Foreknowledge and Free Will

First published Tue Jul 6, 2004; substantive revision Thu Aug 25, 2011

Fatalism is the thesis that human acts occur by necessity and hence are unfree. Theological fatalism is the thesis that infallible foreknowledge of a human act makes the act necessary and hence unfree. If there is a being who knows the entire future infallibly, then no human act is free.

Fatalism seems to be entailed by infallible foreknowledge by the following informal line of reasoning:

For any future act you will perform, if some being infallibly believed in the past that the act would occur, there is nothing you can do now about the fact that he believed what he believed since nobody has any control over past events; nor can you make him mistaken in his belief, given that he is infallible. Therefore, there is nothing you can do now about the fact that he believed in a way that cannot be mistaken that you would do what you will do. But if so, you cannot do otherwise than what he believed you would do. And if you cannot do otherwise, you will not perform the act freely.

The same argument can be applied to any infallibly foreknown act of any human being. If there is a being who infallibly knows everything that will happen in the future, no human being has any control over the future.

The theological fatalist argument just given creates a dilemma because many people have thought it important to maintain both (1) there is a deity who infallibly knows the entire future, and (2) human beings have free will in the strong sense usually called libertarian. But the theological fatalist argument seems to show that (1) and (2) are incompatible; the only way consistently to accept (2) is to deny (1). Those philosophers who think there is a way to consistently maintain both (1) and (2) are called compatibilists about infallible foreknowledge and human free will. Compatibilists must either identify a false premise in the argument for theological fatalism or show that the conclusion does not follow from the premises. Incompatibilists accept the incompatibility of infallible foreknowledge and human free will and deny either infallible foreknowledge or free will in the sense targeted by the argument.

1. The argument for theological fatalism

There is a long history of debate over the soundness of the argument for theological fatalism, so its soundness must not be obvious and the argument cannot be evaluated without giving it a more precise formulation. To do so, choose some proposition about a future act that you think you will do freely, if any act is free. Suppose, for example, that the telephone will ring at 9 am tomorrow and you will either answer it or you will not. So it is either true that you will answer the phone at 9 am tomorrow or it is true that you will not answer the phone at 9 am tomorrow. The Law of Excluded Middle rules out any other alternative. Let T abbreviate the proposition that you will answer the phone tomorrow at 9, and let us suppose that T is true. (If not-T is true instead, simply substitute not-T in the argument below).

Let “now-necessary” designate temporal necessity, the type of necessity that the past is supposed to have just because it is past. We will discuss this type of necessity in sections 2.3 and 2.6, but we can begin with the intuitive idea that there is a kind of necessity that a proposition has now when the content of the proposition is about something that occurred in the past. To say that it is now-necessary that milk has been spilled is to say nobody can do anything now about the fact that the milk has been spilled.

Let “God” designate a being who has infallible beliefs about the future, where to say that God believes p infallibly is to say that God believes p and it is not possible that God believes p and p is false. It is not important for the logic of the argument that God is the being worshiped by any particular religion, but the motive to maintain that there is a being with infallible beliefs is usually a religious one.

One more preliminary point is in order. The dilemma of infallible foreknowledge and human free will does not rest on the particular assumption of foreknowledge and does not require an analysis of knowledge. Most contemporary accounts of knowledge are fallibilist, which means they do not require that a person believe in a way that cannot be mistaken in order to have knowledge. She has knowledge just in case what she believes is true and she satisfies the other conditions for knowledge, such as having sufficiently strong evidence. Ordinary knowledge does not require that the belief cannot be false. For example, if I believe on strong evidence that classes begin at my university on a certain date, and when the day arrives, classes do begin, we would normally say I knew in advance that classes would begin on that date. I had foreknowledge about the date classes begin. But there is nothing problematic about that kind of foreknowledge because events could have proven me wrong even though as events actually turned out, they didn't prove me wrong. Ordinary foreknowledge does not threaten to necessitate the future because it does not require that when I know p it is not possible that my belief is false. The key problem, then, is the infallibility of the belief about the future, and this is a problem whether or not the epistemic agent with an infallible belief satisfies the other conditions required by some account of knowledge, such as sufficient evidence. As long as an agent has an infallible belief about the future, the problem arises.

