reasons for Introducing Impossible Worlds

Why should we believe in such anarchic items as impossible worlds? One first argument is the so-called “argument from ways” (Vander Laan 1997), which is related to the first definition of impossible world given above. This draws on the analogy with David Lewis' notorious argument concerning our quantifying on ways things could be or have been (see Lewis 1973: 84). The world could be or have been different in so many ways: Humphreys could have won the elections, I could be dancing on the ceiling, and Fermat's last Theorem could have remained without proof. Our belief in possible worlds is just a paraphrase of our belief that there are many ways the world could be or have been.

Aren't there also ways the world could not be? Some authors endorse the claim that anything is possible (e.g. Mortensen 1989). However, the majority of philosophers believe that not everything is possible, in the sense that some things just can't happen, that is, there are ways things cannot be: if I tell you that my College has a cupola which is round and square, you are likely to reply: “Well, it can't be that way!”. So it seems that “'ways' talk goes both ways” (Beall and van Fraassen 2003: 86): if quantification on ways the world could be should be taken at face value as providing evidence for possible worlds, then quantification on ways the world could not be should be taken at face value as providing evidence for impossible worlds.

The argument as such is hardly convincing. Firstly, one author's modus ponens is another's modus tollens. Some have used similar considerations, e.g., to argue against Lewis' modal realism (see Skyrms 1976; Naylor 1986): if one believes in possible worlds (of the Lewisian kind) as ways things could be or have been, then by parity of reasoning one should believe in impossible worlds (ditto) as ways things could not be or have been. But impossible worlds then are too much to swallow. So one should not believe in Lewis' modal realism.

Secondly, taking quantification on any kind of entities whatsoever at face value, and as ontologically committing, just because it is embedded in ordinary language, doesn't look like a promising general strategy. Lewis' case for accepting commitment to possible worlds did not consist in just pointing at our quantifying on ways the world could be or have been, but also in providing independent motivations for taking such quantification at face value. A non-reductive account of possible worlds, according to Lewis, brings net theoretical utility: the ontological cost is compensated by a theoretical gain, given the variety of ontological, semantic, and conceptual explanations allowed by our taking the notion of possible world seriously. This is likely to be the main motivation for believing in impossible worlds, too: as we will see in the following, and especially in Section 5, impossible worlds are theoretically quite useful.

Another argument on behalf of impossible worlds, quite pervasive in the literature (e.g. Beall & van Fraassen 2003, Chapter 4; Nolan 1997; Restall 1997; Brogaard & Salerno 2013), comes from counterpossible reasoning, which we can here understand as particular counterfactual reasoning from conditional antecedents which are not only false, but impossible. The initial claim is that we can reason non-trivially from impossible suppositions taken as counterfactual conditional assumptions: we assume something impossible as a counterfactual antecedent, and wonder what would be true then. Call trivially true a conditional when it is true, and the conditional that has the same antecedent and opposite (negated) consequent is also true. Now the view is that some counterfactuals with impossible antecedents (often called in these contexts “counterpossibles”, for brevity) are true, but not trivially so (“If Hobbes had squared the circle, then all mathematicians would have been amazed”); some are intuitively false (“If Hobbes had squared the circle, then Kennedy would not have been killed”). Discourse on ways things couldn't be has its own logic in a broad sense: some reasoning in it is correct, some is not. Since we have fruitfully analyzed our talk about counterfactuals in terms of worlds, why shouldn't we analyze our talk about counterpossibles (i.e., specific counterfactuals with impossible antecedents) in terms of impossible worlds?

The point readily generalizes to entire theories, and to serious philosophical and logical debates. We often reason counterfactually on logical, mathematical and metaphysical theories, which can be not only factually false, but necessarily so, not because they are especially bad, but because of the very nature of their subject matter. It should be pointed out that this argument stresses, again, the usefulness of impossible worlds as a device by means of which particular linguistic, logical and philosophical issues can be regimented and analyzed. If so, then the point can be expanded into the general “argument from utility” mentioned above: we should believe in impossible worlds because they are useful tools for logicians and philosophers; they have, as we will see throughout this entry, numerous applications, and cast light on important topics. Of course, broad acceptance of possible worlds is not as such commitment to a specific reply to the ensuing query: what kinds of entitites are such worlds? As we will see in Section 3, this question has been answered in very different ways.

2. The Logic(s) of Impossible Worlds

2.1 Impossible Worlds in Non-Normal Modal Logics

So-called Kripke semantics, or possible worlds semantics, is celebrated for having provided suitable interpretations for different axiomatic systems of modal logic, such as C.I. Lewis' systems S4 and S5, whereas before Kripke's work we had only lists of axioms or, at most, algebraic and rather uninformative semantics. But it was precisely Kripke who, in his 1965 paper, introduced a special kind of worlds, which were dubbed non-normal worlds, in order to provide worlds semantics for modal logics (called “non-normal” in their turn) weaker than the basic normal modal system K, such as C.I. Lewis' systems S2 and S3. Specifically, the non-normal modal systems at issue do not include the so-called Rule of Necessitation, which can be phrased (model-theoretically, rather than proof-theoretically) as follows:

If ⊨A, then ⊨□A.

This is the principle stating that, if a formula A is logically valid, i.e., a logical truth, then its necessitation, that is, the formula obtained by prefixing to it a box or necessity operator, is logically valid, too. In the standard semantics for normal modal logics, if ⊨A, that is, A is a logical truth, then it is true at all worlds of all interpretations. So given any world w, and standard accessibility relation between worlds, A is true at all worlds accessible from w, so also □A is true at w. Therefore, ⊨□A. Non-normal worlds enter the stage precisely in order to make Necessitation fail.

To make things precise, let us introduce some set-theoretic semantic machinery. We can keep things simple by limiting ourselves to the case of (non-normal) propositional modal logic, for this is sufficient to make the features of non-normal worlds emerge. Let us consider, then, a non-normal interpretation of a propositional modal language, ⟨W, N, R, v⟩, where W is a set of worlds; N is a proper subset of W, the set of normal worlds; R is a binary accessibility relation between worlds; and v is a valuation function assigning truth values to formulas at worlds, so that “vw(A)” denotes the truth value of formula A at world w. Worlds in WN are the non-normal worlds. The truth conditions for the extensional logical vocabulary (negation, conjunction, disjunction, the material conditional) are defined in the usual way. The same holds for the modal operators of necessity □ and possibility ◊, but only at normal worlds. If w is a non-normal world, then the truth conditions for the modalizers are defined as follows:

vw(□A) = 0

vw(◊A) = 1

Where 1 stands for true, 0 for false. This means that, at non-normal worlds, formulas of the form £A, with £ a modal operator, are not evaluated recursively depending on the truth value of A at other (accessible) worlds, but get assigned their truth value directly. Specifically, all box-formulas are false and all diamond-formulas are true. In a sense, non-normal worlds are worlds where nothing is necessary, but anything is possible. These worlds, however, are deviant only in this respect: their behavior, as far as the extensional connectives are concerned, is quite regular.

Next, logical validity and consequence are defined, respectively, in terms of holding and of truth preservation at normal worlds, thus (where S is a set of formulas):

A if and only if, for all interpretations ⟨W, N, R, v⟩, and all worlds wN, vw(A) = 1.

S ⊨ A if and only if, for all interpretations ⟨W, N, R, v⟩, and all worlds wN, if vw(B) = 1 for all formulas B ∈ S, then vw(A) = 1.

Restricting logical validity and consequence to normal worlds is a common move in worlds semantics that include non-normal or impossible worlds. The insight behind this comes from the second definition of impossible worlds we met above, as worlds where logic is different, or where logical laws may fail. If this is so, then we should not refer to, or quantify over, such worlds when we characterize logical validity and consequence: for these, we want to look only at possible or normal worlds, that is, worlds where logic is not different.

