The Grounds of Moral Status

First published Thu Mar 14, 2013

An entity has moral status if and only if it or its interests morally matter to some degree for the entity's own sake, such that it can be wronged. For instance, an animal may be said to have moral status if its suffering is at least somewhat morally bad, on account of this animal itself and regardless of the consequences for other beings, and acting unjustifiably against its interests is not only wrong, but wrongs the animal. Others owe it to the animal to avoid acting in this way. Some philosophers think of moral status as coming in degrees, reserving the notion of full moral status (FMS) for the highest degree of status.

Sometimes the term “moral standing” rather than “moral status” is used, but typically these terms have the same meaning. Some philosophers employ the language of “moral considerability” but this term is extremely ambiguous. Some use it as an alternate expression for “moral status” which is understood to come in degrees. In other cases the phrase is used to mean FMS. Act Utilitarians employ yet a third notion of moral considerability, which is a matter of having one's interests (e.g., the intensity, duration, etc. of one's pleasure or pain) factored into the calculus to determine which action minimizes the bad and maximizes the good. To avoid these ambiguities, this entry will use the terminology of “moral status” and “FMS.”  

After reviewing which entities have been thought to have moral status and what is involved in having FMS, as opposed to a lesser degree of moral status, this article will survey different views of the grounds of moral status as well as the arguments for attributing a particular degree of moral status on the basis of those grounds.

1. For Which Entities Does the Question of Moral Status Arise?

A variety of applied ethics debates regarding how certain beings – human beings, non-human animals, and even ecosystems – should be treated hinge on theoretical questions about their moral status and the grounds of that moral status. It is these theoretical questions that are the focus of this entry, but a quick survey of the applied ethics debates helpfully allows us to identify which entities have been thought to have moral status.

It is usually taken for granted that all adult cognitively unimpaired human beings have FMS. Of course, historically the moral status of people falling into a group perceived as “other,” such as foreigners, racial minorities, women, the physically disabled, etc. has been routinely denied. Either they were not seen as having any moral status, or if they were granted some status, it was not FMS. However, accounting for their status does not pose much of a theoretical challenge (see section 4.1) and nowadays their status is rarely explicitly and directly denied on principled moral grounds.

By contrast, constructing plausible theories that account for the moral status of other human beings—not only the degree of their status, but in some cases also whether they have it at all—is more challenging (see section 4). Debates about disability rights and the permissibility of eugenics rest in part on theoretical disagreements about the moral status of cognitively impaired humans. These issues include controversies regarding the treatment of cognitively disabled infants, such as the practice of allowing infants with Down syndrome to die. Debates concerning abortion, stem cell research (see the entry on the ethics of stem cell research), and the question of what to do with unused frozen embryos from in vitro fertilization also rest on the theoretical question of the moral status of extremely underdeveloped human beings at various stages of development: zygote, embryo, fetus (see section 4.2). The moral status of both underdeveloped and cognitively impaired human beings is often taken to be at issue when it comes to the use of pre-implantation genetic diagnosis and amniocentesis. In addition, medical advances that prolong life, as well as debates about euthanasia, have led people to question the moral status of humans incapable of consciousness, such as those in a persistent vegetative state and anencephalic babies (born without the higher brain).

Humans are not the only beings about whom we might ask if they have moral status, and if so, to what degree. The moral status of animals is also of concern. Debates regarding the treatment of livestock (e.g., raising calves for veal, burning off the beaks of chickens, etc.), management of wild animals (e.g., killing wolves to protect livestock, killing deer in response to their overpopulation, etc.), and the creation and design of zoos rest, in part, on the moral status of domesticated and wild animals. In some cases the ethical question of an animal's treatment arises because of the discovery of their cognitive sophistication (e.g., dolphins, elephants, and great apes), which is taken to have a bearing on the theoretical issue of their moral status.

We have already noted that, while there are disagreements from one culture to another, and even within a single culture, both historically and at any given time, there is also significant agreement at least among non-philosophers that all cognitively unimpaired human adults have the highest degree of moral status. But, in addition, non-philosophers in principle, if not always in practice, accept the same view regarding all cognitively unimpaired human infants and severely cognitively impaired human beings (as we will use this term, it excludes those incapable of consciousness). That is, they hold that infants and the severely impaired, whether their impairment is intellectual or emotional, not merely have higher moral status than most animals but have FMS. By contrast, there is no such consensus about the moral status of human fetuses, humans incapable of consciousness, and even sophisticated animals like great apes.

Nonetheless, providing an adequate theory to account for the FMS of unimpaired infants and cognitively impaired human beings without attributing the same status to most animals has proven very difficult. In fact, our survey in section 4 suggests that this challenge has not been met by any of the existing accounts of the grounds of moral status. Some philosophers have, as a result, questioned or even abandoned this seemingly commonsense view, including the aspect that holds all adult cognitively unimpaired human beings have FMS (see the end of section 4.1).

It is important to note that questions of moral status – having it at all as well as the degree to which it is had – arise not only for human or non-human sentient individuals, but also for any living being/entity (such as a tree), as well as for entire species and ecosystems and non-living entities, such as mountains or a natural landscape (see the entry on environmental ethics).

In section 4 we will discuss how a range of humans (developed, and in various stages of underdevelopment, unimpaired and impaired), non-human animals, species, and ecosystems fare with respect to various accounts of the grounds of moral status.

2. What Is Full Moral Status (FMS)?

In this section we will discuss what having FMS amounts to, since with respect to this highest degree of moral status the literature is the most developed and detailed. Those with FMS are often called “moral persons.” Standardly, FMS is understood to involve (i) a very stringent moral presumption against interfering with the being in various ways — destroying the being, experimenting upon it, directly causing its suffering, etc. While the strong presumption against interfering is the main aspect of FMS, some philosophers include as part of FMS (ii) a strong, but not necessarily stringent, reason to aid and (iii) a strong reason to treat fairly.

2.1 Stringent Presumption against Interference

All who employ the concept of FMS agree that, under most circumstances, we are morally prohibited from interfering in various ways with a being with FMS even for the sake of another valued creature and its interests, or for the sake of any other value, such as art, justice, or world peace. For instance, we are prohibited from killing a being with FMS for the sake of saving one or several other such beings. Some philosophers discuss this presumption using the terminology of duties; others use the terminology of rights and focus mainly on the right not to be killed (e.g., Feinberg 1980, pp. 98–104).

Note that FMS is not typically considered to preclude paternalistic interference. A seven-year-old human being is typically granted FMS (as we will see below) but it is nevertheless permissible to treat her paternalistically in some respects (see the entry on paternalism).

