Notes to Feminist Social Epistemology

1. Feminist work since the 1990s has questioned this divide between sex and gender and criticized both categories, suggesting both that sex is not a biological given, and that the category of gender suffers from an overgeneralization across women's varying experiences (Nicholson 1998). Even in such criticism, however, feminists' interest in the social and cultural aspects of sex remains.

2. Such theories might better be defined as “feminine epistemologies” rather than “feminist epistemologies”, however insofar as an argument can be made that feminine ways of knowing have been undervalued and a reversal of this valuation helps in the feminist project of improving the situation of women, they could be considered forms of feminist epistemology.

3. Only the article by Helen Longino builds explicitly on feminist themes, though others make passing reference to the influence of feminist epistemologists.

4. Many of the ideas of a feminist standpoint had been articulated as early as 1974 in Dorothy Smith's work. Whether or not Smith was offering a full-fledged epistemology at that point, she was certainly developing the ideas of standpoint theory and using them to inform the methodology of her social science research (for more on the distinctions between method, methodology, and epistemology as they apply to feminist research see Harding 1987).

5. The significant difference between Harding's 1986 definition of feminist empiricism and current usage of the term led Harding in 1991 to adjust her terms, revising the title of her original classification to “spontaneous feminist empiricisms” and classifying later theorists as offering “sophisticated feminist empiricisms” (Harding 1991). Solomon (2012) has divided up the field of feminist empiricisms even more.

6. Logical positivism, or some canonical interpretations of it, would be the notable exception here, given the extensive critiques feminists have provided (Harding 1986; Longino 1990; Nelson 1990). Even so, as Ann Garry notes (Garry 2012), a few feminists (Okrulik 2004; Yap 2010) have still found value in the work of the logical positivists.

7. Lorraine Code has argued that many naturalized epistemologies are overly scientistic in approach, though feminists can find much of value in a more ecological naturalism that looks at how we know in our natural environments (1996).

8. Phyllis Rooney has argued that compared with other recently developed approaches that challenge some of the standard assumptions of mainstream epistemology, feminist epistemology suffers a greater degree of marginalization from what she calls “epistemology proper”(Rooney 2011). Such recent approaches include naturalized epistemology, neo-pragmatism, virtue epistemology and social epistemology. The relative marginalization of feminist epistemology compared with social epistemology unmodified means that feminist epistemology is differently positioned from it within the broader field of epistemology. This different positioning may also partially explain why there has been less cross-pollination than one might expect.

9. Some social epistemologists, including many feminist epistemologists, argue that all forms of knowledge require social interactions. Debates regarding whether or not even simple observational claims like “The cat is on the mat” require an analysis of social interactions often turn on whether or not it is important to include in epistemic analysis the social interactions that allow us to learn the language and concepts employed in knowledge claims.

10. Without committing himself to a view of communities as knowers, John Hardwig (1985) has argued that cognitive divisions of labor within research teams might push us in the direction of accepting a view of communities as knowers, where only communities as wholes, not individual scientists can be said to hold the evidence for the team's conclusion.

11. Lorraine Code has argued that the need for analyses of epistemic responsibility is one reason why individuals must not drop out of the epistemic picture altogether (1995).

12. These four norms were first set out in Longino's 1990 book. In her 2002 book the norm of “equality of intellectual authority” is restated as “tempered equality of intellectual authority” in recognition that not all members of a scientific community are equal in intellectual capacity. The intent of the norm remains to ensure that the views of all members of epistemic communities are acknowledged and accounted for in the public processes of critical engagement.

Copyright © 2013 by
Heidi Grasswick <>

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