This setting is sufficient to make Necessitation fail in models including non-normal worlds. For take any classical propositional tautology, say A ∨ ¬A. This holds at all worlds of all interpretations, so ⊨ A ∨ ¬A. Therefore, □(A ∨ ¬A) holds at all normal worlds of any interpretation, so ⊨ □(A ∨ ¬A). But □(A ∨ ¬A) does not hold in any non-normal world. Therefore, □□(A ∨ ¬A) is false at normal worlds that have access, via R, to any non-normal world, and so ⊭ □□(A ∨ ¬A).

These semantics for non-normal modal logics such as S2 and S3 are based on a valuation function which assigns the same truth value to all box formulas (i.e., false) and all diamond formulas (i.e., true) at non-normal worlds. Before moving on, we can mention the modal system S0.5, due to E.J. Lemmon (1957). This is a non-normal system whose semantics, initially provided by Cresswell 1966, includes non-normal worlds at which formulas that begin with a modalizer are assigned arbitrary, non-fixed truth values. This means that the valuation function v treats modal formulas as atomic (interprtetations for S2 or S3 are special cases of interpretations for S0.5: those cases in which the valuation function uniformly treats the boxed formulas as false, etc., at non-normal worlds). The idea of considering impossible worlds as worlds at which complex formulas are treated as atomic is a fruitful one, as we will soon see.

Kripke introduced non-normal worlds as a technical device, embedded in a purely set-theoretic structure in order to treat C.I. Lewis' non-normal modal logics; the question of the interpretation of such structures (particularly, of the ontological status of impossible worlds), then, makes perfect sense — and the answer is not straightforward, as we will see in Section 3.

2.2 Nonadjunctive and Nonprime Impossible Worlds

In 1980, Nicholas Rescher and Robert Brandom published The Logic of Inconsistency. A Study in Non-Standard Possible-Worlds Semantics and Ontology, and moved the theory of impossible worlds to the next stage. Rescher and Brandom introduced a modal semantics including, besides ordinary possible worlds (taken as maximally consistent collections of states of affairs), also non-standard worlds that are locally inconsistent (that is, such that, for some A, both A and ¬A hold at them), and incomplete (that is, such that for some A, neither A nor ¬A hold at them). These non-standard worlds are obtained combinatorially, starting from classically possible worlds: they are produced via two recursive operations having standard worlds as their base, and called schematization and superposition. Let us symbolize them, respectively, as ∩ and ∪. Given two worlds w1 and w2, a schematic world w1w2 is a world at which all and only the states of affairs obtain, which obtain both at w1 and at w2. Dually, a “superposed” or inconsistent world w1w2 is a world at which all and only the states of affairs obtain, which obtain at w1 or at w2. With respect to the definitions of impossible world listed in the introduction to this entry, Rescher and Brandom's inconsistent-superposed worlds are, therefore, impossible worlds of the fourth kind, making both A and its negation true, for some A (just superpose, for instance, a possible world, w1, at which I am 1.70m tall, and another possible world, w2, at which I am 1.90m tall).

A notable feature of these impossible worlds is that the assignment of truth values at them is not compositional with respect to conjunction. The right-to-left direction of the standard, homophonic semantic clause for conjunction:

(S∧) vw(AB) = 1 if and only if vw(A) = 1 and vw(B) = 1

has to go, if w is an impossible world. Whereas Kripke's non-standard worlds required different truth conditions only for the modal operators, Rescher and Brandom's inconsistent worlds behave peculiarly with respect to conjunction. They are, in particular, nonadjunctive: the principle often called Adjunction, according to which when two formulas hold their conjunction also holds, fails at them (Rescher and Brandom's worlds can also be, dually, nonprime, which means that a disjunction may hold at them although both disjuncts fail to). As a consequence of this, they realize distributive contradictions, making both A and ¬A sometimes true; but from this the corresponding conjunctive or collective contradiction, A ∧ ¬A, doesn't follow. These impossible worlds still have a certain amount of logical structure: they behave in quite a standard fashion with respect to essentially single-premise inferences (they are actually closed under any classically valid single-premise inference); but they are anarchic and not closed under essentially multiple-premise inferences.

Rescher and Brandom's approach falls in the nonadjunctive tradition (see Berto 2007, Chapter 6) of paraconsistent logics: a tradition started by Jaskowksi's discussive logic D2 (also labeled as J in the literature), and based on the idea of rejecting or limiting the Adjunction principle. Such an approach has been revived in works by Hyde 1997, and Varzi 1997 and 2004. As we will see in Section 5, it has interesting applications.

2.3 Impossible Worlds in Epistemic Logic

With Rescher and Brandom's work, worlds at which some logical principle involving some extensional connective fails have entered the scene. How about worlds at which all connectives behave anarchically? This is what happens with the so-called Rantala frames, introduced by Rantala 1982a, in order to address fundamental issues concerning knowledge and belief.

Notoriously, the attempts at modeling such intentional states within epistemic logic, as modal operators whose semantics is given in terms of possible worlds, stumble upon a cluster of problems, gathered under the label of “logical omniscience”. When modeled within standard Kripke possible worlds frames, knowledge (or belief) turns out to be closed under logical consequence, that is, the following principle holds (with K the relevant epistemic operator expressing belief, or knowledge):

(Closure) If KA, and AB, then KB

One knows (believes) all the logical consequences of the things one knows (believes). As a special case, all valid formulas turn out to be known (believed):

(Validity) If ⊨A, then ⊨KA,

And beliefs form a consistent set, that is, it cannot be the case that both a formula and its negation are believed:

(Consistency) ⊨¬(KAK¬A).

Taken together, these principles deliver a highly idealized notion of knowledge (belief), not mirroring the actual status of human, that is, finite and fallible, epistemic agents. We all experience having (perhaps covert) inconsistent beliefs (although, of course, Consistency is a requirement for knowledge, unless there are true contradictions). Even though Excluded Middle, A ∨ ¬A, is (let us assume) logically valid, the intutionists do not believe it. We know such basic arithmetic truths as Peano's postulates; and Peano's postulates may entail (let us assume) Goldbach's conjecture; but we don't know whether Goldbach's conjecture is true.

In order to address these issues, Rantala proposed to consider modal frames involving non-standard worlds which, despite being logically impossible, can be seen as viable epistemic alternatives by imperfect cognitive agents (an idea partly anticipated in Cresswell 1973, Hintikka 1975).

A Rantala interpretation is a structure ⟨W, N, R, v⟩, where W is our usual set of worlds; N is the subset of normal, possible worlds; WN is the set of impossible worlds; R is the accessibility relation, which can in these contexts be regarded as a kind of belief- or cognitive accessibility: The worlds accessible from a given world w are now worlds compatible with what the relevant cognitive agent believes at w, or with the evidence it has there. The evaluation function v assigns truth values in quite a standard way at possible worlds: atomic formulas are directly assigned 1 or 0, and compound formulas are evaluated recursively. In particular, the modal operators get their standard interpretation. However, at impossible worlds in WN, all formulas are assigned a truth value by v directly, not recursively: compound formulas of the form ¬A, AB, etc., are treated as atomic, and behave arbitrarily: AB may turn out to be true even though both A and B are false (impossible worlds may be nonprime), and ¬A may turn out to be true when A is (impossible worlds may be inconsistent). In particular, A ∧ ¬A may be assigned 1 by v at some impossible world. Next, logical consequence and validity are defined, again, with respect to possible worlds. Worlds in WN are completely anarchic and not closed under any non-trivial consequence relation. By allowing such worlds to be accessible via R in the evaluation of formulas including intentional-epistemic operators such as K, one can destroy their unwelcome closure features, thereby dispensing with Closure, Validity, and Consistency. As for Consistency, for instance, it is sufficient to access via R an impossible world where both A and ¬A are true.