Using the example of the proposition T, the argument that infallible foreknowledge of T entails that you do not answer the telephone freely can be formulated as follows:

Basic Argument for Theological Fatalism

Yesterday God infallibly believed T. [Supposition of infallible foreknowledge]
If E occurred in the past, it is now-necessary that E occurred then. [Principle of the Necessity of the Past]
It is now-necessary that yesterday God believed T. [1, 2]
Necessarily, if yesterday God believed T, then T. [Definition of “infallibility”]
If p is now-necessary, and necessarily (pq), then q is now-necessary. [Transfer of Necessity Principle]
So it is now-necessary that T. [3,4,5]
If it is now-necessary that T, then you cannot do otherwise than answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am. [Definition of “necessary”]
Therefore, you cannot do otherwise than answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am. [6, 7]
If you cannot do otherwise when you do an act, you do not act freely. [Principle of Alternate Possibilities]
Therefore, when you answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am, you will not do it freely. [8, 9]

This argument is formulated in a way that makes its logical form as perspicuous as possible, and there is a consensus that this argument or something close to it is valid. That is, if the premises are all true, the conclusion follows. The compatibilist about infallible foreknowledge and free will must therefore find a false premise. There are four premises that are not straightforward substitutions in definitions: (1), (2), (5), and (9). Premises (1) and (2) have been attacked in influential ways in the history of discussion of theological fatalism. Boethius and Aquinas denied premise (1) on the grounds that God and his beliefs are not in time, a solution that has always had some adherents. William of Ockham denied premise (2) on the grounds that the necessity of the past does not apply to the entire past, and God's past beliefs are in the part of the past to which the necessity of the past does not apply. This solution also has some contemporary adherents. Premise (9) has been attacked by a few contemporary philosophers who argue that the denial of (9) is consistent with maintaining that human beings have libertarian free will, the kind of free will that is incompatible with causal determinism. It has been proposed that Augustine had a form of this solution (Hunt 1999), although it was not attributed to him historically. The denial of (9) is mostly due to contemporary discussions of the relation between free will and the ability to do otherwise. Premise (5) has rarely been disputed, although it might have been denied by Luis de Molina (Freddoso 1988, 57–58), and it has been denied in some of the recent literature. Finally, we will consider the possibility that premise (2) can be rejected in a more radical way than the Ockhamist position. In addition to the foregoing compatibilist solutions, there are two incompatibilist responses to the problem of theological fatalism. One is to deny that God (or any being) has infallible foreknowledge. The other is to deny that human beings have free will in the libertarian sense of free will. These responses will be discussed in section 3. The relationship between theological fatalism and two other historically important forms of fatalism—logical fatalism and causal fatalism, will be discussed in section 4. In section 5 we will look at the problem of fatalism as a special case of a more general problem in the metaphysics of time that has nothing to do with free will.

2. Compatibilist responses to theological fatalism

2.1 The Aristotelian solution

One response to the dilemma of infallible foreknowledge and free will is to deny that the proposition T has a truth value, nor does any proposition about the contingent future or its negation have a truth value. This response rejects the terms in which the problem is set up. The idea behind this response is usually that propositions about the contingent future become true when and only when the event occurs that the proposition is about. If the event does not occur at that time, then the proposition becomes false. This seems to have been the position of Aristotle in the famous Sea Battle argument of De Interpretatione IX, where Aristotle is concerned with the implications of the truth of a proposition about the future, not the problem of infallible knowledge of the future. But some philosophers have used Aristotle's move to solve the dilemma we are addressing here. In the recent literature this position has been defended by J.R. Lucas (1989), Richard Purtill (1988), and Joseph Runzo (1981). More recently D.K. Johnson (2009) has taken up this solution to both logical and theological fatalism, arguing that we ought to accept presentism, the position that only the present exists.

This solution collapses truth into necessity and falsehood into impossibility, at least for propositions about the future. That may be sufficient to make it implausible to some logicians, but it is not clear that this move avoids the problem of theological fatalism anyway. According to the definition of infallibility used in the basic argument, if God is infallible in all his beliefs, then it is not possible that God believes T and T is false. But there is a natural extension of the definition of infallibility to allow for the case in which T lacks a truth value but will acquire one in the future: If God is infallible in all his beliefs, then it is not possible that God believes T and T is either false or becomes false. If so, and if God believes T, we get an argument for theological fatalism that parallels our basic argument. Premise (4) would need to be modified as follows:

Necessarily, if yesterday God believed T, then T will become true.

(6) becomes:

It is now-necessary that T will become true.

The modifications in the rest of the argument are straightforward.

It is open to the defender of this solution to maintain that God has no beliefs about the contingent future because he does not infallibly know how it will turn out, and this is compatible with God's being infallible in everything he does believe. It is also compatible with God's omniscience if omniscience is the property of knowing the truth value of every proposition that has a truth value. But clearly, this move restricts the range of God's knowledge, so it has religious disadvantages in addition to its disadvantages in logic.

