Continental Feminism

First published Fri Mar 29, 2013

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Jennifer Hansen replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

Continental feminism denotes a branch of feminist philosophy that draws on theoretical concepts and methods from the continental tradition. Continental feminists adapt three main methodological tools—postmodernism, psychoanalysis, and phenomenology—to unearth sexist commitments in: (1) contemporary social problems and (2) the field of philosophy.

While it is no easy task to characterize the heterogeneity of projects gathered under the heading of continental feminist philosophy, one can delineate two broad aims: deconstructive (critical) projects and reconstructive projects. In the former case, continental feminists draw on the tools and methodological approaches of postmodernism and psychoanalysis to uncover the sexist, racist, and homophobic core of Western thought. In the latter case, adapting phenomenological approaches, continental feminists develop new, more inclusive concepts of identity, agency, sexuality, race, and power. Their reconstructive projects also introduce helpful models for clarifying the nature of contemporary political and social problems.

1. The Critical Projects of Postmodernism and Psychoanalysis

Eradicating sexism and racism is not only a project of combating ignorance or mere lack of knowledge and therefore demonstrating that various figures in the history of Western philosophy based their views of women or people of color on faulty knowledge is not sufficient to combat future sexism. Continental feminists argue that much of the lethal racism and sexism of Western thought—the thought underlying our basic social structures and ideals—is affective, unconscious, imaginary, visual, and kinesthetic (for example, Alcoff 2006, Brennan 2003, Lee 2010, Sullivan 2006). One should not conclude, however, that careful examination of arguments, assumptions, and patterns of reasoning have no place in continental feminism, but rather that this work must be supplemented to adequately unearth the non-discursive deep-seated biases and blind spots of the Western tradition of thought not easily detected by an exclusive focus on the examination of arguments. One can find useful parallels between this particular focus among continental feminists and the emerging body of work on the epistemologies of ignorance among analytic feminists (see, for example, Code 2007, Hoagland 2007, Tuana 2004, Spelman 2007).

1.1 Psychoanalysis

A basic premise of psychoanalysis is that we do not have the ability to fully know our motivations. Psychoanalysis emphasizes the subterranean structures of personality incapable of being fully presented discursively and thus able to be evaluated. As a method taken up by continental feminists, psychoanalysis offers a new dimension to philosophical work because it is primarily a therapeutic practice aimed at healing. Hence, continental feminists who adopt psychoanalysis often aim to heal deep pathologies within Western thought (see McAfee 2000, 2008).

The real strength of psychoanalysis lies in its diagnostic power: it traces the causes and events responsible for a traumatic response, a phobia, a neurotic symptom, or a psychotic break not easily discernable by the patient (or in this case, tradition of thought). Feminists avail themselves of psychoanalytic categories and insights to give richer accounts of the origins of pernicious social problems, i.e., to clarify the intransigence of racism, homophobia, and sexism as psychological processes. Lastly, psychoanalysis identifies universally inherited processes and psychological structures and yet balances analyses of pathology with sensitivity to how cultural shifts and cultural mores impact personality development.

1.1.1 Lacanian Psychoanalysis

Jacques Lacan, who profoundly influences the French feminists Luce Irigaray and Julia Kristeva, famously made a “return to Freud” in the 1950s in France. Lacan's principle interest in returning to Freudian ideas was to clarify the singular role that language plays in structuring subjects (namely, personal identity). Lacan focuses on earlier Freudian works, such as The Interpretation of Dreams and Jokes and Their Relation to the Unconscious, wherein Freud attends to faux pas, slips of the tongues, and dreams as instances where the unconscious irrupts. For Lacan, what matters in successfully diagnosing a patient is not what she intends to say, but rather what she actually says. Only in her actual speech will the analyst track the workings of an irrupting unconscious; the patient's speech is a symptom to be decoded.

Influenced profoundly by the work of Claude Lévi-Strauss (1976) and Ferdinand de Saussure (1959), Lacan posits that language is fundamental and distinctive to human beings. Language is a structure with rules for creating meaning that pre-exists any particular lexicon in a given language group. The rules that govern language use are also symbolic and comprise the laws and taboos central to the culture of the speaker. These rules are not conscious to us, but rather, as Lacan famously pointed out, structure our unconscious (1977, 147).

In keeping with his linguistic focus, Lacan reworks Sigmund Freud's metapsychology into his own tri-partite structure: the imaginary, the symbolic, and the real (1977a, 1978, 1988). The imaginary order is responsible for creating the ego (le moi), which is a necessary condition for becoming a speaking being (parlêtre). Before an infant can speak, she must discover her mirror image and thereby create her first anchor in the world of human relations—her ego—which also helps her gain a sense of mastery over her otherwise disorganized and still-developing, uncoordinated body. And yet, this identification with one's mirror image is fundamentally alienating. She is both that object in the mirror and is not; the mirror-image is an illusion (not really her) and yet only by seeing oneself as this illusion can one begin the process of self-mastery. This alienation forms, according to Lacan, a fundamental split at the heart of subjectivity in human beings. To grasp ourselves as whole, coordinated, and self-possessed is to simultaneously see ourselves as an other (not only to ourselves but to all other subjects). Most importantly, we perceive ourselves as other (wholly separate) from our mother, who has hitherto been our most important relationship insofar as she has met our needs and cared for us. Becoming a subject is admitting that we are not one with our mothers and thus she does not exist to fulfill all our needs, nor do we complete her. We have boundaries and limits that often put us at a distance from what we want and need. Moreover, our mother leaves us behind at times, and we begin to suspect her absences are the result of our father (the Phallus) possessing something that the mother wants more than us; we are symbolically castrated (unable to be the sole object of satisfaction for our mother). The name-of-the-father becomes the first symbol that intimates to us that we might also gain the source of an omnipotent power that will banish our sense of impotence.