The moral presumption against interfering with a being with FMS, as it is typically understood, has at least these features:

  1. It is a particularly strong moral reason against interfering, regardless of whether this interference results in harm. This strong reason can be overridden only in special circumstances and might altogether silence many types of conflicting reasons. For example, while pleasure is a legitimate reason for action in numerous circumstances (e.g., when choosing a leisure activity), the fact that someone might receive pleasure from killing a being with FMS is altogether removed from consideration as a reason for this action.
  2. Despite its strength, the presumption not to interfere with beings with FMS may be overridden, perhaps, for example, when the lives of a very large number of others are at stake. But, crucially, even when the presumption is legitimately overridden in such special circumstances a moral residue remains, so that, for example, there is still reason to strongly regret the action.
  3. When this presumption is not overridden and the being with FMS is interfered with, then the action is not merely wrong but also the being is wronged.
  4. The reason not to interfere with beings with FMS is stronger than the reason not to interfere with beings that have some, but not full, moral status. For example, the reason not to kill a being with FMS in medical experiments is much stronger than the reason not to kill a similarly situated rabbit, which some consider to have lesser moral status. This means that the set of circumstances in which the reason not to kill a being with FMS can be overridden is much narrower than it is for beings with lower status, other things being equal. And it also means that the reason not to kill a being with FMS silences a broader set of conflicting considerations than the reason not to kill a being with lower moral status, other things being equal.

In addition, FMS is often taken to involve the following further feature, which is more controversial. When two beings both have FMS, the reason not to interfere with them is equally strong, other facts about the action being equal. This idea has been dubbed the “equal wrongness thesis” (McMahan 2002, p. 235). A variety of factors are thought not to affect the wrongness of killing of beings with FMS, in cases when killing is wrong: the being's age, level of intelligence, temperament, social circumstances, etc. For example, for a young and an old person who both have FMS, the reasons not to kill them are claimed to be equally strong despite the fact that the young person stands to lose much more in dying than the old. Note that irrespective of the equal wrongness thesis, one can grant that factors unrelated to the level of harm to the being, such as the mode of agency, defeaters, the number of people affected, and special relationships, do make a difference to the degree to which killing is wrong. Also, when killing is not wrong, as well as in the context of saving, one can grant that factors related to harm, such as age, etc., make a difference to one's decision (McMahan 2002, pp. 236–7). One might accept the equal wrongness thesis but disagree about which factors do or don't affect the wrongness of killing beings with FMS. On the other hand, one might reject the equal wrongness thesis altogether and so also not see FMS as entailing it (see McMahan 2008, and also Arneson 1999, to which we return in 4.1).

2.2 Strong Reason to Aid

While this is less commonly associated with FMS, some philosophers believe that there is a reason to provide aid to beings with FMS and it is stronger than the reason to aid beings who have only some or no moral status (e.g., Jaworska 2007 and Quinn 1984, in contrast to McMahan's interpretation of ordinary moral intuitions in McMahan 2002, pp. 223–224). Imagine a context in which one is saving individuals from a certain level of harm, such as pain, discomfort, or death. When faced with a choice of saving either a being with FMS or one without FMS, barring further reasons that may complicate the moral picture (e.g., indirect consequences of saving the being without FMS for other beings with FMS), there is a stronger reason to pick the being with FMS. Further, even in cases where aiding is not in fact possible, it is a graver moral misfortune, ceteris paribus, to leave a being with FMS unaided, as compared to a being without FMS. Of course, what aid is appropriate for a being depends on the context and on the being's stage of development. FMS is about the strength of the reason to aid and not about what type of aid to give.

Note that even if FMS entails strong reasons to aid, the reverse is not necessarily the case. Stronger reason to aid one being rather than another does not necessarily entail that the aided being has a higher moral status. See more general methodological cautions along these lines in section 2.4.

2.3 Strong Reason to Treat Fairly

While this is even less commonly explicitly associated with FMS, some views emphasize that comparable interests of beings with FMS matter equally in moral decisions, giving rise to strong reasons to treat such beings fairly (Broome 1990–1991 and Jaworska 2007). For example, when distrib­uting goods among such beings, in circumstances when they can all benefit similarly, barring special purposes, relationships, or independent claims on the goods, we have strong reason to distribute the goods equally (or in another way that's fair, depending on the account of fairness). In some cases one will be distributing goods that meet needs and in other cases the goods being distributed are not needed, but will nevertheless be appreciated. In either case, there is a strong reason to distribute the goods fairly among beings with FMS. This reason does not necessarily apply to beings that lack FMS; for example, a farmer need not worry about being fair in distributing food to his cows and chickens.

2.4 Distinguishing Reasons Constitutive of Moral Status from Other Reasons

It is helpful to bring out two points about FMS, the second of which is not discussed in the literature, but both of which, once made explicit, would likely be accepted by those who work on FMS.

First, the reasons mentioned in sections 2.1–2.3 ought to be understood as independent of special relationships and contracts. And thus they are impartial reasons, that is, every moral agent (human, intelligent Martian, etc.) has reason to act or forebear acting in the ways thus far discussed (McMahan 2005). Moreover, these reasons are independent of other facts about the action, for example, the action's possible bad long-term effects. Instead, they are reasons to treat the being this way for the being's own sake. So, for instance, a parent has at least two reasons not to kill his own child: a reason in virtue of the child's FMS, and a reason in virtue of the parental relationship, which generates a special obligation for this particular agent not to kill this particular child.

Second, it is important, methodologically speaking, not to infer moral status (full or otherwise) simply from the degree of wrongness or badness of an act, from the existence of rights, or from the strength of reasons in favor of the act (including omissions). For example, it might be worse for a parent to kill his own child than a stranger's child, but that does not mean that the children have different moral status. The child has a right that her parent not kill her, in virtue of the special relationships between parents and their children, but this is in addition to, and separate from, the right not to be killed that the child has in virtue of her moral status. Or, to take another example, there may be a large difference in the strength of reasons to save each of two beings from death, but this difference may have little to do with the moral status of the beings. Both McMahan (2002) and Singer (1993) hold, on quite different grounds, that death is not very bad for most animals, while it is very bad for ordinary adult human beings. Accordingly, on their views, the reason to save an ordinary adult human being from death is much stronger than the reason to save, say, a rabbit from death. But this is not itself evidence of a higher moral status of the human being: the difference in the strength of reasons is fully explained by the vast difference in the benefits of aid in the two cases, and is fully compatible with the claim that the human and the rabbit have the same moral status. (Of course, one can hold, on other grounds, that they in fact have different status, as McMahan himself does.)