Initially proposed in a propositional logic setting, this approach has been generalized to quantified modal logics by Rantala himself (see Rantala 1982b), and developed into a unified framework for epistemic logics in interesting works by Heinrich Wansing 1989, 1990. Wansing has shown that various logics for knowledge and belief developed in Artificial Intelligence can find equivalent models in structures including impossible worlds. Further equivalence results in this area have been obtained in Sillari 2008, where it is shown that impossible worlds structures using binary epistemic accessibility relations are equivalent to structures using Montague-Scott neighborhood semantics.

2.4 Impossible Worlds in Relevant Logic

At the core of the research project of relevance logic (or relevant logic) is the idea of capturing a notion of conditionality that doesn't fall afoul of the so-called fallacies of relevance, or paradoxes of the material and strict conditional. These are conditionals that turn out to be logically true in classical and modal logic, just because the antecedent is a (necessary) falsity, and without any real connection between antecedent and consequent. Famous among them is ex contradictione quodlibet, also called the Law of Explosion: A ∧ ¬AB (contradictions are “explosive” in that a conditional with a contradiction as its antecedent, and arbitrary consequent, is logically true). Other irrelevant conditionals are those that turn out to be logical truths just because the consequent is necessary (verum ex quolibet), such as AB ∨ ¬B, or A → (BB).

Intuitively, a good way to provide counterexamples to these irrelevant conditionals is by resorting to impossible worlds again. An impossible world of the fourth kind, at which some contradiction is true but not everything is, provides a counterexample to ex falso quodlibet. Various systems of relevant logic have been supplied with interesting worlds semantics including impossible worlds, besides the possible ones.

Let us resort again to some set-theoretic machinery. A Routley-Meyer interpretation (the name comes from the relevant logicians Richard Routley, later Sylvan, and Robert Meyer: see Routley & Routley 1972; Routley & Meyer 1973, 1976; Routley 1979) for relevant (propositional) logics is a quintuple ⟨W, N, R, *, v⟩, where W is a set of worlds; N is a proper subset of W including the normal or possible worlds, and WN is the set of non-normal or impossible worlds; R is a ternary accessibility relation defined on W, and * (the so-called Routley star) is a monadic operation defined on W — a function from worlds to worlds, sometimes called involution. * and R figure prominently in the truth conditions for negation and the (relevant) conditional. Their task is precisely to provide a semantics for negation that allows for the truth of A and ¬A at some worlds, and a semantics for the conditional that frees it from the aforementioned fallacies of relevance.

2.4.1 Relevant Conditional

Let us begin with the conditional. In order to get rid of such entailments as A → (BB), we need some world at which A holds but BB fails. One way to achieve this may be to admit “partial” or incomplete situations of the kind studied in situation semantics, at which A holds but BB fails to hold, just because they carry no information about B. Another, more radical way is precisely via impossible worlds: an understanding of such worlds, as we have seen, is as scenarios where logical laws may fail, and the Law of (propositional) Identity, stating that any formula entails itself, is one of them. At possible worlds, we still require for the truth of conditionals AB that at every accessible world where A holds, B holds, too. Consequently, A → (BB) is not logically valid. Technically, when w is an impossible world, we state the truth conditions for the conditional, by means of the ternary R, as follows:

(S→) vw(AB) = 1 if and only if, for all worlds w1 and w2W, such that Rww1w2, if vw1(A) = 1, then vw2(B) = 1.

The key difference between (S→) and the standard modal clause for the strict conditional (which is true at a world if and only if, at all accessible worlds where the antecedent is true, the consequent is true), is that the worlds of the antecedent and the consequent have been “split”. Specifically, BB fails at w, when this is an impossible world such that for some worlds (which may be possible or not) w1 and w2, such that Rww1 w2, B holds at the former and fails at the latter. (S→) may also be used to provide the truth conditions for the conditional uniformly at all worlds, if we add the further assumption (usually called the Normality Condition) that, when w is possible, then the accessible worlds w1 and w2 are one and the same:

(NC) If wN, then Rww1w2 only if w1 = w2.

It is difficult to provide an intuitive reading for the ternary relation R (this is probably the single most important issue in the philosophical interpretation of relevant semantics: see again the entry on relevance logic for discussion). One may claim that the truth of an entailment AB at a world w depends on its “seeing an accessibility” (Bremer 2005: 67) between two other worlds w1 and w2, such that if A is true at the former, B is true at the latter. Via the ternary relation R, one can build models for different relevant logics: starting with the basic relevant system B, one obtains models for stronger logics such as R, the system of relevant implication, by adding formal algebraic conditions on R — in a way analogue to how, in standard modal logic, we move on from the basic normal system K to, T, S4, S5, by adding formal constraints to the standard binary accessibility relation of Kripke frames. The constraints to be added to the ternary R, in fact, are more complex than those of standard modal logic, and some involve also the star operator *, to which we now turn.

2.4.2 The Routley Star

Given a world w, the involution operation produces a world w* which is, in a sense to be specified, its “reverse twin”. Let us begin with the truth conditions for negation within the Routley-Meyer semantics:

(S¬) vwA) = 1 if and only if vw*(A) = 0,

that is, ¬A is true at a world w if and only if A is false, not at w itself (as it happens with standard negation), but at its twin w*. This relevant negation is therefore an intensional operator: in order to evaluate negated formulas at w, one has to refer at the goings on of a world that may be distinct from w (it need not be distinct, as we will see soon).

By adding appropriate algebraic constraints to the semantics, one can validate various theorems of relevant logics, and provide the negation at issue with many intuitive inferential features. For instance, by assuming that involution is an operation of period two, that is, w** = w, one can validate the classical Law of Double Negation. The operator so characterized is often called De Morgan negation, for also De Morgan's Laws hold for it. But it does not validate the Law of Explosion. To provide the required counterexample, just consider a model in which A holds at w, B doesn't hold at w, and A doesn't hold at w*. Then, both A and ¬A hold at w, whereas B doesn't: w is an inconsistent but non-trivial world.

But what is the intuitive connection between w and w*? The idea is that the twins are “mirror images one of the other reversing ‘in’ and ‘out’” (Dunn 1986: 191). The reverse twin of a world w which is A-inconsistent (that is, at which both A and ¬A hold) is a world, w*, which is A-incomplete (that is, at which neither A nor ¬A hold), and vice versa: involution takes local inconsistency into local incompleteness, and vice versa.

For some world w, it may also be the case that w = w*: the twins are in fact one. Then w just is a maximal and consistent world. At such a world, then, negation behaves completely classically: ¬A is true at it if and only if A is false at it.

3. The Metaphysics of Impossible Worlds

From what we have seen so far, impossible worlds have an interesting, albeit short, history, having been introduced and developed by numerous authors. The supporters of impossible worlds, however, disagree on their metaphysical nature, just like supporters of possible worlds do. If one accepts ontological commitment to such worlds, we claimed above, then one faces the follow-up question: what kind of entities are they?