While the imaginary order begins the process of subjectivity, it is the symbolic order that gives us access to intersubjective relationships and the laws that regulate them. The symbolic order is so named because it highlights that our mediation with others is through symbols or signifiers that stand in for what we want, perceive, or need. Following the insights of de Saussure, Lacan argues that language is not an unmediated relationship between symbol and object, but rather a system of signifiers that produce meaning in their relationships to each other rather than represent objects. The signifiers we use to name objects have an arbitrary relation to what they signify, a relationship forged by excluding other possible signifiers from naming the object in question.

As we leave the mirror stage with our newly formed ego, we begin to take up language as an attempt to restore our sense of lost symbiosis with the mother's body and to gain mastery over our world. We do not have what we want—whether food or love—and so we need to use words to present what is absent to us. Lacan argues that we rely upon the linguistic processes of metaphor and metonymy in the symbolic order to attempt to satisfy desire (an attempt doomed to fail because we can never satisfy our most primordial desire to be one with the wholeness of the maternal body nor will we ever achieve total mastery). As we take up language, we discover the power of metaphor to make homologous substitutions for objects that are in line with cultural mores. We likewise discover metonymy or synecdoche to speak our desires in more elliptical ways that again avoids censure in the symbolic realm of culture. Both metaphor and synecdoche work by substituting a part of an object for the whole object. Lionel Bailly offers the following simple illustrations of metonymy and metaphor: one can “fish for pearls” wherein we are metonymically using the word “fish” to signify that we are drawing things out of the ocean (even if those things are not fish) but still within the same domain of fishing (the ocean) or we can “fish for information,” wherein we are metaphorically substituting fishing into a new domain (2009, 54). Metaphoric substitutions and metonymic displacements simultaneously repress the words (signifiers) for objects we should not name or are too painful to name and creates the unconscious, which is a repository of repressed or displaced signifiers. Such an act of repression or displacement begins the long sequences of signifying chains that become unconscious to the Subject (je), the speaking being. The goal of successful analysis is to bring those repressed chains of signifiers into consciousness via the ‘talking cure.’

Lacan's final order is the real. The real is not to be confused with “reality,” which for Lacan is a linguistic and socially mediated reality. The real is intrinsically incapable of being represented or symbolized; it is unnamable. The real regularly irrupts in our daily lives as a persistent and often menacing reminder that as essentially linguistic beings we are not capable of mastering our world, our selves, or our relationships to others. There is always something in excess, ungraspable by our merely adequate signifiers. When the real irrupts in our daily life—whether innocuously as a high pitch noise that breaks our attention or more painfully as a deer that runs straight into our car on a highway—it serves to remind us of the inextricably contingent nature of existence.

1.1.2 Putting the Western Philosophical Tradition on the Couch

Continental feminists have found that psychoanalytic thought is useful for two reasons 1) it provides them conceptual tools for understanding racism, sexism, or homophobia as deep-seated, unconscious habits that are thereby immune to rational debate and deliberation (and political inclusion) and 2) it provides them—especially in the work of major theorists like Freud and Lacan—a crystallization of cultural stereotypes and misconceptions of gender, sexuality, and race.

Incredulity is a typical reaction to feminist psychoanalytic work. Feminists, such a Kate Millett ([1970] 2000) and Phyllis Chesler ([1972]1997), view psychoanalysis as nothing more than another powerful attempt by patriarchy to control women's sexuality. Cultural theorist Jonathan Michel Metzl (2003) reminds us that psychoanalysis, as practiced in the 1950s and 60s in the United States by white men, often blamed mothers (as well as feminism) as the source of social unrest. Moreover, many scholars have exposed Freud's decision to ignore the accounts of rape and sexual violence that his female patients were giving in therapy, choosing instead to interpret them as mere “fantasies.” (Masson 1998) Given the problematic relationship between feminism and psychoanalysis, it is not surprising that some feminists are bewildered by a sizable literature among Continental feminists (including such thinkers as Teresa Brennan (1992; 1993; 2003), Judith Butler (1990; 1993; 1997; 2004), Drucilla Cornell (1995; 1998), Teresa de Lauretis (1989; 1994), Jane Gallop (1982; 1987), Kelly Oliver (1997; 2004), Shannon Sullivan (2006), and Cynthia Willett (1995) on both Freud and Lacan's work.

One strategy of psychoanalytically-oriented continental feminist theorists is to read a canonical and authoritative psychoanalytic text against the grain: to subject it to the same unconscious probing that it purports to demonstrate in order to expose the analyst's blind spots. After all, a core insight about the unconscious, according to both Freud and Lacan, is that it evades consciousness; we simply do not—and perhaps cannot—know what is buried down there. Juliet Mitchell was an early pioneer of this technique; in Psychoanalysis and Feminism (1974) she challenged feminist scholars to look seriously at Freud as an opportunity to better unravel the patriarchal imagination and unconscious. Appearing in France the same year as Mitchell's book, Luce Irigaray's Speculum of the Other Woman (1985) puts Freud on the couch. Irigaray reads Freud closely to uncover his unconscious fantasies and fears of the other sex. Speculum has become one type of model for many continental feminists for strategically engaging with the texts of both Freud and Lacan. What these canonical texts reveal, when read against the grain, is how notions of pathological femininity, penis envy, or castration anxiety emerge in Western thought as an expression of deeply entrenched patriarchal fears of sexual difference.