2.2 The Boethian solution

This solution denies the first premise of the basic argument: (1) Yesterday God infallibly believed T. What is denied according to this solution is not that God believes infallibly, and not that God believes the content of proposition T, but that God believed T yesterday. This solution probably originated with the 6th century philosopher Boethius, who maintained that God is not in time and has no temporal properties, so God does not have beliefs at a time. It is therefore a mistake to say God had beliefs yesterday, or has beliefs today, or will have beliefs tomorrow. It is also a mistake to say God had a belief on a certain date, such as June 1, 2004. The way Boethius describes God's cognitive grasp of temporal reality, all temporal events are before the mind of God at once. To say “at once” or “simultaneously” is to use a temporal metaphor, but Boethius is clear that it does not make sense to think of the whole of temporal reality as being before God's mind in a single temporal present. It is an atemporal present, a single complete grasp of all events in the entire span of time.

Aquinas adopted the Boethian solution as one of his ways out of theological fatalism, using some of the same metaphors as Boethius. One is the circle analogy, in which the way a timeless God is present to each and every moment of time is compared to the way in which the center of a circle is present to each and every point on its circumference (SCG I, 66). In contemporary philosophy probably the most well-known defenders of the idea that God is timeless are Eleonore Stump and Norman Kretzmann (1981), who apply it explicitly to the foreknowledge dilemma (1991). Recently it has been defended by Kevin Timpe (2007) and Michael Rota (2010).

Most objections to the timelessness solution to the dilemma of foreknowledge and freedom focus on the idea of timelessness itself, arguing either that it does not make sense or that it is incompatible with other properties of God that are religiously more compelling, such as personhood (e.g., Pike 1970, 121–129; Wolterstorff 1975; Swinburne 1977, 221). Zagzebski has argued (1991, chap. 2 and 2011) that the timelessness move does not avoid the problem of theological fatalism since an argument structurally parallel to the basic argument can be formulated for timeless knowledge. If God is not in time, the key issue would not be the necessity of the past, but the necessity of the timeless realm. So the first three steps of the argument would be reformulated as follows:

God timelessly knows T.
If E is in the timeless realm, then it is now-necessary that E.
It is now-necessary that T.

Perhaps it is inappropriate to say that timeless events such as God's timeless knowing are now-necessary, yet we have no more reason to think we can do anything about God's timeless knowing than about God's past knowing. The timeless realm is as much out of our reach as the past. So the point of (3t) is that we cannot now do anything about the fact that God timelessly knows T. The rest of the steps in the timeless dilemma argument are parallel to the basic argument. Step (5t) says that if there is nothing we can do about a timeless state, there is nothing we can do about what such a state entails. It follows that we cannot do anything about the future. K.A. Rogers (2007) argues that Anselm's version of the timelessness solution makes all of time like the present, so if the timeless realm necessitates human acts, so does the present. Since knowledge of the present does not conflict with free choice, neither does Anselmian timeless knowledge.

The Boethian solution does not solve the problem of theological fatalism by itself, but since the nature of the timeless realm is elusive, the intuition of the necessity of the timeless realm is probably weaker than the intuition of the necessity of the past. The necessity of the past has the advantage of being deeply imbedded in our ordinary intuitions about time; there are no ordinary intuitions about the realm of timelessness. Perhaps, then, the view that God is timeless puts the theological fatalist on the defensive.

2.3 The Ockhamist solution

The next solution is due to the thirteenth century philosopher William of Ockham, and was revived in the contemporary literature by Marilyn Adams (1967).

This solution rejects premise (2) of the basic argument in its full generality. Following Ockham, Adams argues that premise (2) applies only to the past strictly speaking, or the “hard” past. A “soft” fact about the past is one that is in part about the future. An example of a soft fact about the past would be the fact that it was true yesterday that a certain event would occur a year later. Adams argues that God's existence in the past and God's past beliefs about the future are not strictly past because they are facts that are in part about the future.

Adams's argument was unsuccessful since, among other things, her criterion for being a hard fact had the consequence that no fact is a hard fact (Fischer 1989, introduction), but it led to a series of attempts to bolster it by giving more refined definitions of a “hard fact” and the type of necessity such facts are said to have—what Ockham called “accidental necessity” (necessity per accidens). One of the best-known Ockhamist proposals after Adams was made by Alvin Plantinga (1986), who defined the accidentally necessary in terms of lack of counterfactual power. For someone, Jones, to have counterfactual power over God's past beliefs, the following must be true:

It was within Jones' power at t2 to so something such that if he did it, God would not have held the belief he in fact held at t1.

Plantinga argued that counterfactual power over God's past beliefs about human free choices is coherent and if it occurs, these beliefs are not accidentally necessary; they do not have the kind of necessity the past is alleged to have in premise (2) of the basic argument.