Famously, among so-called modal realists, that is, philosophers who accept possible worlds in their ontology, the two main options are David Lewis' so-called extreme or genuine modal realism, and ersatzism (or actualism, or abstractionism) in its various forms. It is a common thought among impossible worlds theorists that impossible worlds should just inherit the ontological status of their possible mates: whatever your favorite metaphysics of possible worlds is, impossible worlds are of the same kind. This has been called the Parity Thesis (see Rescher & Brandom 1980). As Graham Priest puts it:

As far as I can see, any of the main theories concerning the nature of possible worlds can be applied equally to impossible worlds: they are existent nonactual entities; they are nonexistent objects; they are constructions out of properties and other universals; they are just certain sets of sentences. … There is, as far as I can see, absolutely no cogent (in particular, non-question-begging) reason to suppose that there is an ontological difference between merely possible and impossible worlds. (Priest 1997b: 580–1)

Yagisawa's extended modal realism proposes a Lewisian realist account of impossible worlds and impossibilia, that is, of the objects exemplifying absolute impossibilities which may inhabit such worlds: impossible worlds, just like Lewis' possible worlds, are concrete mereological sums of individuals, causally and spatiotemporally isolated from each other (see Yagisawa 1988). Yagisawa exploits the “argument from ways” we met above: if quantification on ways the world might be or have been commits us to possible worlds, then, by parity of reasoning, quantification on ways the world might not be commits us to impossible worlds. The argument is backed by Yagisawa's considerations on the additional logical and philosophical applications allowed by impossible worlds, which are not available, in his view, to traditional Lewisian modal realism. Extended modal realism is quite a strong position: concrete impossible worlds represent absolute and logical impossibilities directly, by instantiating them. So impossibilities and, in particular, logical inconsistencies, are “out there” in reality. This depends on the fact that, for a Lewisian modal realist (though not for an ersatzist), the inference from “At world w, A and not A” to “At world w, A, and it is not the case that, at world w, A” is legitimate (this is a point we shall return to in Section 6).

In his 2010 book, Yagisawa is more distant from Lewisian modal realism. He still admits impossible worlds and impossibilia, and he rejects ersatz accounts of them. However, he now takes worlds as points in modal space, individuated via modal axes. Worlds are modal indices for truth, just like times are temporal indices for it; and modal matters are treated in a way similar to how four-dimensionalist philosophers, who believe in temporal parts, treat temporal matters. According to four-dimensionalists, material objects are like temporal worms extended across time: an object has a property at time t by having a temporal stage at time t which has that property. Analogously, for Yagisawa an object has a modal property, a property at world w, by having a modal stage at world w which has that property.

More moderate (Yagisawa may say: too moderate) realists treat impossible worlds as ersatz constructions, abstract entities on a par with ersatz possible worlds (see e.g. Mares 1997, Vander Laan 1997). This option embeds various sub-options, for modal ersatzism comes in various shapes (Divers 2002, Part III, is by far the best account and critical evaluation in the literature). If one takes possible worlds as maximally consistent sets of propositions (as per Adams 1974), impossible worlds could be sets of propositions that are locally inconsistent and/or incomplete. Similarly, Plantingan ersatzism (worlds are particular states of affairs) or Stalnakerian ersatzism (worlds are world-natures or maximal properties) could be easily extended to impossible worlds. All hands agree that such worlds come at no great ontological or theoretical cost, once one has accepted ersatz possible worlds. After all, ersatz worlds are abstract: they account for impossibilities, not by instantiating them as Lewisian worlds do, but by representing them in some way or other. A sophisticated ersatz account of impossible worlds is Jago 2012, where possible and impossible worlds are constructions out of facts. Jago employs for this purpose also negative facts, such as Barack Obama's not being French, or there being no elephant in in the Oval Office. Negative facts have had bad press in analytic ontology (see the entry on facts), but Jago mounts a full-scale defence.

The extension of ersatzism from possible to impossible worlds appears to be particularly straightforward for linguistic ersatzism: in this approach, possible worlds are world-books, maximal-complete stories, that is, sets of sentences of a “worldmaking” language (Carnap's state-descriptions, Jeffrey's complete consistent novels, etc.); and it is easy to admit impossible worlds of the same kind, that is, world-books which are locally inconsistent or incomplete, which fail to comply with some logical law or to be closed under some notion or other of logical consequence.

However, there may be reasons to reject the Parity Thesis. If Lewis' criticisms of ersatzism in On the Plurality of Worlds are right, then each ersatz account of impossible worlds inherits the limits of ersatz theories of possible worlds: each of these theories has to resort to intensional entities taken as primitive (such as propositions or states of affairs) in its explanation of what ersatz worlds are, or to primitive modal notions (most often, to both). Suppose that, instead, one wants to retain the advantages of both worlds (no pun intended), ersatz and genuine, when it comes to impossibilities. Suppose, that is, that (a) one wants to employ a modal framework including both possible and impossible worlds to retain the theoretical benefits provided by the latter; (b) one wants to stick to Lewis' project of a reductive account of intensional and modal notions to fully extensional ones (contra ersatzism); but also, (c) one wants to avoid the unwelcome consequences of concrete impossible worlds instantiating impossibilities, such as having true contradictions “out there” in reality (contra Yagisawa's extended modal realism). One could then try the following hybrid solution: (1) go realist about possible worlds, and (2) exploit the set-theoretic machinery of modal realism to represent different impossible worlds as distinct ersatz, abstract constructions.

To fulfil these desiderata, Berto 2010 sketches an intermediate account, labeled as Hybrid Modal Realism (HMR), which dispenses with the Parity Thesis. The account follows suggestions from Divers 2002, Chapter 5, and is similar to a strategy pursued in Kiourti 2010, Chapter 3. In this view, genuine, concrete possible worlds are the basic stuff. Basic, atomic propositions are taken as sets of possible worlds. And distinct impossible situations can be represented by distinct world-books or world-stories, taken as sets constructed out of atomic propositions. If books-stories are sets of atomic propositions, then they are sets of sets of genuine possible worlds. So we can have distinct inconsistent world-books, taken as sets of mutually inconsistent propositions, representing intuitively distinct impossibilities.

For instance, take two distinct contradictions, A ∧ ¬A and B ∧ ¬B, where A and B express ordinary, contingent propositions. Now consider a simplified model M = {w1, w2, w3, w4, w5} as the set of genuine, concrete possible worlds. Say that the proposition that A = {w1, w2}, so the proposition that ¬A = {w3, w4, w5}, i.e., the set-theoretic complement of the proposition that A in M. Say that the proposition that B = {w2, w3, w4}, so the proposition that ¬B = {w1, w5}. Now the impossible proposition that A ∧ ¬A just is the inconsistent set {{w1, w2}, {w3, w4, w5}}, whereas the impossible proposition that B ∧ ¬B just is the inconsistent set {{w2, w3, w4}, {w1, w5}}; and these are distinct inconsistent sets of sets of worlds (they are sets of mutually disjoint sets of genuine worlds).

As noted by Jago 2012, though, this account in its current form faces various limitations. One is, for instance, that it can only discriminate bwetween absolute impossibilities on the basis of their purely logical propositional structure. It cannot distinguish, e.g., between the proposition that Hesperus is the second planet from the Sun and the proposition that Phosphorus is the second planet from the Sun. However, we may want impossible worlds where exactly one of these fails even though Hesperus is necessarily identical with Phosphorus, for instance, to model the cognitive state of an agent who believes one proposition, but not the other. An account in the same spirit of Berto's, but which may improve on it, is provided by Barak Krakauer (forthcoming). Krakauer constructs impossible worlds as sets of structured propositions. These are themselves built out of ordinary possible worlds and relations, so possible worlds work as the key construction material.

A metaphysical account of impossible worlds, alternative both to ersatzism and to Lewisian realism, has been proposed in Zalta 1997. Zalta's powerful theory of abstract objects is based upon his logic of encoding, whose core idea consists in postulating an ambiguity in the copula of predication: “x is P” can mean that object x exemplifies property P, as per ordinary predication; but it may also mean that x encodes P, encoding being a non-standard mode of predication. An object which encodes a property is determined by it, but without instantiating or exemplifying it. Abstract objects are objects that encode properties, besides exemplifying them; in particular, they can encode properties they do not exemplify (see Zalta 1983). Within this theory, situations are defined as abstract objects that encode states of affairs (taken as 0-ary properties); and impossible worlds are taken as maximal situations that are not possible, that is, such that it is not possible that all the states of affairs encoded by them simultaneously obtain.