Unfortunately, rather than directly confront or challenge entrenched ideas about the wickedness of female sexuality, Freud and Lacan rationalize and then use them as explanations for many psychiatric disorders. Take, for example, the long-standing belief that presence of a womb (hystera) is what makes women prone to hysteria (King 1993). While Freud does not credit the actual womb as the root of hysteria, he does agree with the corresponding belief that women are more emotionally labile. Lacan, on the other hand, portrays the mother less as a loving nurturing presence in the infant's world, but rather a whore, who abandons the child to a higher bidder for her affections (Willett 1995). Irigaray pokes fun of such caricatures of femininity in Lacan's and Freud's texts. She mimics (and thereby exaggerates) the traditional representations of femininity they posit as natural and proper (1985)—a notion that Judith Butler later reworks as gender performativity (see 1.2.1). Irigaray's strategy of mimicry aims to expose the crucial role these patriarchal representations play as framing assumptions in Western reasoning, and as such, are not only taken for granted, but legitimate the association of femininity with pathology.

To further clarify how Freud and Lacan take these representations for granted, consider again how Lacan argues that our very sanity depends on our adherence to both the imaginary and symbolic realm of culture; we rely on these realms to make sense of the world. As explained above (1.1.1), the imaginary realm provides us with fictitious images of ourselves as whole and self-mastering, while the symbolic realm provides us with the conceptual categories of our shared world. What is particularly significant is their view that once we enter the symbolic realm, by beginning to speak, we quickly learn the various binary oppositions—pairs of contraries such as, nature/culture or speech/writing wherein one is more valuable than its opposite. One of these binaries is man/woman, which trains us to place more value on men and masculinity (precisely because he/it is opposed to woman), without any rational argumentation that defends such an assumption. It should be stressed, moreover, that for Lacan, both the images and the symbols we inherit, through the imaginary and symbolic respectively, are fixed; they are not revised as culture transforms nor do they reflect the material, social world the subject finds him or herself in. Shannon Sullivan (2006) characterizes this aspect of classical psychoanalysis ‘familialism,’ which is a view that the Oedipal drama responsible for constructing the self precedes any interaction with a social, historical world. As familialist, classical psychoanalysis sees certain features of personality—i.e., gender roles or racist tendencies—as inevitable rather than conditioned by certain historical attitudes.

Irigaray (1985) and Jane Gallop (1982), among others, argue, contrary to Freud and Lacan, for a more fluid notion of the imaginary, one that produces more humane and faithful images of women to shift the culture and to reflect that cultural ideas shift (see also Hansen 2000). Psychoanalytic feminists agree that our identity is produced out of identifications with various imaginary constructions (beauty ideals, heroic personages, our parents, or public icons). They further agree that these imaginary constructions lay the foundation for the sort of social, engaged agent we will become. If we identify with images of self-sacrificing, self-abnegating, meek women, then we will perhaps be less likely to protest oppressive circumstances. Drucilla Cornell (1995), in response to the effect that these punitive and restrictive images can have on women or other politically marginalized persons, argues for legal protection for the “imaginary domain”—a free psychic space—which, she argues is compatible with John Rawls' notion of self-respect. We should be allowed to imagine and represent to ourselves our sexual nature free from shameful fantasies imposed on us by a heterosexist culture. The imaginary and symbolic realms that mediate our social development, therefore, need to be challenged and reformed, argue continental feminists, rather than prostrated before.

Another related strategy continental feminists employ in re-reading Lacan and Freud is to use their theoretical conclusions concerning the pathologies of female subjectivity as symptomatic of the pathological culture that women find themselves in. For example, Butler (1997) reworks Freud's notion of melancholia (depression) as a psychic-somatic indication of a culture that tells certain subjects they matter and others they are failures. Lesbians, Butler argues, are threats to the conservative, heterosexist forces in culture. As a threatening identity, no widespread set of images or concepts support this identity. Images, and concepts, if you remember our discussion of Lacan above (1.1.1), help guide us in the process of forming a coherent self and become ideals to which the self aspires. Because there are no ideals to which a lesbian can live toward, a lesbian necessarily fails to achieve the conventional and prescribed ideals, because they are heterosexist. Butler points out how this psychic failure might be understood analogously to a psychoanalytic account of depression. Depressed subjects often mourn something they are not allowed to be. When the ego fails to reach such ideals, according to Freud, the super-ego punishes it, sending the subject into a severe depression. Butler shows that this logic works well to explain the process of all gendered subject formation; all of us, even heterosexuals, must give up parts of ourselves that fail to fit within the rigid symbolic order. Only the heterosexual couple (as imagined in patriarchy) is permitted. We “give up” the unruly parts of our sexuality by repressing it or proscribing it—psychic acts that shade all gender formation, for Butler, as melancholic processes.