Notice that counterfactual power over the past is not the same thing as changing the past, nor is it the same thing as causing or bringing about the past. Changing the past is incoherent since it amounts to there being one past prior to t2 in which God has a certain belief at t1, and then Jones does something to make a different past. That requires two pasts prior to t2, and that presumably makes no sense. What (CPP) affirms instead is that there is only one actual past, but there would have been a different past if Jones acted differently at t2. (CPP) also does not require the assumption that what Jones does at t2 causes God to have the belief he has at t1. There is much debate about the way to analyze the causal relation, but it is generally thought that causation does not reduce to a counterfactual dependency of an effect on its cause. (CPP) is weaker than the claim that Jones' act at t2 causes God's belief at t1.

There was considerable debate over Ockhamism in the eighties and nineties. Some of the defenses appear in Freddoso (1983), Kvanvig (1986), Zemach and Widerker (1987), Wierenga (1989), and Craig (1990). Some of the criticisms appear in Fischer (1983b, 1985b), Hasker (1989), Zagzebski (1991), Pike (1993), and Brant (1997).

Recently Finch and Rea (2008) have argued that the Ockhamist solution requires the rejection of presentism.

It seems to me that it is very difficult to give an account of the necessity of the past that preserves the intuition that the past has a special kind of necessity in virtue of being past, but which has the consequence that God's past beliefs do not have that kind of necessity. The problem is that God's past beliefs seem to be as good a candidate for something that is strictly past as almost anything we can think of, such as an explosion last week. If we have counterfactual power over God's past beliefs, but not the past explosion, that must be because of something special about God's past beliefs that is intuitively plausible apart from the attempt to avoid theological fatalism. If it is not independently plausible, it is hard to avoid the conclusion that the Ockhamist solution is ad hoc.

2.4 The Molinist solution

The doctrine of Middle Knowledge was vehemently debated in the 16th century, with the version of Luis de Molina getting the most attention in the contemporary literature. Recently the doctrine has received strong support by Thomas Flint (1998) and Eef Dekker (2000). Unlike the other compatibilist solutions we are considering, which aim only at showing that infallible foreknowledge and human freedom are compatible, Molinism provides an account of how God knows the contingent future, along with a strong doctrine of divine providence. Middle knowledge is called “middle” because it is said to stand between God's knowledge of necessary truths and his knowledge of his own creative will. The objects of Middle Knowledge are so-called counterfactuals of freedom:

If person S were in circumstances C, S would freely do X.

Middle knowledge requires that there are true counterfactuals of this form corresponding to every possible free creature and every possible circumstance in which that creature can act freely. These propositions are intended to be contingent (a claim that has been disputed by some objectors), but they are prior to God's creative will. God uses them in deciding what to create. By combining his Middle Knowledge with what he decides to create, God knows the entire history of the world.

There are a number of objections to Middle Knowledge in the contemporary literature. Robert Adams (1991) argues that Molinism is committed to the position that the truth of a counterfactual of freedom is explanatorily prior to God's decision to create us. But the truth of a counterfactual to the effect that if I were in circumstance C I would do A is strictly inconsistent with my refraining from A in C, and so my refraining from A in C is precluded by something prior in the order of explanation to my act in C. And that is inconsistent with my acting freely in C.

There are a number of other objections to Middle Knowledge in the literature, as well as replies by its defenders. William Hasker (1989, 1995, 1997, 2000) has offered a series of objections and replies to William Craig, who defends Middle Knowledge (1994, 1998). Other objections have been proposed by Walls (1990) and Gaskin (1993). Recent critical discussions of Molinism appear in Fischer (2008), Guleserian (2008), and False (2010).

Let us assume that the doctrine of Middle Knowledge is defensible. How does that avoid the conclusion of the argument for theological fatalism? Middle Knowledge does not entail the falsehood of any premise of the basic argument. Flint (1998) rejects some of the steps of the fatalist argument in addition to defending Middle Knowledge, which suggests that even though the theory of Middle Knowledge is a powerful theory of divine knowledge and providence, it is neither necessary nor sufficient to avoid theological fatalism by itself.