Zalta claims that, despite treating worlds as abstract objects, this is not an ersatz conception of worlds. A given state of affairs p's obtaining at world w (no matter whether w is possible or impossible) is analyzed as:

(Z) w encodes the property being-such-that-p,

and so being-such-that-p is ascribed, in the encoding sense, to w. As such, w is (in the encoding sense of the copula, at least) such that p. Thus, according to Zalta's theory of encoding, worlds are in some sense metaphysically characterized or determined by such states of affairs. And according to Zalta nothing of the sort can be claimed of ersatz conceptions of worlds.

All the ontological accounts of impossible worlds presented so far are in a broad sense realist. They all accept that sentences referring to or quantifying over impossible worlds can be literally true, and take the entailed ontological commitment at face value, although they disagree with each other on the metaphysical status of worlds. A deeply anti-realist family of approaches to modal metaphysics has been developed, though: modal fictionalism. The denomination is a bit misleading: the view is not fictionalist, in fact, about modality. It does not consist in the claim that modal notions like possibility or necessity are fictional, not real. Rather, the view is fictionalist or anti-realist about worlds. Its key claim is that talk of and quantification over worlds ought to be understood as literally false: it is only true within a “worlds fiction”, which we make-believe because of its delivering useful results in the explanation of modal notions. Modal fictionalism promises the theoretical benefits of modal realism, but aims to dispense with the ontological costs by treating the relevant ontological theory as a fiction. We should not include worlds (other than the actual) in our ontological catalogue, but talking as if there were worlds is useful. A major proponent of the view, Gideon Rosen 1990, has taken Lewisian modal realism as the relevant fiction. But it is relatively easy to extend such modal fictionalist accounts into fictional treatments of possible and impossible worlds, taking e.g. Yagisawa's extended modal realism as the fiction which we make-believe. There isn't much literature in this area (yet); however, one kind of impossible worlds fictionalism is proposed by JC Beall 2008: according to Beall, an instrumentalist approach to non-normal worlds can be motivated by the idea that these are worlds where “logical fictions”, that is, envisaged logically impossible situations, take place.

4. The Structure of Impossible Worlds

Besides the one of their ontological nature, there is another issue theories of impossible worlds disagree on; this concerns impossible worlds specifically, that is, it is a topic on which there is no correlative issue concerning possible worlds. It has to do with the amount of (logical) structure such worlds can have. For it makes sense to claim that impossible worlds display different degrees of anarchic behavior: Kripkean non-normal worlds for non-normal modal logics, for instance, appear to be logically more structured than fully anarchic Rantala worlds. Now, should impossible worlds with any degree of logical structure (or lack thereof) be admitted in our favorite impossible worlds theory, or not? And given that their non-logical behavior comes in degrees, can they be ordered in a meaningful way? This section focuses on these two questions.

4.1 Two Stances on Impossible Worlds

A first reply to the first question may be labeled as the “Australasian stance”: it is (typically) favored by paraconsistent and relevant logicians (see e.g. Restall 1997; Mares 1997; Goble 2006), and emphasized in Priest 2001 and 2005. In the Australasian approach, worlds are constituents of interpretations of some paraconsistent logic or other, which imposes on them some logical structure: they are closed under a paraconsistent consequence relation, which is weaker than classical consequence relation. In this view, at the (admissible) impossible worlds only intensional operators, such as a strict or relevant conditional and the box and diamond, behave in a non-standard fashion. The truth conditions for conjunction, disjunction, or the quantifiers, should remain the same as in possible worlds. As Priest puts it:

There are no [non-normal] worlds at which AB is true, but A is not, or at which ¬¬A is true, but A is not. But it is conditionals that express the laws of logic, not conjunctions or negations. That is why it is their behaviour (and only theirs) that changes at non-normal worlds. (Priest 2001: 172)

There is an alternative reply to the question on the structure of impossible worlds, which may be labeled as the “American stance”, for it reflects the opinion of north-American impossible worlds theorists, such as Vander Laan 1997, and Zalta 1997. The American stance focuses on the definition of impossible worlds as ways things could not be, and adopts what we may call an “unrestricted comprehension principle” for worlds; this might be roughly expressed by the slogan: For any way the world could not be, there is some impossible world which is like that. How to make this slogan more precise is not a trivial business; for instance, one may claim that, given any two sets of formulas S and T, there's a world at which everything in S holds and nothing in T does. Of course, this delivers particularly anarchic worlds, not closed under any notion of logical consequence, and not structured as the interpretations of any (however weak) logic.

As Nolan 1997 has emphasized, there are reasons to hold this view. If any principle whatsoever can fail at some impossible world or other, weakening logical consequence to make room for such worlds, and to provide a logic that holds in every situation, possible or not, will be pointless. One should, thus, simply avoid altering the logic too much, and one can even stick to a classical notion of logical consequence. Also, those who make room only for some impossibilities would have to provide a principled distinction between impossibilities that obtain at some impossible world, and impossibilities that obtain at no worlds at all. This looks like an uncomfortable halfway position. This does not mean that principled distinctions cannot be given. For instance, the one advanced by Priest above, and based on the idea of leaving extensional operators that do not “express laws of logic” alone, may meet someone's intuitions. However, for specific purposes (e.g., to model the cognitive states of fallible epistemic agents, as in Rantala frames), we may be interested in even more anarchic worlds, and there seems to be no a priori reason to put a ban on them.

4.2 The Closeness of Impossible Worlds

If impossible worlds display different degrees of logical structure (or lack thereof), it may make sense to order them. A natural way to do it is via an extension of the traditional “closeness” relations between possible worlds. How to spell out the ordering in detail, though, is far from straightforward. Within standard conditional logics, and in the treatment of counterfactual conditionals in terms of possible worlds due to Robert Stalnaker 1968 and David Lewis 1973, worlds stand in similarity relations; and similarity comes in degrees. This is usually represented by having each possible world, w, come with a system of “spheres”. If W is the set of all worlds, let $ be a function from worlds to sets of subsets of W, so that $(w) = {S1, S2, … , Sn}, with S1S2 ⊆ … ⊆ Sn = W. Worlds within a given sphere Si, 1 ≤ in, are more similar to w than worlds outside it.

If we take the special case in which w = the actual world (call it “@”), we get a natural arrangement of possible worlds in a system of spheres that mirrors their degree of (dis)similarity with respect to @, according to the different kinds of possibilities and (relative) impossibilities they represent. For instance, a world which is exactly like @, except that I wear a white t-shirt instead of the black one I'm actually wearing while writing these lines, is, intuitively, closer to @ than a world at which the laws of physics are turned upside down. Some people have a general, intuitive depiction of such closeness relations, and set out a hierarchy of modalities accordingly: possible worlds where the laws of physics are different from ours are naturally seen as more eccentric than worlds where only biological, but not physical, laws are different; and these are more eccentric than possible worlds with minimal factual changes with respect to @, such as the white t-shirt world.

Can such a natural view be extended to impossible worlds? First, it is intuitive to claim that some impossible worlds are more similar to the actual world @ than others. For instance, the “explosion” world (call it e) at which everything is the case, that is, at which every sentence is true, seems to be as far from @ as one can imagine — provided one can actually imagine or conceive such an extremely absurd situation. Now, pick the impossible world, t, at which everything is as in @, except that I wear an impossible t-shirt which is white all over and black all over. Intuitively, t is closer to @ than e.

Next, some authors (e.g. Mares 1997) favor what Nolan 1997 has dubbed a Strangeness of Impossibility Condition (SIC): any possible world, however weird, should be closer to @ than any impossible world. Prima facie, this appears to be intuitive: Hell will freeze over (that is, reality will be turned upside down) before logical laws or mathematical truths abandon us. If this is so, a system of spheres for impossible worlds centered on @ will just extend the intuitive possible worlds spheres described above, by adding further, larger spheres where worlds outside (logical, or more generally unrestricted) possibility stand. But how are these latter to be internally ordered?