1.1.3 Psychoanalysis and Race

In addition to the significant body of psychoanalytic feminist work deconstructing gender and sexuality is a budding, though fraught, body of work applying the concepts and categories of classical psychoanalysis to race, and more specifically, racial identity. This work is controversial because some African American feminist scholars suspect that applying psychoanalytic theoretical concepts to racial identity will significantly distort the life world that African Americans grow up in (Christian 1987). Unlike some white feminists, some African American or Latina scholars, for example, are less interested in turning to psychoanalytic philosophy—the colonizer's philosophy—to make sense of their predicaments. The editors of the collection, Feminist Subjects in Black and White, assert

… these interpretive strategies derive from and reinforce a particular construction of the unconscious more useful in exposing fissures in the dominant cultural texts than in interrogating the discourse of the dominated. Filtering texts by subjugated groups through a psychoanalytic ‘hermeneutics of suspicion’ tends to subvert their specific kinds of social knowledge and authority. (Abel et al. 1997, 5; see also Spillers 1997)

Here we see another important complication in using psychoanalytic concepts to make sense of race: such an interpretive strategy further marginalizes and thereby ignores the specific theoretical contributions that African American feminists are already making and which are grounded in the lived experiences of African Americans (Christian 1987). African American feminists, for example, may find richer theoretical resources for making sense of their own identity in spiritual discourses, i.e. proverbs preserved from African religions. Barbara Christian argues:

For people of color have always theorized—but in forms quite different from the Western form of abstract logic. And I am inclined to say that our theorizing (and I intentionally use the verb rather than the noun) is often in narrative forms, in the stories we create, in riddles and proverbs, in the play with language, since dynamic rather than fixed ideas seem more to our liking (1987, 52).

Finally, African American feminists have expressed deep concern over the trend of turning to African American women's literature—such as Toni Morrison's Beloved—to uncover gender and racial formation in psychoanalytic terms. Ann duCille writes—expressing a deep ambivalence over this trend—“[w]e become objects of study where we are authorized to be the story but have no special claim to decoding that story. We can be, but someone else gets to tell us what we mean” (1997, 34). Hence, rather than assume that the African American author is the subject and the racist world she finds herself is the Other, psychoanalytic readings of African American literature presume that non-white subjects are first and foremost the Other (see also Christian 1987).

While the problems using psychoanalytic theory to unravel the construction of non-white identity may be insoluble, some white feminists have productively used such theory to reveal how white identity and white privilege function. Here theorists are attempting to use the master's tools—Freud and Lacan—to destroy the master's house (see Lourde 1984): dominant cultural texts are ripe for such an against-the-grain reading of orthodox psychoanalytic concepts. In Revealing Whiteness (2006), Sullivan takes up Freud and Jean LaPlanche's notion of the unconscious to give better expression to the source of everyday covert racist behavior. She argues that, in general, the majority of racist acts and attitudes flow from an unconscious allegiance to (identification with) white privilege such that the seeming intractability of covert racism—the lethal racism of well-meaning white people—is to be explained by its unconsciousness. LaPlanche's influence on Sullivan, however, inspires her to characterize racism as unconscious habits rather than the unconscious tout court. Consistent with much continental feminist theorizing, Sullivan rejects any theory of the self, such as Freudian theory, which maintains the Cartesian mind-body dualism that she sees as having played a role in demeaning women and people of color throughout history. Framing white privilege as an unconscious habit is intended to underscore the ways in which it is expressed in body language, such as how white people take up space. These unconscious habits, furthermore, are transmitted as “enigmatic messages” from parents to infants in a way that bypasses conscious awareness. For example, how parents hold their bodies or change the timbre of their voices in the presence of non-whites. And if these habits are unconscious, then she argues that the rational, deliberate argumentation crucial to liberal political theory is unlikely to alter them; rather, we will need to discover alternative routes to transform habits—perhaps techniques that work directly on our embodied self, such as transforming the spaces we transact with—rather than solely appeal to critical reasoning.

While very few non-white feminists have availed themselves of psychoanalytic tools for unraveling the processes that produced the raced subject, some scholars have encouraged this sort of theorizing to take place. Hortense Spillers (1997) laments the lack of “critical inquiries into the ‘souls of black folk’” and goes on to consider this absence “the missing layer of hermeneutic and interpretive projects of an entire generation of black intellectuals now at work” (136). Gwen Bergner, likewise, notes “ … although W.E.B. Du Bois's term ‘double consciousness’ has become the standard shorthand to describe African-American subjectivity, the condition of double consciousness remains relatively under theorized” (1999, 221). While both Spillers and Bergner are acutely aware of the reasons why African American Studies has not embraced psychoanalytic theory, both nonetheless argue that a retooling and refitting of the fundamental concepts of psychoanalysis could be useful for making sense of black and other non-white subject formation. Bergner, in particular, cites the work of Frantz Fanon (1991 [1952]/1991 [1961]) as a model for a psychoanalytic theory attuned to and able to account for historical, social reality; in Fanon's work, we do not see a need to “unhinge politics and identity” (Bergner 1999, 227).

1.2 Postmodernism

As with Lacanian psychoanalysis, postmodern thinkers share insights drawn from the structuralists, de Saussure and Levi-Strauss. While psychoanalysis aims to diagnose how the non-discursive forces, such as, repression or unconscious racial habits, play a significant role in persisting social inequalities, postmodernists tend to focus on discourse (see Derrida 1978, 280). Whereas the analyst attends to her patient's speech as a clue to unconscious, non-discursive motivations or habits, the postmodernist treats discourse as independent of the author. Concepts, rules, symbols, and words take a life of their own in structuring the worlds we live in and how we understand ourselves. Discursive systems, in other words, are not fully within the control of linguistic beings and rather than reveal the world to us, they can just as well constrain what are possible objects of experience. This position is very close to one taken by philosopher of science, Thomas Kuhn (1962), who stresses that when our models of what the world is like shift, so then does what we actually see; in other words, we see what we believe. Moreover, the conviction that ‘knowing’ is never a disengaged or disinterested project is deeply inspired by Friedrich Nietzsche's (1999) critique of ‘truth’ as a ‘will to power,’ which posits that the models we build to render reality knowable ultimately bear traces of the interests of their makers. Thus, for postmodernists, human knowledge is inextricably tied to human interests.