Certain views might acknowledge that some humans lack FMS and yet emphasize that we ought, nevertheless, to treat them as though they have FMS due to the bad effects that would otherwise follow. For example, someone might think that, for practical purposes, we need a very straightforward, stable, and difficult to misinterpret criterion of moral status. If we don't treat all human beings as if they have FMS, unclarity and moral confusion would ensue. It would open the floodgates for different people to set the threshold capacity required for FMS differently, and thereby lead to mistaken underinclusion and consequent mistreatment of humans who do in fact have FMS. Another bad consequence that can arise, at least were we to fail to treat neonates as having FMS by permitting infanticide, is depriving would-be adoptive parents of the opportunity to adopt (Warren 1996, Postscript). There are also more self-interested possible bad consequences to consider. Failure to treat unimpaired infants as having FMS might lead to a lack of tenderness toward them, and thereby contribute to their turning into people who will mistreat us when they are older (Feinberg 1980, p. 198). Moreover, a rule of treating cognitively impaired human beings as having FMS would ensure that we will be treated well should we ever suffer from cognitive impairment (considered without endorsement by McMahan 2002, pp. 227–8).

Kant's remarks about the treatment of animals might indicate a yet further argument for treating humans without FMS as if they nevertheless had FMS. He argued that we have reasons to avoid cruelty to animals, and thus to treat animals better than their moral status implies, since otherwise we might develop psychological propensities that could lead us analogously to mistreat humans who have FMS (Kant [LE], pp. 212–13). Similarly, one might reason, if we do not treat those humans without FMS as having FMS, we might develop psychological propensities that could lead us to mistreat humans who have FMS.

Regardless of the details, on all such proposals, the requirement of treating a being as if it had FMS, or some other degree of moral status, to avoid bad consequences is not equivalent to that being's having this moral status: while the reasons adduced might indeed be good reasons to treat the being as if it had the requisite moral status, these reasons are not for the sake of that being, but rather for the sake of other beings.

Other types of reasons for treating beings as if they had a certain degree of moral status have also been offered. Some virtue ethicists claim that we ought to avoid harming animals because harming them is incompatible with displaying the virtuous character traits we ought to display (see the entry on the moral status of animals for details). Several contractualists (see section 5 below and the entry on contractualism) have argued that one may reasonably opt out of any agreement that does not afford sufficient moral status to one's children and others one cares about, including those who are severely cognitively impaired (Morris 2011, pp. 265–267 and Carruthers 2011, pp. 387–394). Critics and proponents disagree whether these considerations can establish reasons that are for these beings' sake (e.g., reasons not to interfere); hence, it is unclear whether they can establish the moral status of the beings in question.

3. Moral Status versus FMS

Those who accept that moral status comes in degrees have not developed fine-grained accounts of what each degree of status would involve. Their emphasis has been on the difference in status between creatures or entities that have some moral status (dogs, rabbits, etc.), and those who deserve the highest degree of moral status (FMS). However, with the above account of FMS made explicit, one can delineate different paradigms for capturing degrees of moral status, which we will list here simply in the spirit of marking out possible positions, and thus without addressing the pros, cons, and implications of each position.

One way to capture degrees of moral status is to vary the strength of the reasons outlined in section 2 (and hence also the degree of wrongness involved in acting against these reasons – see DeGrazia 2008). For example, while there is a very stringent moral presumption against killing an unimpaired adult human being, there might be only strong but non-stringent reasons not to kill a dog, and very weak reasons not to kill a fish. The weaker the reason, the more easily overridden it is. The other categories of reasons would be handled similarly: when the benefit to be received, the cost of providing that benefit, and other similar factors are on a par, there is a strong reason to aid an unimpaired adult human being, but only some reason to aid a dog, and very little reason to aid a fish, and so on. Alternatively, one could treat FMS as involving a stringent reason not to be killed of the type that, in cases of conflict, would override what maximizes the overall good, whereas, for a being with lesser moral status, what maximizes the overall good – with this being's good included in the calculus – does settle how this being should be treated (McMahan 2002, pp. 245–247).

Another way to capture degrees of moral status is to vary not the strength of the reasons but which reasons apply. Instead of the three categories of reasons discussed above, lesser moral status might involve two kinds of reasons (a stringent moral presumption against interference and a strong reason to aid, but no reason to treat fairly) or only one (a stringent moral presumption against interference, but no reason to aid or treat fairly). This, of course, is compatible with other reasons, in a given context, to aid or treat fairly that do not derive from the being's moral status (see section 2.4). Alternatively, lesser moral status might involve fewer presumptions against different types of interference (e.g., only a presumption against causing pain but not against killing).

Of course, one could combine these two approaches. For example, to have the highest degree of moral status is for there to be very strong reasons of all three types, an intermediate level of moral status (e.g., the status of a dog) might involve some reason not to kill the being but no reason to aid it or treat it fairly, while the lowest degree of moral status would involve a very weak reason of just one type. Although having the lowest degree of moral status would not afford much protection, it nevertheless is different from having no moral status at all. A fingernail has no moral status and so no reasons of any kind need be given for cutting it up and discarding it. But sufficient justification must be provided for doing this to a being with even very low moral status.

4. Grounds of Moral Status

Accounts differ on what it is about the individual that grounds or confers moral status and to what degree, with implications for which beings do or do not have moral status and for their comparative status. We begin with the Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts of moral status and their main strengths and shortcomings. We then show that alternative accounts do not fare any better and so the challenge remains to provide a plausible unified account of the grounds of FMS, especially for those who wish to defend the “commonsense view” discussed in section 1. The order of presentation is, roughly, dialectical, not historical.

For each account discussed, one could hold either a threshold or scalar conception of moral status, though the former is more commonly found in the literature (see the end of section 4.1 for an exception). According to the threshold conception, as it is usually discussed, if capacity C grounds FMS, then any being that has C, regardless of how well it can exercise this capacity, has as much moral status as any other being that has C and this status is full. If C is not only sufficient but necessary for FMS, then all beings lacking C would not have FMS, though the threshold conception would nevertheless leave it open whether having some other feature (e.g., parts of C or something lesser but akin to C) might ground lesser degrees of moral status. In contrast, a scalar conception of moral status would hold that if capacity C grounds moral status, then any being who has C has some status; the better it can exercise this capacity, the higher its degree of moral status (Arneson 1999).

There is an alternative way to draw the threshold versus scalar distinction of moral status. Instead of focusing on how well capacity C is exercised, the views could instead focus on the number of relevant capacities a being has. A threshold view might specify some number n of the relevant capacities as both necessary and sufficient for FMS. A scalar conception would hold, on the other hand, that a being with n+1 capacities would have a higher moral status than one with merely n capacities.