2.5 The Frankfurtian/Augustinian solution

Let us now look at premise (9). This is a form of the Principle of Alternate Possibilities (PAP), a principle that has become well-known in the literature on free will ever since it was attacked by Harry Frankfurt (1969) in some interesting thought experiments. The point of Frankfurt's paper was to drive a wedge between responsibility and alternate possibilities, and to thereby drive a wedge between responsibility and libertarian freedom. In general, those defending libertarian freedom also defend PAP, and those attacking PAP, like Frankfurt, defend determinism, but some philosophers have argued that PAP is false even if we have libertarian free will. Such arguments have been given by Zagzebski (1991) and Hunt (1999). Hunt (1996b, 1999) argues that the rejection of PAP from the perspective of a defender of libertarian freedom can be found in Augustine, but even if that is true, it is not a position historically associated with Augustine. The literature that clearly distinguishes the claim that free will requires alternate possibilities from the claim that free will requires the falsehood of determinism is contemporary. The former is a thesis about events in counterfactual circumstances, whereas the latter is a thesis about the locus of causal control in the actual circumstances. Aside from the foreknowledge literature, support for the rejection of PAP from the perspective of an incompatibilist about free will and determinism can be found in Stump (1990, 1996), Zagzebski (2000), and Pereboom (2000). This view was originally called hyper-incompatibilism by John Martin Fischer, but has recently been called source incompatibilism. For a recent critique of this version of incompatibilism for solving the foreknowledge problem, see Werther (2005).

Here is an example of a typical Frankfurt case intended to show that an agent can act freely even when she lacks alternate possibilities:

Black, an evil neurosurgeon, wishes to see White dead but is unwilling to do the deed himself. Knowing that Mary Jones also despises White and will have a single good opportunity to kill him, Black inserts a mechanism into Jones's brain that enables Black to monitor and to control Jones's neurological activity. If the activity in Jones's brain suggests that she is on the verge of deciding not to kill White when the opportunity arises, Black's mechanism will intervene and cause Jones to decide to commit the murder. On the other hand, if Jones decides to murder White on her own, the mechanism will not intervene. It will merely monitor but will not affect her neurological function. Now suppose that when the occasion arises, Jones decides to kill White without any “help” from Black's mechanism. In the judgment of Frankfurt and most others, Jones is morally responsible for her act. Nonetheless, it appears that she is unable to do otherwise since if she had attempted to do so, she would have been thwarted by Black's device. (Adapted from an example by John Fischer, 1982).

Most commentators on examples like this agree that the agent is both morally responsible for her act and acts freely in whatever sense of freedom they endorse. They differ on whether she can do otherwise at the time of her act. Determinists generally interpret the case as one in which she exercises compatibilist free will and has no alternate possibilities. Most libertarians interpret it as one in which she exercises libertarian free will and has alternate possibilities, contrary to appearances. As mentioned above, some philosophers have interpreted it as a case in which she exercises libertarian free will but does not have alternate possibilities. If Frankfurt cases can be successfully interpreted in this third way, then they can be used to show the compatibility of infallible foreknowledge and libertarian freedom.

But there is another way Frankfurt cases can be used to argue for the compatibility of foreknowledge and freedom. There is an important disanalogy between a Frankfurt case and infallible foreknowledge that supports the intuition that an agent retains alternate possibilities even when her act is infallibly foreknown. A crucial component of the standard Frankfurt case is that the agent is prevented from acting freely in close possible worlds. That aspect of the case is not in dispute. Black's device is counterfactually manipulative even if it is not actually manipulative. In contrast, infallible foreknowledge is not even counterfactually manipulative. There is no close possible world in which foreknowledge prevents the agent from acting freely. Of course, if theological fatalism is true, nobody ever acts freely, but the point is that there is no manipulation going on in other possible worlds in the foreknowledge scenario. The relation between foreknowledge and human acts is no different in one world than in any other. But it is precisely the fact that the relation between the Frankfurt machine and Mary's act differs in the actual world than in other close worlds that is supposed to make the Frankfurt example work in showing the falsity of PAP.

To make this point clear, let us look at how the standard Frankfurt case would have to be amended to make it a close analogy to the situation of infallible foreknowledge. As Zagzebski has argued (1991, chap. 6, sec. 2.1), the device implanted in Mary's brain would have to be set in such a way that no matter what Mary did, it never intervened. It is not even true that it might have intervened. Any world in which Mary decides to commit the murder is a world in which the device is set to make her commit the murder should she not decide to do it, and any world in which she does not decide to commit the murder is a world in which the device is set to prevent her from deciding to do it if she is about to decide to do it. Now of course this might be an impossible device, but it would have to be as described to be a close analogy to the foreknowledge scenario. And our reactions to this amended Frankfurt case are very different from typical reactions to the standard Frankfurt case. In the standard case it at least appears to be true that the agent cannot do otherwise, whereas in the case amended to be parallel to the foreknowledge case there is a very straightforward sense in which the agent can do otherwise because her will is not thwarted by Black in any reasonably close possible world. The machine is ready to manipulate her, but it does not manipulate her, nor might it have manipulated her since it does not even manipulate her in counterfactual circumstances. We might think of the machine as a metaphysical accident—an extraneous addition to the story that plays no part in the sequence of events in any possible world. Possibly it is not clear in the amended story whether or not Mary has alternate possibilities. What the story shows, then, is that alternate possibilities are not always relevant to the possession of libertarian freedom.