1.2.1 Derridean Deconstructive Reading

Prominent among postmodern thinkers, Jacques Derrida (1973) makes the epistemological claim that “nothing is outside the text,” hence, there is nothing beyond our discursive systems of representation insofar as we can only know or think what is represented. Derrida is the inspirational figure for a branch of postmodernism called deconstruction, which is a term Derrida takes from Martin Heidegger (1962, 44) to describe a way to study a given tradition by locating the “architectural” supports upon which it rests. Deconstructionists insist that difference is always at work at the heart of any theoretical construction, such as a scientific model or a given method of analysis. The foundations we lay to build up models or methods are not natural starting points, but rather human constructions arising from a particular historical context and set of concerns. This implies that our theoretical constructions are pragmatic tools that necessarily exclude other ways (perhaps equally valuable) of rendering the world. What grounds a theory is not an indubitable truth, if by ‘truth’ we mean a mirror image of nature.

Given the postmodern criticism of epistemology as historically contingent and driven by human interests, one should surmise that calling ‘deconstruction’ a method is fraught with difficulties. In an effort to prevent a misunderstanding of deconstruction as a method, commentators on Derrida's work refer to his project as “deconstructive readings” (see, for example, Johnson 1980). This description aims to highlight the singularity of each of Derrida's investigations of formative texts in the history of philosophy. Derrida often coins neologisms in the midst of his meticulous readings of thinkers such as Heidegger (1982) or Plato (1981), such as différance or pharmakon respectively. These words are not intended to represent an enduring feature of reality, and for this reason Derrida coins new terms for new readings and rarely uses the same term twice. These neologisms are intended to trace out moments of the exclusion of difference (heterogeneity) within a specific theoretical hypothesis (theories). If such theories are our tools for picking out patterns, stable relationships, and specific objects, then they search for what is the same in the midst of an overwhelming heterogeneity. Theories give us order. And yet, for Derrida, every theory rests upon shifting sands. From this point of view, the pursuit of knowledge is not necessarily—at least not in every case—a progressive gain, if this means that we are getting closer to uncovering an ultimate reality, since the pursuit of knowledge, at least when driven by theories, often excludes intricacies in the heterogeneity.

Derrida's deconstructive readings often unearth binary oppositions that are projected as an unstable center of any given theory and thereby should make us deeply skeptical of any given method. The oppositions should not be taken as a pure primordial reality, but rather constructions. Even what is ‘natural’ for a deconstructionist, is a construction. For example, some contemporary feminists embrace ‘natural childbirth.’ This concept is supposed to describe a pure experience, one which is unsullied by technology designed, perhaps, to control unruly female bodies. And yet, natural childbirth is as much a constructed concept as ‘hospital birth.’ The latter concept simultaneously constructs ‘natural childbirth’ as the other (its mutually exclusive opposite) to which it is opposed; a hospital birth is supposed to be superior to a mere natural childbirth. And yet, the latter did not properly exist as a practice until the advent of obstetrics with its technical manipulation of pregnant female bodies. From the point of view of a deconstructive reading, feminists who embrace ‘natural childbirth’ are attempting to reverse a cultural privileging of culture over nature. Yet, such a move is as problematic because the two concepts mutually implicate each other and neither one has an original priority. They are both constructions; each serves its own purposes. An implication of Derridean deconstructive readings is that neither feminists nor patriarchs can ground a theory by claiming to have discovered the proper foundation—whether ‘natural’ or ‘cultural.’

In her highly influential book Gender Trouble (1990) and the follow-up book Bodies that Matter (1993), Butler employs Derridean deconstructive readings to radically undermine both feminist and non-feminist understandings of sex and gender. Gender Trouble presents her theory of gender as essentially performative, drawing from Derrida's reading of J.L. Austin in “Signature, Event, Context” (1982a), wherein he suggests that language—signification—precedes the reality it purports to represent. In other words, what exists comes into being through performances (or utterances, to use Austin's term). Butler applies the concept of performativity to gender itself, arguing that gender comes into being as it is performed by subjects. She writes “[g]ender is the repeated stylization of the body, a set of repeated acts within a highly rigid regulatory frame that congeal over time to produce the appearance of substance, of a natural sort of being” (1990, 33). There is no gender identity or anything like a pure material substrate that exists prior to these performances. Linda Martín Alcoff (2006) characterizes Butler's position as ‘synthetic constructivism’ to highlight that Butler's theory is as much a metaphysical account of gender as an epistemological account; our very bodies are synthetic rather than natural objects. The cultural symbolic system of meaning that constructs (synthesizes) gender, furthermore, is regulatory, an expression of power, a law, which thereby prohibits certain possibilities from coming into existence at any given historical moment (c.f. Colebrook 2000). Lastly, for Butler, it makes no sense to postulate a materiality outside of discursive systems, thus to posit that there is a pre-discursive (pure) materiality that cultural systems of meaning inscribe, is unthinkable on Butler's terms. The idea of a pre-discursive reality is only posited, retrospectively, by a discourse that constructs gender as a cultural fact and simultaneously posits sex as an ontological fact. Hence, the notion of a pre-discursive reality is simply contradictory: reality is discursive—if you will—so the very idea of a ‘pre-discursive reality’ is incoherent.