While both threshold and scalar conceptions of moral status allow for degrees of moral status, each faces its own set of difficulties. For example, the threshold conception allows for the possibility of discontinuities in degrees of moral status that might seem arbitrary. The difference, for example, between a being with C, but who can only exercise it very poorly, and a being without C might not seem to be very great, and yet if C grounds FMS, then the former being will have FMS while the latter might have no moral status. However, advocates of the threshold view could respond that if C is a valuable capacity, then a being with a capacity to do it poorly has achieved something important compared to a being without this capacity. In addition, if there are multiple grounds for lesser degrees of moral status, which threshold views could allow, then this might remove a large gap in status between beings with C and those lacking C but who have other status conferring capacities. Scalar conceptions, on the other hand, can easily account for lesser degrees of moral status, but may defy commonsense intuitions. For example, if intelligence were to play the role of C, then the scalar conception would claim that those who are more intelligent have a stronger right not to be killed than those who are not quite as intelligent, which would be contrary to commonsense intuition (see Wikler 2009 for a discussion of whether degrees of intelligence are relevant to civil rights).

4.1 Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities

According to this type of account, a being has FMS if and only if the being has very sophisticated cognitive capacities. These capacities might be intellectual or emotional. Historically, the most famous sophisticated intellectual capacities account was given by Kant, according to whom autonomy, the capacity to set ends via practical reasoning, must be respected (see the entry on respect) and grounds the dignity of all rational beings ([GMM], pp. 434, 436, Prussian Academy pagination). Beings without reason may be treated as a mere means (p. 428). For a contemporary version, put in terms of the capacity to will as sufficient for rights of respect, see Quinn 1984, pp. 49–52. Other intellectual capacities that have been suggested, even if not always embraced, as grounding FMS, or at least the associated rights and the distinctive value of a person, include self-awareness (McMahan 2002, pp. 45 and 242) or awareness of oneself as a continuing subject of mental states (Tooley 1972, p. 44); being future-oriented in one's desires and plans (Singer 1993, pp. 95 and 100; see, however, section 4.3 for Singer's and Tooley's equal consideration view); capacity to value, to bargain, and to assume duties and responsibilities (all part of a longer list in Feinberg 1980, p. 197). On the emotional side, one sophisticated capacity that has been proposed is the capacity to care, as distinguished from the mere capacity to desire. (Jaworska (2007) posits this as sufficient but perhaps not necessary for FMS.) There are also combination views that appeal to both intellectual and emotional sophisticated cognitive capacities as necessary and sufficient for FMS (Feinberg 1980, p. 197).

According to Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts, the feature grounding FMS is not relational: the source of moral status is neither a relation the individual stands in (e.g., membership in a species) nor a capacity whose exercise requires active participation of another (e.g., the capacity to relate to others in certain mutually responsive ways). In some versions, the exercise of the relevant capacities does not even require the existence of anyone else, while in others it, at most, involves the presence of another being (as in the case of caring about someone) but not necessarily that being's active participation. Individuals have FMS solely because they can engage in certain cognitively sophisticated acts or responses on their own. Moreover, any being that has these sophisticated cognitive capacities has FMS, and so the accounts avoid anthropocentrism. However, since most (but not necessarily all) animals lack sophisticated cognitive capacities, they are not accorded the same moral status as an unimpaired adult human. Similarly, in the case of a living organism such as a redwood tree or a fetus, as well as non-individual entities, such as species and ecosystems, they would not have FMS on these views.

Some of these views (e.g., Kant's) do not allow for any moral status other than FMS, and so would hold that beings who don't meet the threshold for FMS have no moral status at all. Other views are silent on this question and compatible with lower degrees of moral status for beings or entities that are not cognitively sophisticated. Yet others (e.g., McMahan 2002) explicitly insist that all sentient beings have some degree of moral status.

A stock objection to Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts is their underinclusiveness. Not only will some environmentalists and animal activists find the view underinclusive, but so too will those who subscribe to the “commonsense view” articulated in section 1. For example, infants lack sophisticated cognitive capacities, and so fail to meet this necessary condition for FMS. The versions that offer only a sufficient condition for FMS seem more plausible since they leave open alternative routes to FMS. But such accounts still leave the moral status of infants unaccounted for, and possibly on a par with that of dogs and rabbits. Of course, these views nevertheless allow that there are very strong reasons not to kill human infants: it would be disrespectful and harmful to the infant's parents, it would likely cause psychological harm to the killers, etc. But these reasons have nothing to do with the moral status of infants, since they are not reasons for the infants' own sake (Feinberg 1980, p.198 and McMahan 2002, p. 232).

Threshold conceptions of Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities views have been thought by some to entail a claim that is incompatible with the equal wrongness thesis or with any other interpretation of the equal moral status of all beings with FMS (see the entry on egalitarianism). According to the threshold conception of a Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities view, any being that meets the threshold has full moral status. Since the status is full, there is no higher status that a being can achieve. Nevertheless, one might think that if the possession of some threshold level of a sophisticated cognitive capacity (e.g., the capacity to set ends) makes such a difference to moral status, then the possession of the capacity to do this well (e.g., the capacity to set ends well) should lead to an even higher status. Or, as Arneson (1999) would put it, a higher degree of the capacity entails a higher status. And so two beings who meet the threshold would not, after all, have equal moral status. Compare, for example, an ordinary human adult's capacity to set ends to the capacity of a cognitively impoverished being who, in its lifetime, “can set just a few ends and make just a few choices based on considering two or three simple alternatives” (Arneson 1999, pp. 119–120). It is not enough to stipulate that differences in capacity to do an activity well do not affect one's status. The account needs to provide an explanation for why such differences do not matter. And so, if one accepts the claim that the capacity to do an activity well leads to even higher moral status, then one must reject the equal wrongness thesis and the threshold conception of 4.1.

A related way to put the issue is this. According to the “commonsense view,” a virtue of the threshold conception of the Sophisticated Cognitive Capacity account is that it distinguishes and elevates the moral status of cognitively unimpaired adult humans compared to other animals. However, once the importance of sophisticated cognitive capacities is highlighted, it seems that not only the possession of the capacity but also how well one exercises it is morally relevant to one's status. Since not all cognitively unimpaired adult humans exercise this capacity equally well, then it would seem that not all cognitively unimpaired adult humans have equal moral status. And so, combining this interpretation of the threshold conception with a Sophisticated Cognitive Capacity account results in not according all cognitively unimpaired adult humans equal moral status – a problem from the commonsense viewpoint.