One very general option, that could be seen as a way of reconciling the Australasian and American stances above, is the following. Even though we subscribe to an unrestricted comprehension principle for impossible worlds, we may admit that worlds where only the intensional operators behave in a non-standard fashion are less deviant and anarchic than worlds where also the extensional operators do. Let us call worlds of the former kind intensionally impossible, and worlds of the latter kind, extensionally impossible. This picture (inspired by Priest 2005, Chapter 1) has some intuitive force to recommend it: for instance, Kripkean non-normal worlds where Necessitation fails are intuitively less deviant than Rantala worlds where all formulas may behave arbitrarily. Generalizing, such a view would entail arranging the respective spheres in such a way that any intensionally impossible world is closer to @ than any extensionally impossible one.

This very general ordering of impossibilities, albeit intuitive, may not be fully satisfying. Firstly, it is not clear where one should place such items as the Rescher-Brandom non-adjunctive worlds: for these worlds, despite being deviant with respect to conjunction and anarchic when it's about multi-premise logical consequence, still are closed with respect to any (classically valid) single-premise inference.

Secondly, there is a more general qualm concerning the SIC principle itself. For one may claim that, intuitively, some slightly deviant impossible worlds may be more similar to the actual world @ than some possible but very weird worlds. For instance, the impossible world t above, which is like @ except for my wearing an inconsistent T-shirt, looks more familiar than a world which is logically possible, but where the laws of physics are turned upside down.

Although we cannot pursue this topic further within the limits of this entry, the discussion developed so far should show that the issue of the structure, closeness and ordering of impossible worlds is quite open.

5. Applications of Impossible Worlds

This Section briefly describes various applications of impossible worlds, which collectively provide the main motivation for introducing them. We have already had a look at some applications in our exposition of various impossible worlds theories. Modeling intentional states is a prominent one. As we have seen when introducing the Rantala frames, intentional states such as belief can be inconsistent — at least, covertly so — and not closed under (ordinary) logical consequence, so impossible worlds come as a natural candidate to model such states. The content of a certain epistemic or intentional state can be analyzed as the set of worlds where things stand as they are believed, conceived, or represented as being; and this may include impossible worlds of various kinds.

One approach of this kind is due to Levesque 1984. He employs impossible worlds of the kind used in paraconsistent relevant logics, which can be locally inconsistent but well-behaved with respect to conjunction and disjunction, that is, they are adjunctive and prime. Laws of classical logic fail at them, and by accessing them a cognitive agent can have inconsistent beliefs. However, we still have a weakened form of logical omniscience: the beliefs of an agent are closed under the weaker paraconsistent-relevant logic at issue.

As we have seen above, the Rantala frames approach is in a sense more radical: by allowing anarchic impossible worlds of any kind to be accessible, it destroys all forms of logical closure for the relevant cognitive states. Perhaps the most original and comprehensive approach to intentional and epistemic states, which uses impossible worlds of the Rantala kind, has been developed in a series of papers by Jago 2006, 2007, 2009. Jago allows epistemic states to access worlds not closed under any non-trivial notion of consequence. However, he devises a method to build an epistemic space that discriminates between obvious and subtle impossibilities. The key idea is that a limited and fallible, but rationally committed cognitive agent is supposed to be able to rule out blatantly impossible scenarios, such as worlds where 1 + 1 = 3 or where Hesperus is not self-identical, even when it is unable to rule out subtle impossibilities, for instance, Fermat's Last Theorem's being false. Jago constructs an epistemic accessibility relation between worlds which is structured by rules of deduction: a world is ruled out as incompatible with the agent's cognitive state when it makes true an impossibility that the agent can recognize as such by applying a limited amount of logical reasoning. Some absolute impossibilities, though, may be too difficult to be detected, because their negation follows from basic principles of logic or mathematics only via long and complex chains of deduction, which may go beyond the agent's cognitive capabilities. The approach has already found its critics (e.g. Bjerring 2013), but looks quite promising. A strategy similar to Jago's is adopted in Berto 2014, where intentional operators are also interpreted as quantifiers on possible and impossible worlds. In this case, though, they work in a way similar to ceteris paribus conditionals: the ruling out of blatantly impossible worlds is not obtained by the application of logical rules of inference, but by judgments of closeness and similarity between worlds. Finally, another application of impossible worlds in the field of epistemic logics has been proposed by JC Beall 2009: this is a worlds semantics including impossible worlds of the Rantala kind, retaining much of Fitch's knowability paradox reasoning but dispensing with distribution of K over conjunctions.

Independently from psychological states, but in close connection with the issue of inconsistent information, one could be interested in using impossible worlds to model inconsistent databases (see Barwise 1997). These may consist, for instance, in sets of data supplied by different sources which are inconsistent with each other, such as incompatible evidence presented by different witnesses in a trial. In this case, impossible worlds of the non-adjunctive kind are particularly useful. Intuitively, whereas one is allowed to draw the logical consequences of the data fed in by a single source, one should not conjoin data from distinct sources which could be inconsistent with each other. The data base is “compartimentalized”, so to speak: occasional inconsistencies are placed in separate sectors, and not conjunctively asserted (See e.g., Hyde 1997, Brown & Priest 2004).

Inconsistent information is at issue also in certain works of fiction. Lewis' classic 1978 paper proposed an analysis of the expression “true in such-and-such fiction” in terms of possible worlds: what holds in a certain fictional work is what holds at a set of possible worlds, properly selected via a series of (quite subtle and complex) clauses. But fiction can be occasionally inconsistent. Sometimes, this happens unintentionally: Conan Doyle's The Sign of the Four describes Watson as limping because of a war wound at his leg. In A Study in Scarlet, however, Watson has no wound at his leg (for it is located in his shoulder), and he doesn't limp. One may claim that the set of (selected) worlds that make such stories true just has to be split into disjoint subsets, making true consistent fragments of the fiction. However, sometimes the author's say-so cannot be appropriately overridden by a semantic treatment that explains away the contradiction via a fragmentation strategy: for inconsistencies in fiction may also be intentional (as stressed by Proudfoot 2006). Suppose we write a novel, and in its first chapter we have the Mad Mathematician produce a round square. If the intentional inconsistency is excised, the fact that mathematicians all over the world are amazed by this result in the second chapter becomes unexplainable. A natural treatment of these cases, then, is obtained by admitting (again, appropriately selected) impossible worlds in the set of situations that realize what is told in the story (see e.g. Priest 1997b; Woods 2003, Chapter 6; Berto 2012, Chapters 7 and 8).

Closely connected to belief is the notion of propositional content. Within possible worlds semantics, propositions can be defined as functions from worlds to truth values, or as sets of worlds: a proposition is the set of worlds at which it is true. Such an account has a notorious “granularity problem” (Barwise 1997) with impossible propositions: intuitively distinct impossible propositions (that swans are blue and it is not the case that swans are blue, that Fermat's Last Theorem is false, that Charles is a married bachelor) hold at the same possible worlds: none — and, of course, we have a dual problem with (unrestrictedly) necessary propositions, that are all identified as the total set of worlds. Treating propositions as set-theoretic constructions out of possible worlds leads to a very coarse individuation of propositions, and because of this it has been subject to seemingly devastating attacks, for instance, by Scott Soames 1987. However, impossible worlds allow for fine-grained distinctions unavailable in standard possible worlds semantics. That the proposition expressed by A is impossible does not mean that it is an empty set of worlds, but rather that it includes only impossible worlds. And we can have an impossible world, w1, with inconsistent swans; a distinct impossible world, w2, at which Fermat's Last Theorem is false; and a still distinct impossible world, w3, at which bachelors are married but swans and Diophantine equations behave wisely.