If there is nothing outside of discourse, as Butler maintains, then the lever needed to alter the inequalities between the sexes cannot be a construction of a more faithful account of or a more culturally valued female sexual identity. There is neither a disfigurement of nature nor a distortion of worth by discourse because both, for Butler, are entirely its own constructions. Hence, she adopts a different strategy: parody. Butler argues that drag performances both expose the otherwise invisible heterosexual matrix that otherwise punitively restricts gender identities to a simple binary as well as expose the very structure of gender identity as an imitation of a heterosexual fantasy of femininity or masculinity. Butler suggests that:

… part of the pleasure, the giddiness of the performance is in the recognition of a radical contingency in the relation between sex and gender in the face of cultural configurations … that are regularly assumed to be natural and necessary … [drag] dramatizes the cultural mechanism of their fabricated unity (138).

In other words, drag is merely an exaggeration of what all gender identities are—performances that imitate a fantasy—rather than expressions of what is true, real, or natural. The fantasy of gender, moreover, is historically contingent and variable because it reflects whatever is intelligible—permitted by the regulatory power of discourse to be thought—at any given moment.

1.2.2 Foucauldian Analytics of Power: Archeology and Genealogy

Michel Foucault's work offers continental feminism a useful analytics of power to further trace out the sexism, racism, and homophobia within Western thought. Through his historical genealogies of punishment (1979) and the asylum (1973) for example, he demonstrates that individuals do not wield power; power is not an object that one has in one's possession as an instrument for directing or controlling external events or people. Ladelle McWhorter (2004) clarifies that for Foucault power is an event wherein multiple parties are in a struggle over their competing interests and agendas. The struggle is a crucial feature of power, for wherever power is at work, so is resistance to it in the form of trying to change a situation or undermining the rules some establish to direct the actions of others. Finally, power acts upon bodies in both repressive (pouvoir) and creative (puissance) ways: either one tries to exercise power over another by limiting the range of options she has for expressing herself (clothing or body language) or power can create a new corporeal competency, such as the ability to sit still and focus one's attention for long stretches of time.

Sandra Bartky (1990) skillfully captures how both kinds of power (repressive and creative) function in the modern practices of beautification:

A woman's skin must be soft, supple, hairless, and smooth; ideally, it should betray no sign of wear, experience, age, or deep thought. Hair must be removed not only from the face but from large surfaces of the body as well, from legs and thighs, an operation accomplished by shaving, buffing with fine sandpaper, or foul-smelling depilatories… The removal of facial hair can be more specialized. Eyebrows are plucked out by the roots with a tweezer. Hot wax is sometimes poured onto the mustache and cheeks and then ripped away when it cools. The woman who wants a more permanent result may try electrolysis: This involves the killing of a hair root by the passage of an electric current down a needle which has been inserted into its base (69).

Productive power is at work when individuals internalize norms and police themselves to stay in accordance with them; it co-opts us rather than coerces us. Barky argues that feminists should feel some deep ambivalence over the practices of beautification. While on the one hand, the productive power of these “micro-physics of power” develop new skills and competencies in women, on the other hand, they constrain women's self-expression to adherence to the reigning cultural standards of beauty.

Foucault developed two different and yet compatible methods for unearthing the working of power, a rethinking of Nietzsche's will-to-power (1969) in the production of technical knowledge (conaissance): ‘archeology’ (1970, 1972, 1973) and ‘genealogy’ (1979, 1990). An archeological approach strictly studies discourse—technical concepts such as ‘feminism’ and what historical preconditions are necessary to think such a concept. Language is in sediment the implicit rules (not merely, but including, grammatical rules), but also explicit rules (discursive formations) that delimit a proper field of thought and study. If it is strange to us to imagine periods in history where male erotic relationships were normal and venerated (e.g., 5th century Athens), this is because of the invisible constraints on thought that are embedded in our language, which Foucault's histories of practices tries to make visible. Archaeological analyses attempt to excavate language-as-sediment in order to find traces of these implicit rules. The rules never present themselves as such, but we can study the surface effects of these subterranean structures.

Drawing on Hortense Spiller's essay, “Mama's Baby, Papa's Maybe: An American Grammar Book (1987),” Ellen K. Feder engages in an archaeological inquiry to trace the “conditions of the appearance of … rules … that govern what counts as ‘woman’” (2007, 12). Feder, following Spillers, argues that historically, part of what constitutes gender (‘woman’) as a category is an implicit rule that excludes black (slave) “women.” To put this more concretely, part of what is picked out by the category of ‘woman’ is “being a mother,” and thus thinking gender is fundamentally bound up with the family and its proper roles. And yet, as the category of woman-as-mother emerges, so does a simultaneous denial that slaves can have blood or kin relations—because they are property not people—which then conditions thought and thereby restricts the application of the category of woman to black women. This line of inquiry suggests that one of the reasons why early feminist analyses of the production of gender, such as Nancy Chodorow's (1978), finds it difficult to think race and gender together, and thereby isolates gender from race, is owing to the implicit rules (or “American grammar”) that govern gender; to be a woman has always already meant to be a white woman.