2.6 The denial of the necessity of the past and the denial of the transfer of necessity principle

A crucial premise of the basic argument for theological fatalism is premise (2), the principle of the necessity of the past. We have already discussed the Ockhamist response to this premise, which accepts (2) as applied to what is strictly past, but rejects it as applied to that part of the past that is not wholly or strictly past. It is worth asking, however, whether there is any such thing as the necessity of the past at all. What do we mean when we say that the past, the strict past, is necessary? When people say “There is no use crying over spilled milk,” they presumably mean that there is nothing anybody can do now about the spilled milk; the spilling of the milk is outside the realm of our causal control. But it is not at all clear that pastness per se puts something outside the realm of our causal control. Rather, it is pastness in conjunction with the metaphysical law that causes must precede their effects. If we decided that effects can precede their causes, we would no longer speak of the necessity of the past.

So the necessity of the past is the principle that past events are outside the class of causable events. There is a temporal asymmetry in causability because everything causable is in the future. But some of the future is non-causable as well. Whether or not determinism is true, there are some events in the future that are causally necessary. If a future event E is necessary, it is causable, and not E is not causable. If the necessity of the past is the non-causability of the past, it seems a bit odd to pick out the class of propositions about the past as having an allegedly distinct kind of necessity since some of the future has that same kind of necessity.

This reveals a deeper problem in the idea of the necessity of the past. The modes of causable and not causable do not correspond to the standard modes of necessary, possible, impossible, and contingent. The actual past is not causable, but alternative pasts are not causable either. If it is too late to make something have happened, it is too late to make something else have happened instead. So if a proposition p about the past is not causable, not-p is also not causable. This is a disanalogy with the logical modalities since if p is necessary, not-p is the contrary of necessary; it is impossible. Another disanalogy between necessity and non-causability is that if p is necessary, p is possible, but if p is not causable, there is no category parallel to the possible that applies to p. The realm of standard modality is divided into the possible and the impossible. The necessary is a subset of the possible and the contingent is the possible that is not necessary. The modes divide events into the causable and the non-causable. There is a set of propositions p which are such that p is not causable and not-p is not causable. There is a set of propositions p which are such that p is causable and not-p is not causable. There may also be a set of propositions p which are such that p is causable and not-p is causable. Whether there are any propositions in the third category is part of what is at issue in discussions of fatalism. But these three categories show that the logical categories of causability and non-causability do not correspond to the standard modal categories of the necessary, possible, and impossible. The attempt to assimilate the causal categories to modal categories is a mistake.

If we give up the so-called necessity of the past and replace it with the non-causability of the past, then premise (2) should be replaced by:

If E is an event in the past, E is not now causable.

Premise (5) becomes:

If p is not now causable and necessarily (pq), then q is not now causable.

Principle (5a) is false. One obvious reason is that a logically impossible proposition entails every proposition. (5a) needs to be amended as:

If p is not causable, necessarily (pq), and p is not logically impossible, then q is not causable.

But premise (5b) is also false because the truth of q may be a logically necessary condition for the truth of p, where p is not causable but q is causable. For example, p might be the proposition that I build a 200 story building by myself, a proposition that is causally but not logically impossible. The proposition that I build a 200 story building by myself entails that I build a building. The proposition that I build a building (a small one, with help) is causable.

The foreknowledge/free will incompatibilist must therefore find a principle in place of (5b) that is true and that permits the inference to the non-causability of the future. While there may not be any principle that is very close in structure to premise (5) of the basic argument, there is such a principle in the literature on free will and determinism, proposed by Peter van Inwagen (1983) that can be used by the foreknowledge/free will incompatibilist. That principle, called rule Beta, is discussed in section 4 below.

3. Incompatibilist responses to the argument for theological fatalism

Ever since the dilemma of this article was identified, there have been philosophers who thought that something like our basic argument succeeds in demonstrating that infallible foreknowledge is incompatible with human free will. If they are incompatible, one of them must be given up. One might give up both, of course, but the dilemma has attracted so much attention in the history of philosophy because both the belief in a being with infallible foreknowledge and belief in the existence of libertarian free will are strongly entrenched in the world view of many philosophers. To give up one of these beliefs is difficult and often has many ramifications for one's other beliefs.