4.2 Capacity to Develop Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities

The problem, at least from the standpoint of the commonsense view, of underincluding infants can be avoided while still retaining a shared source of FMS. The above accounts can be modified as follows: sophisticated cognitive capacities or the capacity to develop these sophisticated capacities (without losing one's identity) are necessary and sufficient for FMS. This is usually labeled the “potential” account in the literature (e.g., Stone 1987), although some authors do not use this terminology, but rather speak, for example, of the wrongness of killing due to the loss of a “future like ours” (Marquis 1989 and 1995). One can also treat potentiality as a ground for some, but not full, moral status (Harman 1999, notwithstanding the revisions in Harman 2003) or as only an enhancer of moral status (Steinbock 1992, p. 68). Views differ in their interpretation of potentiality. For example, some deny that a fetus that will die as a fetus has the relevant potential (Harman 1999, p. 311).

These potentiality accounts, like the accounts in 4.1, avoid anthropocentrism without according most animals the same elevation in moral status. But, unlike the accounts in 4.1, they also include very underdeveloped human beings: not only infants and one-year-olds, but even early fetuses have the capacity to develop sophisticated cognitive capacities (barring unusual cases). However, these potentiality accounts make no advance with respect to the problem of accounting for the equal status of all beings with FMS, since sophisticated capacities, which can be exercised well to varying degrees, are still treated as the source of moral status. Moreover, these accounts are of no help to those interested in according moral status to non-human animals, trees, species, and ecosystems.

Although Boonin (2003) denies that his view is a potentiality account (p. 62), his view does implicitly appeal to potentiality, albeit with somewhat different implications than those above. He defends having the conjunction of “a future-like-ours” (a kind of potentiality) and “actual conscious desires that can be satisfied only if [one's] personal future is preserved” as sufficient for FMS (p. 84). Barring early death, most two-year-olds and older children meet both conditions: they have a future like ours while also having conscious desires, e.g., for avocado tomorrow, which can only be satisfied if the child lives until the next day. Early fetuses also typically have a future like ours, but they lack mental states such as desires, and thus are excluded from FMS. Boonin is explicitly neutral on the question whether animals have a future-like-ours, so his proposal is compatible with several different views about the moral status of animals (p. 84, note 36).

Any attempt to ground moral status in potentiality introduces its own challenges. One could argue that mere potential cognitive capacity is insufficient for FMS or even a weaker moral status. A potential US president has neither rights nor even a claim to command the military; likewise in the case of potentially cognitively sophisticated beings and the rights associated with moral status (Feinberg 1980, p.193). While this particular analogy has been contested (Wilkins 1993, pp. 126–127 and Boonin 2003, pp. 46–49), one can appeal to other analogies: a small child, a potential adult, doesn't have the rights of adults to own property or to watch any television program it wants (Boonin 2003, p. 48).

Still, there is room to press back on this objection. We do, after all, often treat people with potential differently from those without it. We provide extra music instruction, music scholarships, and create music camps for those with the potential to become great musicians, whereas we do not do so for those lacking such potentiality. While being a potential adult human does not give one a right to vote, perhaps it gives us reason to act as trustees with regard to childrens' future status and interests and thus to educate and prepare them to become voters by the time they are adults; it does seem that children would be wronged if we neglected to so prepare them. In this way, we treat children differently from dogs who lack the potential to become adult humans, even though neither is now an adult human. And perhaps this difference in treatment would extend even to not taking certain actions (e.g., killing) that would result in the loss of the relevant potentiality. This line of response might only go so far when it comes to fetuses. With respect to a future-like-ours, some argue that the loss of this potentiality is morally problematic only if the being is sufficiently psychologically connected to that future person, and a fetus arguably lacks this sufficient connection (McInerney 1990).

Even though the potentiality accounts come closer to capturing the commonsense view than the Sophisticated Cognitive Capacities accounts, they still are, on this view, underinclusive. Many conscious human beings whose cognitive impairment is both severe and permanent cannot meet these accounts' conditions for an elevated moral status. It might be that humans who currently suffer from severe, permanent cognitive impairment, but once had sophisticated cognitive capacities, have FMS in virtue of the past possession of these capacities. But it is unclear how to defend such a claim. Moreover, the moral status of permanently severely cognitively impaired humans who never had sophisticated cognitive capacities remains unaccounted for (see the entry on cognitive disability and moral status). Even the versions of the accounts that offer only a sufficient condition for FMS still leave their moral status open and possibly on a par with animals who similarly lack both the sophisticated cognitive capacities and the capacity to develop them. In Boonin's case, since he is agnostic about animals and so, presumably, about cognitively impaired human beings with similar prospects, his view will either overinclude the former or underinclude the latter, as both types of beings will be treated on a par.

4.3 Rudimentary Cognitive Capacities

In response to the criticisms just discussed, one could lower the standards for the kind of cognitive capacities that are necessary and sufficient for FMS. If the relevant cognitive capacities were rudimentary enough, even severely cognitively impaired human beings would qualify. Such an account might appeal to the capacity to experience pleasure or pain (sentience), to have interests or basic emotions, or the capacity for consciousness. Whether fetuses at various stages of development will thereby have FMS depends on which rudimentary capacity is appealed to. For example, an early fetus has interests but not consciousness.

This accommodation does not fit well with the commonsense view, which would see it as overinclusive. Most (but not all) animals meet these lowered standards for FMS – they have the capacity for pleasure, pain, interests, and consciousness – and so their moral status would be on a par with most human beings (namely all those who possess these rudimentary capacities). For example, some authors claim that respecting rational nature entails respecting beings that have only parts of rational nature or necessary conditions of it (Wood 1998, p. 197). Such a view seems to treat animals, infants, and severely cognitively impaired humans, all of whom exhibit only parts of rational nature, as morally on a par. (See O'Neill 1998 for additional critiques of this kind of Kantian approach.) Many advocates of such views explicitly and gladly embrace this inclusiveness and reject the commonsense view of the status of animals (Regan 2004).

Some philosophers eschew the language of moral status and, in any case, would not allow that it comes in degrees; they claim that all beings who have the relevant rudimentary cognitive capacities deserve “equal moral consideration.” For example, the fact that one's act would cause a certain degree of suffering is a reason to avoid the act regardless of what kind of being experiences this suffering. Singer (1993) is famously associated with this “equal consideration” view, though he also seems to implicitly allow a higher moral status and so greater moral consideration (e.g., “right to life”) to self-conscious beings, which is more akin to the account in 4.1.