Genealogy begins with a present object—such as psychiatry or punishment—and traces the historical emergence of that object out of competing and divergent accounts. Foucault's genealogical approach is best illustrated in his work Discipline and Punish (1979) where he begins with a present conception of punishment and identifies the workings of power—particularly on bodies—that produced it. Genealogical analyses do not aim to show a continuity of thought, but rather how practices, technical expertise, and concepts emerge in a circuitous and contingent way. The time-honored example of how power disciplines bodies is that of the soldier for whom military training is concerned with instilling specific bodily habits and aptitudes. Military training manufactures soldiers. Sandra Bartky (1990) develops a genealogical analysis of the modern production of femininity, which describes the intricate technical competence women need to master to achieve a standard of feminine beauty. In many cases, especially the feminine body, we mistake how women carry themselves, or their public facial expressions as “natural,” and forget how utterly contingent they are.

2. Phenomenology and Reconstructive Projects

Reconstructive projects in continental feminism harken back to pre-Kantian speculative philosophy, or uncovering the nature of reality, and yet with an important difference. Traditionally, speculative philosophy concerns itself with metaphysical and ontological questions—what exists in the world. However, because feminist reconstructive projects begin with an expanded notion of experience (beyond the “sense data” empiricism of the modern tradition) and therefore assume metaphysical pluralism (i.e., plural realities), when continental feminists set out to theorize about nature, sexual difference, or bodies, they do so without any pretensions of discovering the singular, monistic essence of things or the timeless order of the world.

Continental feminists seek to understand ontology not in terms of identities, but differences (see Braidotti 1994, Grosz 2004; 2005). What can be known is always already in the process of differentiating, proliferating, becoming-other than we know it. Because ontology—on this view—is not a project of cutting nature at its joints, ontology becomes fundamentally entwined with a study of culture, power relations, and history. What exists, and how we have previously described it, bears the markings of various systems of meaning (e.g., language). And, following postmodern insights, all systems of meaning are bound up with operations of power. While analytic feminist philosophers also unearth how power distorts theories of reality and knowledge, continental feminists, influenced by Foucault (1.2.2), operate with a different sense of power. As pointed out above (1.2.2), in addition to the quest to dominate others, one might describe power as a productive force that creates new institutions, social and political arrangements, concepts, and even bodily habits.

2.1 Phenomenology

Phenomenology emerges in the 20th century as a new method aimed at clarifying the transcendental structures of consciousness that construct the objectivity that prefigures scientific investigation and later, and more relevant to continental feminist philosophy, becomes a method for describing subjective, lived, embodied experience. Continental feminists have traditionally appealed to three dominant trends within phenomenology: (i) hermeneutic phenomenology, which is an essentially an interpretive activity aimed at clarifying implicit, inherited traditional views on various philosophical concepts deemed vital for constructing a flourishing life; (ii) phenomenology of the body, which clarifies how inherited cultural practices shape our bodies and their transactions with the worlds they find themselves in; and, finally, (iii) existential phenomenology, which aims at liberating the self to transcend the “objectifying gaze” of powerful others and construct a non-oppressive identity.

2.1.1 Hermeneutic Phenomenology

Hermeneutical phenomenology is a method of philosophical inquiry aimed at clarifying how background ideas, practices, and beliefs shape our interpretations of the world (including our activities in the world). Martin Heidegger called his method in Being and Time (1962) hermeneutical phenomenology in order to emphasize that the proper role of philosophical inquiry is to make explicit the implicit practices that constrain our understanding of what exists. Traditional hermeneutics is the art of interpreting texts by putting them in context, i.e., if one wants to understand a 18th century British novel, it helps to understand the ideas, institutional arrangements, and historical events contemporary to the novel (Palmer 1969). Phenomenology is the attempt to study experience (whether objectively or subjectively) free from entrenched theoretical models that selectively attend to certain features of our experience while ignoring others. Hence, hermeneutical phenomenology aims to make explicit the “inescapable frameworks” through which we interpret our experience (Taylor 1989).

Hermeneutical phenomenology, as a method, appeals to continental feminists for a variety of reasons. First of all, such a method challenges a modern empiricist view that the task of philosophy is to clarify our ideas of the world, and as such, essentially privileges cognizing over other modes of philosophical insight, such as affective receptivity, associated with feminine experience. Secondly, hermeneutical phenomenology brings into focus that the specific practices of philosophers (but not limited to philosophers) have a history and are therefore not the correct or only practices (see Holland 1990). As a historical practice, the specific texts and philosophers that we take to be the canon is an historical construction. As such, it ignores the contributions of women, people of color, and non-Western peoples as well as the value-ladenness of putatively “neutral” philosophical concepts, such as ‘object.’ Susan Bordo (1987), for example, situates Descartes into his culture and thereby reads his methodological preference to render the world as objects of knowledge as elevating knowing as a detached and disembodied—attitudes that, for Bordo, devalue what is culturally associated with femininity (the body, affectivity, and relationality). Thirdly, this method highlights that knowing is essentially interpretation, which flows from a “practical holism” (Dreyfus 1980). That is, much of what frames the subject matter philosophers attend to is a set of habits, common sense beliefs, customs, or practices that we acquire from our culture and that are more often than not unconscious—a stance which affirms the value of affective, embodied, and relational knowing. Lastly, hermeneutical phenomenology directs us to reflect more carefully on “common sense” or “experience” so that we are in a better position to challenge or transform it, which is a primary goal of feminist philosophy.