The denial of libertarian freedom has always had many supporters. The idea of making causal determinism the focal point of discussions of free will is modern in origin, and some philosophers think that the modern framing of the issue is confused. Philosophers who deny libertarian freedom may affirm a type of free will compatible with determinism, or they may instead simply accept the consequence that human beings lack free will.

The other incompatibilist position is to affirm libertarian free will along with the principle of alternate possibilities (premise 9), and to deny the possibility of infallible foreknowledge. This position has recently become well-known in the view that has come to be called “open theism.” (Pinnock et al. 1994). These theorists reject divine timelessness and immutability, along with infallible foreknowledge, arguing that not only should foreknowledge be rejected because of its fatalist consequences, the view of a God who takes risks is more faithful to Scripture than the classical notion of an essentially omniscient and foreknowing deity. See Rhoda et al (2006) for an argument that the key issue in the open theism debate is the nature of the future. For a recent review of the arguments for open theism, see Tuggy (2007).

One influential argument that open theists use against defenders of foreknowledge who do not also accept Molinism is that foreknowledge without middle knowledge is useless for divine providence. In a number of papers, David Hunt has defended the providential utility of foreknowledge without middle knowledge. See Robinson (2004a) for a challenge to Hunt's defense of the providential usefulness of simple foreknowledge, Hunt's rebuttal (2004), and Robinson's rejoinder (2004b), all in the same journal. A related objection to foreknowledge without middle knowledge is that prophecy requires middle knowledge. See Pruss (2007) for a defense of a foreknowledge-only account of prophecy. Another issue related to divine providence is the efficacy of past-directed prayers. Kevin Timpe (2005) argues that adherents of simple foreknowledge or timeless knowledge and Molinists have the resources to explain the efficacy of prayers about the past, but open theism does not.

4. Theological fatalism and other forms of fatalism

A form of fatalism that is even older than theological fatalism is logical fatalism, the thesis that the past truth of a proposition about the future entails fatalism. Aristotle discusses this form of fatalism in his famous Sea Battle Argument, mentioned in section 2.1 above. A clearer and more sophisticated form of the argument was proposed by Diodorus Cronus, whose argument is remarkably similar in form to our basic argument for theological fatalism. The logical fatalist argument parallel to our basic argument is as follows:

Argument for logical fatalism

Let S = the proposition that there will be a sea battle tomorrow.
Yesterday it was true that S. [assumption]
If some proposition was true in the past, it is now-necessary that it was true then. [Form of the Necessity of the Past]
That yesterday it was true that S is now-necessary. [1, 2]
Necessarily, if yesterday it was true that S, then now it is true that S. [omnitemporality of truth]
If p is now-necessary, and necessarily (if p then q), then q is now-necessary. [Transfer of Necessity Principle]
Therefore, that it is true that S is now-necessary. [3L, 4L, 5L]
If its being true that S is now-necessary, no alternative to the truth of S is now-possible. [definition of “necessary”]
So no alternative to the truth of S is now-possible [6L, 7L]
If no alternative to the truth of a proposition about the future is now-possible, then what the proposition is about will not be brought about by free human choice. [Version of Principle of Alternate Possibilities]
Hence, the sea battle tomorrow will not be brought about by free human choice. [8L, 9L]

Unlike the argument for theological fatalism, the argument for logical fatalism has few defenders. One reason is that (2L) is less plausible than (2). But recently Warfield (1997) has argued for the equivalence of the two forms of fatalism if God is necessarily existent and essentially omniscient. Responses have been given by Hasker (1998) and Brueckner (2000), and there is a rejoinder to both by Warfield (2000). Peter Graham (2008) argues that Warfield's argument is question-begging because the consensus to which Warfield appeals emerged against the backdrop of an assumption that there is no necessarily existent being

A well known argument that causal determinism leads to fatalism has a similar form. Let H = a complete description of the world at some time in the distant past. A = some future human act. L = a statement of the causal laws

Argument for causal fatalism

H and L
It is now necessary that H and L [the necessity of the past and the necessity of causal laws]
It is now necessary that [(H & L) → A] [thesis of causal determinism]
If it is now necessary that p and it is now necessary that (pq), it is now necessary that q. [transfer of necessity principle]
It is now necessary that A. [2,3,4]
If it is now necessary that A, then A will be not be done freely.