While the equal moral consideration approach may seem to imply treating human beings and most animals alike, many of its defenders deny this counterintuitive implication by showing that two beings can deserve equal consideration and yet require differential treatment due to differences in the interests impacted. What an unimpaired adult human stands to lose in being killed, for example, is much weightier than what a bird would lose. The capacity of foresight, for example, can make for weightier interests, and so human beings with this or other forms of cognitive sophistication are harmed more by death (Rachels 1990, pp.186–194; Regan 2004, pp. 304 and 324; and DeGrazia 1996). Potentiality can also explain differential treatment of two beings based on interests impacted, while maintaining the beings' equal moral status. For example, there is a stronger reason not to harm a baby as opposed to a cat, given the potential of the baby and not the cat for a cognitively sophisticated future (Harman 2003, p. 187, although this is not explicitly an equal consideration view). Even those who do not eschew the language of moral status can appeal to differences in the interests impacted to justify unequal treatment of moral equals. Admittedly, in some cases comparative judgments of whose interests are morally weightier, and hence judgments about differential treatment, can be difficult, in part due to the difficulties in knowing the capabilities of minds very different from ours and of comparing well-being across species (DeGrazia 1996).

In spite of allowing for differential treatment of morally equal beings, the above accounts remain unable to capture the commonsense view: they are unable to account for the differential treatment of both conscious humans with severe irreversible cognitive impairments and infants who will die due to disease before acquiring cognitive sophistication, as compared with many animals (such as a dog), since here the affected interests are similar. Thus, while one may grant that rudimentary capacities ground some moral status, one must look beyond such capacities to explain the difference in moral status between humans and most animals.

Also, despite the name “equal moral consideration,” these views seem to be incompatible with the equal wrongness thesis. Admittedly, the views are explicitly concerned with what should be done rather than with how to evaluate an action's degree of wrongness when one fails to do what one should. Nonetheless, in allowing or even requiring differential treatment based on differences in the interests impacted, such views seem to also imply that an action (such as killing) is more wrong if it impacts the victim's interests more severely, directly contradicting the equal wrongness thesis.

Notice that an even more rudimentary feature, which is not cognitive, would have to be considered if one were to accord any moral status to all living beings. For example, one can appeal to having a good or well-being of one's own that can be enhanced or damaged as a ground of moral status (Taylor 1986, p. 75, and Naess 1986, p. 14). If “interests” are understood broadly enough, then nonconscious entities, such as plants, species, and ecosystems have interests (e.g., an interest in fulfilling their nature) and thus some moral standing (Johnson 1993, pp. 146, 148, 184, 287). Of course, the challenge for such views is to explain how and why inevitable conflicts among all those with a well-being or interests should be settled. It is not enough to provide principles adjudicating these conflicts (as does Taylor 1986, p. 261); one must justify these principles in a way that is not grounded in the moral status of the beings under consideration (since their status is taken to be equal). For additional discussion and critique of these and other views, see the entry on environmental ethics.

4.4 Member of Cognitively Sophisticated Species

One way to avoid the key problems of the previous accounts is to posit membership in the human species as a sufficient condition for FMS. This is not the view that the human species itself has FMS, but rather that membership in the species gives an individual FMS. Feinberg (1980) discusses this view, whereas Dworkin (1993, ch. 3) actually posits it, although without distinguishing between this version and the modified version discussed below. Benn (1967, pp. 69–71) considers membership in the human species necessary and sufficient for FMS. Note that belonging to the human species is a relational feature (the relation of being a member of a kind), unlike the features invoked by the accounts considered thus far.

If there are non-human cognitively sophisticated individuals, such as higher animals or alien species, they would seem to deserve a high moral status equal to that of human beings. Thus, this account should not make human species membership a necessary condition for FMS, but rather be disjunctive: having sophisticated cognitive capacities or belonging to the human species is necessary and sufficient for FMS.

By introducing the latter condition (human species membership), such a view can establish FMS not only for infants and severely cognitively impaired human beings but even for fetuses and permanently unconscious human beings. Moreover, any non-human individual who lacks cognitively sophisticated capacities, which includes most (but not all) animals, lacks FMS. Thus this view accounts rather nicely for much of the commonsense view described in section 1. However, it is of no help grounding the claim that non-human animals, trees, species, or ecosystems have any moral status.

One possible cost of this approach is the loss of a unified account of FMS. That is, there are now two routes to FMS: having sophisticated cognitive capacities or belonging to the human species. Whether one is cognitively sophisticated is determined purely by psychology, while whether one belongs to the human species is determined purely by biology. Of course, it is true that the human species (as opposed to its membership criteria) is characterized both psychologically and biologically, and so in this sense the second route is related to the first route to FMS.

A second problem is an arbitrary distinction between severely cognitively impaired humans and members of other similarly cognitively sophisticated species, were they to exist, who have analogous severe cognitive impairments. Imagine, for example, a cognitively sophisticated biological species of “Martians,” which has some severely cognitively impaired members. Even if an impaired Martian and an impaired human have similarly limited cognitive capacities, and even though they bear the same metaphysical relation to members of their species (they are both tokens of a biological type whose unimpaired members are cognitively sophisticated), this account nevertheless treats them as having a different moral status. This is unacceptably arbitrary.

One could modify this account by substituting membership in a cognitively sophisticated species for membership in the human species as the second sufficient condition for FMS (Cohen 1986; possibly Scanlon 1998, pp.185–86; and Finnis 1995). This approach is often implicit rather than explicitly stated and defended. For example, Korsgaard (2004) regards infants and severely cognitive impaired human beings as rational agents – presumably in the sense of being members of the kind “rational agents” – and hence deserving of respect.

This version of the account is now more unified and avoids the above charge of arbitrariness, while retaining the alignment with the commonsense view. Both sufficient conditions of FMS now ultimately appeal to the value of cognitively sophisticated capacities, and cognitively impaired members of all cognitively sophisticated species have the same moral status. Moreover, most animals still lack FMS since neither they nor their species are cognitively sophisticated. Also, the account makes considerable inroads in explaining the equal status of those with FMS, since the main route to FMS it proposes, membership in a cognitively sophisticated species, is an all-or-nothing feature and not a matter of degree.