One other application of impossible worlds worth mentioning concerns perceptual impossibilities which, despite being unrealizable at the actual world, may well be epistemic situations one can be involved in — for instance, when viewing an impossible object, such as an Escher drawing or a Penrose triangle. These are impossible, yet determined figures, and splitting them into smaller consistent parts would make us lose the essential feature of the whole, that is, precisely its being perceived as impossible. This issue is explored in Mortensen 1997.

5.1 Counterpossible Reasoning

Perhaps the most important application of impossible worlds has to do with counterpossible reasoning, understood as counterfactual reasoning from impossible antecedents. This kind of reasoning, in fact, is often indicated as providing independent motivation for believing in impossible worlds, as we have seen in the first Section. In the aforementioned Lewis-Stalnaker theories of counterfactuals, a conditional of the form “If it were the case that A, then it would be the case that B” is true if and only if, at the closest world - or worlds, depending on the specific account - at which A is true, B is true (this is, in fact, a simplification with respect to the truth conditions provided in the full-fledged semantics of Lewis 1973). While the standard conditional logics based on this idea have been quite successful in the treatment of counterfactuals, the approach entails that any counterfactual whose antecedent is impossible, that is, true at no possible world, is vacuously true: there being no worlds at which A is true, any closest A-world is trivially a B-world.

This is unsatisfying in many respects, for, as should be clear at this point, we often need to nontrivially reason about theories which (perhaps unbeknownst to us) cannot possibly be correct, that is, to reason from antecedents that may turn out to be not only false, but necessarily so. Three contexts in which theories of this kind show up quite often, mentioned in the first Section of this entry, are discourses on (1) alternative logics, (2) mathematical conjectures, and (3) metaphysical views. We will now say a few words on each of them.

(1) A famous Quinean motto has it that “to change the logic is to change the subject”: apparently disagreeing logical parties are actually speaking of different things. So when intuitionists deny that the Law of Excluded Middle holds in non-finitary contexts, they are actually taking truth as provability; and when paraconsistentists claim that some formula can be true (in some weird circumstances) together with its negation, they are not talking of negation anymore (see e.g. Berto 2008).

But this makes nonsense out of too many disputes between intuitionists, classical logicians, paraconsistentists, quantum logicians, etc. It is more fruitful to assume that each party generally understands the rival logics as intelligible, albeit necessarily false, theories. Even if classical logic actually is the One True Logic, one can reason counterpossibly on what would be the case if a certain non-classical logic were the correct one (e.g., “If intuitionistic logic were correct, then the Law of Excluded Middle would fail” is true and “If intuitionistic logic were correct, then the Law of Explosion would fail” is false). One can take into account situations at which the Law of Excluded Middle fails, and argue on what would and would not happen in them. These situations are, by classical standards, just impossible worlds (of the third kind).

(2) Similar claims can be made for mathematical conjectures, if we assume, as some do, that mathematical necessity is unrestricted, that is, coextensive with logical necessity. Different set theorists have different views on controversial subjects such as non-well-founded sets, the Continuum Hypothesis, the Axiom of Choice, the set/(proper-)class distinction, etc. If one embraces the Platonic view (subscribed to, at least implicitly, by many set theorists) that there is One True Universe of sets, then at most one of the alternative set theories can be correct: the others are wrong, and necessarily so. But people can work under the hypothesis that a necessarily false basic mathematical principle holds, and reason coherently from this:

It is doubtless true that nothing sensible can be said about how things would be different if there were no number 17; that is largely because the antecedent of this counterfactual gives us no hints as to what alternative mathematics is to be regarded as true in the counterfactual situation in question. If one changes the example to “Nothing sensible can be said about how things would be different if the axiom of choice were false”, it seems wrong … : if the axiom of choice were false, the cardinals wouldn't be linearly ordered, the Banach-Tarski theorem would fail and so forth. (Field 1989: 237–8)

Whereas Field takes this as an argument to the effect that mathematical necessity is not coextensive with logical necessity, one could turn the tables around: mathematical necessity is unrestricted, so false mathematical theories are just impossible theories.

(3) The third area in which counterpossible reasoning comes into play are metaphysical disputes. Much metaphysical talk is made with our quantifiers “wide open”, that is, aiming at stating truths on all that there was, is, or could possibly be. This is evident in modal ontology, when people advance a theory on the totality of worlds and on their nature. But other metaphysical debates easily come to mind. If a philosopher is to evaluate metaphysical theories which she considers wrong (say, in order to draw unpalatable consequences by way of criticism), such as Spinoza's monism or Hegel's metaphysics of the Absolute, then she must envisage situations where such metaphysics are correct, and wonder what would be the case at them: situations at which there is only one substance, or at which the Absolute Geist necessarily shapes the teleological development of history; and these situations will be, under the hypotheses we have made, impossible worlds.

Semantic structures for counterfactual conditionals involving impossible worlds were first introduced by Routley 1989, and have been proposed e.g. by Read 1995, Mares & Fuhrmann 1995, Mares 1997, Nolan 1997, Brogaard & Salerno 2013, Bjerring (forthcoming). Most of these are natural extensions of Lewis' 1973 semantics for counterfactuals, and capture several intuitions on counterfactual conditionals with impossible antecedents and counterpossible reasoning. The main task for such theories consists in accounting for the concepts of closeness and qualitative similarity between worlds once impossible worlds enter the stage. As we have hinted at above, how to fine-tune these notions is not a trivial matter (for an extensive discussion, see Vander Laan 2004).

As noted by Williamson 2007, Chapter 5, and Brogaard & Salerno 2013, non-trivial treatments of counterpossibles in terms of similarity require the failure of several logical inferences holding in the standard Lewis-Stalnaker approach to counterfactuals. An important one is the entailment from a strict conditional, “If A then-strictly B”, to the corresponding counterfactual, “If it were the case that A then it would be the case that B”. Normally, the former entails the latter. A strict conditional is true when all the (accessible) possible worlds where the antecedent is true also make the consequent true. Then if all the possible A-worlds (worlds where A is true) are B-worlds (worlds where B is true), then in particular all the closest possible A-worlds are B-worlds. But in a non-trivial account of counterfactuals with impossible antecedents, which admits impossible worlds, we can have closest impossible worlds where A obtains and B fails, making the corresponding counterpossible false even though the strict conditional is true. However, the anarchy can be mitigated, e.g., by assuming Nolan's SIC above: if any impossible world must be more far-fetched than any possible world, then it is plausible that the principles governing counterfactual conditionals in the Lewis-Stalnaker treatment will still hold in impossible worlds similarity structures when the relevant antecedent is possible. For then we will consider only closest antecedent-worlds to evaluate the conditional, and these will all be possible worlds: the impossible ones will be too far away.

6. Objections to Impossible Worlds

This last Section discusses some difficulties of impossible worlds theories. An objection to impossible worlds comes from Lewis' On the Plurality of Worlds (it is fair to say that, in fact, Lewis does not explicitly phrase it as an objection: he says that his argument is to the effect that he has no use for impossible worlds; but others have taken it as an objection against impossible worlds tout-court). It is based on the assumption that the expression “at world w” works as a restricting modifier: its main task consists in restricting the quantifiers within its scope to parts of w. If so, then it should distribute through the truth-functional connectives. This means in particular that:

At w: (A ∧ ¬A)


At w: A ∧ ¬(At w: A).

Thus, any inconsistency at some impossible world automatically spills over into an overt inconsistency at the actual world. This is hard to swallow, unless one is a dialetheist, that is, a believer in true contradictions.