Problems with the principle used in (4c) have been noted above, but a related argument using a different principle in place of (4c) originated with Peter van Inwagen (1983), who uses the argument to show the incompatibility of causal determinism and free will. Van Inwagen proposes a rule of inference that uses an operator “N” that is to be read as follows: Np = p and nobody has or ever had any choice about whether p. Van Inwagen calls his principle “Beta”:

Np & N (pq) /- Nq

The argument goes as follows:

H and L [assumption]
N (H & L) [version of the necessity of the past and causal laws]
N [(H & L) → A] [thesis of causal determinism]
N A [2,3, rule Beta]

Principle Beta has been disputed in the literature on free will and determinism, and there are many suggested counterexamples and emendations to the principle. For example, Timothy O'Connor (2000) has defended the following qualified principle:

Np & N (pq) & q is made true later in time than p /- Nq.

BETA2 is harder to refute than BETA and also can be used to support the incompatibility of infallible foreknowledge and free will. The reader should refer to the literature on Beta and related transfer principles for evaluation of the rejection of these principles as a way out of the various forms of fatalism.

5. Beyond fatalism

Zagzebski has argued that the dilemma of theological fatalism is broader than a problem about free will. The modal or causal asymmetry of time, a transfer of necessity principle, and the supposition of infallible foreknowledge are mutually inconsistent. (1991, appendix). If there is a distinct kind of necessity that the past has qua past, and which is not an implicit reference to the lack of causability of the past, then it is temporally asymmetrical. The past has it and the future does not. The necessity of the past and the contingency of the future are two sides of the same coin. To say that the future is contingent in the sense of temporal modality does not imply that we have causal control over the entire future, of course. We lack control over part of the future because part (or even all) of it is causally necessary. But if the necessity of the past is distinct from the lack of causability, and is a type of necessity the past has just because it is past, the future must lack that particular kind of necessity.

The idea that there is temporally asymmetrical modality is inconsistent with the transfer of necessity principle and the supposition of infallible foreknowledge of an essentially omniscient deity. The inconsistency can be demonstrated as follows:

Dilemma of Foreknowledge and Modal Temporal Asymmetry

Again, let T = the proposition that you will answer the telephone tomorrow at 9 am.
There is (and was before now) an essentially omniscient foreknower (EOF) [Assumption for dilemma]

(1f) and the Principle of the Necessity of the Past tells us that

Either it is now-necessary that the EOF believed T before now or it is now-necessary that the EOF believed not T before now.

From (1f) and the definition of an EOF it follows that

Necessarily (The EOF believed before now that TT), and necessarily (The EOF believed before now that not T → not T) .

By the Transfer of Necessity Principle (TNP), (2f) and (3f) entail

Either it is now-necessary that T or it is now-necessary that not T.

(4f) is logically equivalent to

Either it is not now-possible that T or it is not now-possible that not T.

From the Principle of the Contingency of the Future we get

It is now-possible that T and it is now-possible that not T.

But (6f) contradicts (5f).

The inconsistency shown in this argument has nothing to do with free will or fatalism. But the problem is even more general than this argument illustrates. The reason essential omniscience conflicts with temporal modality and the transfer principle is that the existence of an EOF requires that a proposition about the past entails a proposition about the future. But it straightforwardly follows from TNP that a proposition that is now-necessary cannot entail a proposition that is not now-necessary. So if the past is now-necessary and the future is not, a proposition about the past cannot entail a proposition about the future. The conclusion is that if asymmetrical temporal modality is coherent, it can obey TNP, or it can permit a proposition about the past to entail a proposition about the future, but not both.

The root of the problem, then, is that it is impossible for there to be a type of modality that has the following features:

The past and future are asymmetrical in that the past qua past is necessary with respect to this type of modality, whereas the future qua future is contingent with respect to this type of modality.
There are propositions about the past that entail propositions about the future.
TNP obtains.

So the problem of the alleged incompatibility of infallible foreknowledge and free will is a special case of a more general problem that has nothing to do with either foreknowledge or free will. Temporally asymmetrical necessity and the transfer of necessity principle threaten a host of metaphysical theses that require that a proposition about the past entails a proposition about the future (e.g., Matter is indestructible). This is not an issue that can be evaded by denying the religious doctrine of divine foreknowledge.

It was suggested in section 2.6 that the problem may be (a) above. There is no temporally asymmetrical necessity. If the root intuition behind the necessity of the past is something like the non-causability of the past, there is another inconsistency. There is an inconsistency between the alleged non-causability of the past, the transfer of non-causability principle, and the supposition that a proposition about the past entails a proposition about the future. But in these arguments it is the transfer principle that is suspicious. Arguments of this kind are discussed in some detail in Zagzebski (2002b).

Regardless of what one thinks of the argument for theological fatalism, there is a more general problem in the logic of time and causation that needs to be addressed. Both the alleged modal asymmetry of time and the causal asymmetry should be examined in more detail, as well as the various transfer principles that result in an inconsistency with metaphysical theses that have the consequence that a proposition about the past entails a proposition about the future.


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