However, even this modified version has problems. First, whether one belongs to a given species depends on biological criteria, such as whom one can mate with, whom one is born of, or having the relevant DNA. But it is unclear why these biological criteria are relevant for moral status. The point can be sharpened this way. The human species, for example, is a morally relevant category because the species is characterized, in part, by morally relevant properties such as sophisticated intellectual and emotional capacities, and not merely by biological criteria (e.g., mating abilities). But it is unclear why a token member of a species, a token lacking any of these morally relevant capacities, should get the moral status from the type it belongs to (the species). If membership in the type does not require any of the morally relevant features, how can the membership be morally relevant? Consequently, this modified account has its own problem of arbitrariness (Feinberg 1980, p. 193; Sumner 1981, pp. 97–101; and McMahan 2002, pp. 212–214, 216). McMahan provides an especially interesting imaginary example involving cognitively enhanced Superchimps, which, on the account under consideration, generates counterintuitive consequences for the moral status of the unenhanced chimps. For example, if the Superchimps came to outnumber ordinary unenhanced chimps, the norm for the chimp species would have changed and for this reason alone the unenhanced chimps would have gained higher moral status. A related counterintuitive consequence, not mentioned by McMahan, is the following: if the Superchimps become their own species (via gene therapy and interbreeding), a cognitively impaired member of this newly created Superchimp species with the same cognitive capacities as a non-impaired ordinary chimp (assumed here not to be sufficiently cognitively sophisticated to have FMS) would have a very different moral status from the ordinary chimp. And yet the two chimps would be alike in every respect other than their species classification.

Notice also that, on this account, an anencephalic human baby (born without the higher brain) is a member of the human species and so would have FMS. But some might find this inclusion counterintuitive.

The possibly problematic inclusion of anencephalic infants does not seem to apply to the view underlying Little's (2008) claim that FMS is achieved late in pregnancy (pp. 332 and 348), when the fetus, which was a human organism, becomes a human being (pp. 339–341). She does not state what the criteria are for being a human being, but she may be partially following Quinn 1984 and conceiving of a human being as one who belongs to the human species and has the capacity to learn (see her page 340), where the latter feature would exclude the anencephalics. While on this view being a human being is not a merely biological matter, the view is still open to the problem of arbitrariness insofar as it holds that the morally irrelevant, merely biological feature of membership in the human species does make a difference to moral status.

One may think that the above objections can be overcome if the relevant criterion for FMS is not conceived of at all in terms of membership in a cognitively sophisticated biological species, but rather in terms of membership in a cognitively sophisticated kind. However, this approach faces a dilemma: either (a) a cognitively sophisticated kind does not include members who can never be cognitively sophisticated and thus leaves out many severely cognitively impaired human beings or (b) cognitive sophistication is not a requirement of membership in a cognitively sophisticated kind, but then this membership does not seem to require any morally relevant features, and its moral relevance becomes dubious.

4.5 Special Relationships

Some views attempt to ground strong reasons not to interfere, and perhaps also to aid and treat fairly, not only by appeal to sophisticated cognitive capacities but also by appeal to special relationships (these are therefore disjunctive accounts). On such accounts, specific agents must not interfere with an individual or must respect that individual's rights in virtue of being in a relationship with that individual. On one popular version, the relevant relationship is being a fellow member of a community, where the community is composed of all those of the same biological species (Nozick 1997 and possibly Scanlon 1998, p.185).

The motivation for this version of the Special Relationship account comes from thinking about the species relationship as analogous to other relationships (biological, social, etc.) that generate special duties and rights. For example, the relationship between a parent and his child creates an especially strong reason for the parent not to kill and to aid his child. Also, some people believe that even a gamete donor has special reason to aid the resulting child.

Other authors focus on non-species relationships not as a sufficient ground for moral status but as an enhancer of moral status. Suppose, for example, that having a well being, sentience, or consciousness (all of which both animals and humans have) is sufficient for some moral status (e.g., weak rights not to be harmed and to be aided). The status is full (e.g., the rights are at full strength) when, for example, the individual is in a specific relationship with a moral agent, where the relationship is that of co-belonging to a community. The community's membership requirements need not be strictly biological, but could be both biological and cognitive or merely social (for the former see Quinn's 1984 appeal to the capacity to learn, pp. 32–33 and 50–54, and for the latter see Warren 1997, pp. 164–166, 174, 176). Being someone's child is also a special relationship that some take to enhance moral status (Steinbock 1992, pp. 9, 13 and 69–70). This is not to be confused with claims that the biosocial relation of being someone's child is itself sufficient for FMS rather than merely an enhancer of moral status (Kittay 2005).

Anderson (2004) too discusses multiple sufficient grounds for rights to non-interference and aid, though perhaps not as strong as those associated with FMS: the interests of the being itself or the interests of other beings relating to it (pp. 281–3 and 285–6); being a member of human society, where this does not require being a human being (p. 284); and the capacity for reciprocal relations or mutual accommodation (pp. 287–9). The last sufficient condition is a Special Relationship type of view, though some of the other conditions might also be seen as such.

All of these Special Relationship accounts escape one drawback of the Member of a Cognitively Sophisticated Species account. The reason not to interfere (or aid, etc.) is not based on being a token of a type with morally irrelevant criteria for membership. Merely belonging to a species or other type of group is not the source of the reason not to interfere. Instead, by being a member of a species or another group, a token individual is thereby in a relationship with another token member of the group and this relationship is taken to be the source of the reason not to interfere. Also, typically, standing in a special relationship, such as a species relationship, is an all-or-nothing feature and not a matter of degree (for an exception, see Quinn 1984). If so, Special Relationship accounts can explain the equal status of those who have FMS on this basis.  

A central problem with these approaches is that they do not truly offer an account of moral status, but only of particular agents' reasons vis-à-vis the individual at issue. A being's moral status should give every moral agent, whether human or not, reasons to protect that being (see section 2.4). But on these accounts, by contrast, only those moral agents who are members of the same species, or are in some other special relationship with the being, have a reason, let us say, not to kill the being (McMahan 2005, p. 355). For example, a human being, in virtue of being in a special relationship (via species community) with a human infant, has a reason not to kill the infant, but a Martian, if there were one, would not have this reason, since he would lack this special relationship with the human infant. Similarly, a human being does not have a reason not to kill an ape infant, even if adult apes are cognitively sophisticated, because the two are not in a special species-based relationship. Reasons of this sort, constitutive of special obligations, are different in kind from, and contrasted with, reasons constitutive of moral status, which are impartial. Notice the contrast between two reasons a parent has not to kill his child: the reason constitutive of his parental obligation versus the impartial reason constitutive of the child's moral status.

Some Special Relationship accounts (Quinn's) do not take themselves to be offering an account of FMS but rather only to be capturing the key components of the notion (e.g., a strong right against others to not be killed). They leave behind both the term “moral status” and the concept of impartiality. Other special relationship accounts (Steinbock's and Kittay's) do use the term “moral status” leaving it unclear whether they think that special relationships could somehow generate impartial reasons.