Lewis' argument has been criticized e.g. by Kiourti 2010, Chapter 4. Lewis' objection works, at most, only if impossible worlds are taken as Lewisian concreta, as per Yagisawa's extended modal realism. If a way the world might not be is a way some concrete impossible world is, impossibilities are realized by the plain existence of impossibilia instantiating them. As we have seen, this option on the metaphysics of impossible worlds is not mandatory: we may just reject the Parity Thesis, and be realists about possible worlds while providing an ersatz account of the impossible ones; or we might just as well be ersatzists tout-court. Now if impossible worlds are world-books, or sets of propositions, or abstract objects of some sort, they can represent or encode impossibilities without actually instantiating them. So from the fact that, according to (the impossible world) w: (A and it is not the case that A), it does not follow that according to w: A, and it is not the case that according to w: A. Truths that hold in stories or representations do not automatically carry over to the actual world (e.g. it is true in Tolkien's The Lord of the Rings that there exist orcs, but this does not entail that orcs exist at the actual world).

An inconveniens for any kind of ersatzism on impossible worlds has to do with how to qualify the standard semantic clause for (unrestricted) possibility:

(P) It is possible that A if and only if there's a world w such that, at w, A,

without resorting to a primitive notion of modality. Once impossible worlds enter the stage, (P) becomes false from right to left. We therefore need a principle that restricts the quantification in the right half of the biconditional to possible worlds; how to do that without appealing to modal notions is an unsolved problem. Each species of ersatz modal realism affords the resources to produce ersatz impossible worlds, so to speak, “out of the same stuff” ersatz possible worlds are made of: ersatz impossible worlds are of the same kind as their possible mates (and it should be noticed that in Zalta's account of possible and impossible worlds, taken as abstract objects encoding states of affairs, possibility enters as a constituent notion in the definition; Zalta's theory takes modality as primitive).

To this inconveniens, the ersatzist may reply by just biting the bullet. Even without admitting impossible worlds, most possible worlds accounts do not aim at providing a reductive and complete analysis of modality (Lewis' modal realism does; but it may not succeed, when so-called “alien” properties, that is, properties that are not instantiated by anything at the actual world nor obtainable as constructions out of actually instantiated properties, enter the stage — on this, see Divers 2002, Chapter 7; Divers & Melia 2002). In fact, it is a common thought that possibility, necessity, and related modal notions, form a tight circle of interrelated concepts, so that none of them can be analyzed without resorting to some other notion in the circle.

Other objections to impossible worlds, rather then declaring them utterly inadmissible, target their general usefulness or their alleged applicability to specific tasks. Two such objections against impossible worlds have been raised by Stalnaker 1996. According to Stalnaker, there is nothing wrong in admitting impossible worlds taken as sets of propositions that are locally inconsistent and incomplete. However, not much explanatory work is to be expected from them: for instance, if one takes worlds as sets of propositions, one cannot then analyze propositions as sets of worlds.

To this one may reply, firstly, that the problem does not affect impossible worlds specifically, for the same point can be made against any account of possible worlds (such as Adams') that takes them as maximally consistent sets of propositions; secondly, that impossible worlds may be accounted for metaphysically in several other ways, as we have seen; and thirdly, that even a theory of (possible and impossible) worlds as sets of propositions may be useful for explanatory purposes different from the one of accounting for propositions and their properties.

The second Stalnakerian objection, connected to the aforementioned Lewisian one, focuses on the semantics of negation. The standard semantic clause for negation has it that ¬A is true if and only if A is not true. So there could not be worlds at which both A and ¬A are true, unless we revise the semantics of negation. And negation is such a basic operator (whose semantics is “learned in a first logic class”, Stalnaker says) that it had better be left alone.

To this, the impossible world theorist can reply that it is in fact the case that ¬A is true if and only if A is not true; for this concerns truth simpliciter, that is, truth at the actual world. She may also agree that the same holds for any possible world. But it is precisely impossible worlds that we are talking about here; how negation works at any possible world need not be affected by the fact that, at some impossible world or other, some sentence can hold together with its negation: this is one of the things that makes them impossible, after all.

Timothy Williamson (2007, Chapter 5) has objected to non-trivial treatments of counterpossibles, in particular (though not perforce) when they resort to impossible worlds, along the following lines. Consider the claim:

(1) If 5 + 7 were 13, then 5 + 6 would be 12.

Prima facie, this is a non-trivially true counterpossible. However, Williamson argues, other non-trivial consequences of the supposition would then be that 5 + 5 = 11, and 5 + 4 = 10, and ... , and 0 = 1. Therefore,

(2) If the number of answers I gave to a given question were 0, then the number of answers I gave would be 1.

but (2) is clearly false.

A reply by Brogaard & Salerno 2007 consists in putting Williamson in front of a dilemma: either we hold the context fixed in this kind of counterpossible reasoning, or we don't. If we don't, then (2) does not follow from (1). In particular, the context at which (2) comes out false is one at which the closest antecedent worlds are possible and, to be sure, at those worlds, 0 is not 1. But if we hold the context fixed, then what does follow is just the following counterpossible:

(3) If 0 were 1 and the number of right answers I gave were 0, then the number of right answers I gave would be 1.

Now this is intuitively true, and non-trivially so.

Another objection in the same work by Williamson is to the effect that non-trivial treatments of counterfactuals with impossible antecedents are forced to claim that these create opaque contexts in which the substitutivity of co-referential terms fails. Supporters of non-trivial counterpossibles will take the following conditional as false:

(4) If Hesperus had not been Phosphorus, then Phosphorus would not have been Phosphorus.

Given the necessity of identity, (4) is a counterpossible: as Hesperus is Phosphorus, its antecedent can only be true at impossible worlds. But, so the insight goes, when we make the counterpossible supposition expressed by the antecedent, a negation of the trivial a priori truth that Phosphorus = Phosphorus, as per the consequent, does not automatically follow. In terms of closeness: impossible worlds where Hesperus is not Phosphorus, but Phosphorus is still self-identical, should be closer than worlds where (Hesperus is not Phosphorus and) the a priori principle of the Reflexivity of Identity is violated. However, the following will still be true:

(5) If Hesperus had not been Phosphorus, then Hesperus would not have been Phosphorus.

This is an instance of the triviality “If it had been the case that A then it would have been the case that A”. But (5) follows from (4) by substituting “Phosphorus” with the co-referential “Hesperus”. This failure of substitutivity, Williamson claims, is a bad result, for counterfactuals should not create opaque contexts.

Brogaard & Salerno 2013 reply by biting the bullet to some extent: counterpossibles do occasionally create opaque contexts, but this is not too bad. In particular, an impossible worlds similarity semantics for counterpossibles should be “partially epistemic” (Brogaard & Salerno 2013: 654). One of the factors that will make for the closeness of worlds will be the extent to which they retain a priori principles and implications. Appeal to apriority explains the failure of substitutivity, for “it is a priori that” creates opaque contexts: we cannot get from “It is a priori that Phosphorus = Phosphorus” (true) to “It is a priori that Hesperus = Phosphorus” (false): for all the ancients knew a priori, Hesperus was distinct from Phosphorus, but they had no doubts on the self-identity of Phosphorus.

Undoubtedly, other objections to impossible worlds can and are likely to be raised. In fact, the debate on impossible worlds appears to be nowadays at the same stage as the one on possible worlds some thirty-five years ago. At the time, people struggled to make sense of the concept of possible world, or just declared it meaningless. Nowadays, the variety of its applications has placed the notion firmly at the core of much philosophical and logical practice (see e.g., Divers 2002, Chapter 4). Impossible worlds may undergo the same fate, should they prove as useful as they appear to be in the treatment of impossibilities of various kinds. If so, impossible worlds may show that the kingdom of the absurd is not like Hegel's night, in which all cows are black.


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The author would like to thank JC Beall, Berit Brogaard, Nicola Ciprotti, Ira Kiourti, Daniel Nolan, Graham Priest, Greg Restall, Achille Varzi, Heinrich Wansing, and two anonymous referees, for helpful comments, suggestions, and references.

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