Another concern with those Special Relationship accounts that attempt to ground rights and requirements analogous to those of FMS is that they are overinclusive (although see exceptions below). If the relevant relationship is with a being in one's social community then, depending on how this is interpreted, any animal incorporated into human social communities (e.g., dogs) would gain strong rights, contrary to the commonsense view. If the relevant relationship is instead with a being in one's species community, then all humans are in a special species relationship with an anencephalic human baby and so, according to such an account, owe it a high level of moral protection. But, as noted earlier, some would find this counterintuitive. A related problem emerges once we notice that humans might have more of a relationship with other “embodied minds” (i.e., any being with both a body and mind, such as an animal) than with human organisms that lack minds (such as an anencephalic baby). The Special Relationship approach would then be committed to claiming that animals have stronger rights than some cognitively impaired humans (McMahan 2002, pp. 225–226). But the account would not welcome these implications of its own approach and, if it did so, it would then suffer the problem of overinclusiveness with respect to animals.

Quinn's view (1984), although quite similar to the species community view, may not be overinclusive with respect to anencephalics or animals. Though Quinn does not consider this case, he would likely conclude that anencephalic infants are mere human organisms, not human beings (because they lack the capacity to learn), or are at most partially, rather than fully, existent human beings. Thus, they do not stand in a special relationship with other human beings in the way that unimpaired infants or cognitively impaired human beings with the capacity to learn do. Moreover, it is plausible to assume that we have more of a relationship with human beings in Quinn's sense, which are human embodied minds, than with non-human embodied minds, such as animals. Steinbock's view also would not be overinclusive with respect to anencephalics or animals, since the full strength of rights she discusses requires both consciousness and being someone's child.

Insofar as Special Relationship accounts intend to ground the notion of FMS, they will also suffer from another problem encountered earlier: they are not unified since they offer two unconnected routes to FMS (sophisticated cognitive capacities or special relationships).

4.6 Other Grounds

In addition to some of the features noted in section 4.3 (e.g., having interests, having a good, etc.), some philosophers have attempted to ground the moral status of an entity on features that do not connect with interests in any way. One such feature is not being designed by anyone to fulfill any purpose, which some philosophers hold as a ground for being treated as an end and not a mere means, and thus having at least some degree of moral status (Brennan 1984, pp. 44 and 56 and Katz 1997, pp. 129–131). Naturalness, that is, being unaltered by humans, has also been proposed as itself a ground of intrinsic value, and so as grounding at least some degree of moral status (Elliot 1997, p. 80). Perhaps harmony and beauty might be yet other features one could appeal to as grounds of the moral status of ecosystems (Leopold 1949 and Callicott 1980). These views do not discuss whether moral status comes in degrees and provide no guidance for how to adjudicate the numerous conflicts that would arise among entities with moral status. Insofar as these two issues are addressed by supplementing these views with one (or more) of the accounts discussed in sections 4.1–4.5, the views will inherit the problems of those accounts. For elaboration of these and other such views as they arise in environmental ethics, along with critiques, see the entry on environmental ethics.

5. Justifying the Grounds of Moral Status

The survey in section 4 of the various proposed grounds of moral status largely sidestepped the question of why the proposed grounds can play their purported role in grounding moral status. What is so special about these grounds that they can confer special status on their possessors? For most of the proposed grounds this issue is not addressed in the literature. However, this issue is addressed extensively by some views that take sophisticated cognitive capacities, especially the capacity for autonomy, to ground FMS, and also by some views that take rudimentary cognitive capacities, such as sentience, to ground some moral status. So these are the views we will briefly summarize here.

Authors working within the Kantian tradition have elaborated and defended various versions of the claim that autonomy, or the capacity to set ends according to reason, is unconditionally valuable and the ultimate condition of value of everything else (see the entry on autonomy in moral and political philosophy, sections 2 and 2.1). Numerous variants of the argument for this claim can be found in the literature, and the most prominent ones take the transcendental form (see the entry on transcendental arguments, section 5). On one version, in rationally choosing or valuing anything at all one must presuppose the supreme value of one's own rational capacities, and, by extension, the supreme value of rational capacities in general (Korsgaard 1996a and 1996b). On this picture, rational agents must recognize the supreme value of rational capacities as a condition of valuing anything else, and this recognition takes the form of affording FMS to beings with rational capacities. This argument has spawned numerous responses from both critics and proponents. For example, Regan (2002) accepts that rational nature has supreme value but extensively criticizes the Kantian interpretation of rational nature as inadequate for that role. For a response on the Kantians' behalf, see Sussman 2003.

On contractualist conceptions of morality, which see morality as originating – under conditions specified variously by different versions of the view – from a hypothetical reciprocal agreement among rational agents (see the entry on contractualism), it is easy to see why those with sufficient cognitive capacity to participate in the requisite agreement would have FMS, since they are the parties to whom the terms of the moral agreement apply. These views also work well to explain why the capacity to reciprocate morally, that is, the capacity to both demand moral status for oneself and to respect the moral status of others by assuming duties and responsibilities, would confer FMS on an individual, since this capacity goes hand-in-hand with the capacity to make reciprocal agreements.

More generally, on views that conceive of morality as at least partly originating from rational agents actively binding, obligating, or imposing authority on one another, it is easy to see why those with sufficient cognitive capacity to impose authority on others would have FMS that others are bound to respect. For example, Quinn (1984) speaks of a “picture of morality as a nexus of independent spheres of authority to permit, forbid, and require” (49) and, because he sees the capacity to will as sufficient for such authority, it is also sufficient for FMS.

Utilitarians and those sympathetic to utilitarian approaches often see the protection and promotion of interests, where this is understood to presuppose consciousness, as the central subject matter of morality (e.g., DeGrazia 1996, p. 39). On such views it is easy to see why the capacity to have interests is crucial to having any moral status at all. On some views, the capacity to experience pleasure or pain (sentience) is a prerequisite of having interests and this explains why sentience is a ground of moral status (Singer 1993, p. 57). Environmentalists, unlike Utilitarians, do not assume consciousness is a necessary condition for having interests and hence use the term in a broader fashion.  However, they do not explain why interests, broadly construed in this way, give rise to moral status.


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Other Internet Resources


Special thanks to Amy Kind and the reviewers for SEP for feedback, to Yvonne Tam and Monique Wonderly for research assistance, and to the John Templeton Foundation and the Brocher Foundation for financial support.

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Julie Tannenbaum <>

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