To clarify how continental feminists adapt hermeneutical phenomenology, consider Linda Martín Alcoff's (2006) analysis of how we perceive race in the United States. The visible difference that marks race in the United States denotes far more than skin pigmentation or morphological differences. Seeing race already embodies an attitude toward those who are not white. Typically, we inherit attitudes toward race without being consciously aware of how it shapes our perceptions, e.g., a suspicion that the Latina mother strolling in the park with a young white girl is an illegal. Our perception of the visible world contains in sediment the various schemes for interpreting the world that we are born into and with which we tacitly take up when we learn language or specific cultural practices.

2.1.2 Phenomenology of the Body

Continental feminists also adapt Maurice Merleau-Ponty's (1962, 1968) phenomenological insights concerning the role the body plays in interpreting the worlds we inhabit; such a focus extends phenomenology beyond mere method to a critical stance of wider social structures and institutions that shape, constrain, or liberate our bodies. On this view, the body is not a mere instrument to carry out the wishes of pure consciousness, but itself possesses a pre-theoretical, unreflective understanding of the world and its objects. Further, experience is fuller and more textured than the mere sense data that comes across our skin; the body is not a passive receptor but intentional, engaged, and interpretive of any given situation, including the subtle body language of others. In possessing “motor intentionality,” the body, explains Merleau-Ponty , makes meaning; it is a transcending body already oriented toward objects and engaged in a project one might be only dimly aware of (1962, 96). For example, as I leave my office building to head downstairs, I reach for the doorknob and lean in just a bit because the door is heavy and sometimes sticks; none of these bodily comportments reach the level of consciousness, nor are they merely reflexive. These bodily comportments are intentional—aimed at opening the door to enable me to get downstairs and out of the building—but I am not merely reporting and assessing various features of the phenomena—i.e., the heft of the door—as I am opening it.

The fluid, goal-oriented, intentional body described in Merleau-Ponty's work gets complicated by both Iris Marion Young and Frantz Fanon, who point out how oppressive social meanings, i.e. the assumption of criminality of young black male bodies, can interrupt or frustrate the fluid body more typical of whiteness or patriarchy. Adapting Merleau-Ponty's insights concerning ‘motor intentionality,’ Iris Marion Young (1980) sets out to describe how women in advanced, industrial societies typically comport themselves in inhibited, truncated, or inefficient movements. The aim of her phenomenology of feminine comportment is to critically unearth how patriarchy shapes the more habitual, fluid, structured movements of bodies such as walking, carrying objects, or throwing a football. Because women are likely to experience themselves as objectified by a male gaze, feminine comportment is more self-conscious than fluid. As they move through a room, for example, women feel more self-aware they are being observed.

Fanon characterizes the self-awareness that interrupts fluid, seamless goal-oriented movement as a “racial epidermal schema” (1967, 112); Alcoff (2006) characterizes one who experiences such a “racial epidermal schema” as a “visible identity.” Playing on a passage in Fanon's essay “The Fact of Blackness,” (1967), Nathifa Greene (2012) clarifies that in meeting the eyes of the white other, the racialized body experiences a decomposing of what ought to be a coordinated, fluid, intentional body. And such decomposition frustrates such a body from enjoying a free, easy, lack of self-awareness more common, for example, to young white men, thereby requiring more self-conscious scripting or composing of her body. While Fanon describes the experience of being racialized in overt racist contexts such as Jim Crow or the colonial situation, he nonetheless masterfully captures the more subtle ways that white privilege decomposes the visible body, typical of our contemporary moment. For example, he describes the difference in being noticed as a black man walking into a café, where “I see in those white faces that it is not a new man who has come in, but a new kind of man, a new genus. Why, it's a Negro!” (116).

Emily Lee (2010) expounds on the pernicious and subtle violence the racialized body experiences under the white gaze. In her phenomenological analysis of Patricia Williams' (1991) first-person description of being disbarred from entering a high-end store in Manhattan by a young, white salesperson in the high crime era of mid-1980s, Lee further illuminates how pre-existing, dimly conscious, sedimented associations exist alongside the black body—what Fanon describes as the “thousand details, anecdotes, and stories” that “the white man had woven me out of” (1967, 111). During this era, many stores installed buzzers, intended to keep out suspected thieves or junkies, and thus when Williams peers into the window as a brown skin, kinky-hair, African-American woman in casual weekend clothing, she is perceived by the young salesperson within a racist horizon that interprets her as a potential threat.

We are far from an era free of a racist horizon that infects perception of racialized bodies. Moreover, the violence of such racist perception is not always subtle. Consider the neighborhood watch coordinator who shot and killed 17-year old Trayvon Martin (2011), a young African-American male deemed suspicious because he was wearing a hooded sweatshirt and walking through his neighborhood in the rain. These subtle and more overtly violent interchanges between the racialized body and the privileged white gaze systematically disrupt the fluid body that Greene (2012) argues ought to be equally available to all bodies.

2.1.3 Existential Phenomenology

One could argue that the existential phenomenological project is primarily an ethical project; the existentialist is less interested in a neutral description of the world, and more interested in promoting justice and social progress. Thus, existential phenomenology has special relevance for continental feminists because it can be used to clarify how women can transform the world through combatting sexism and racism. Both Simone de Beauvoir and Fanon were early pioneers of existentialism, inspiring women, the colonized, and racialized individuals to revolt by transcending their oppressive situation through collective and creative struggle. A primary assumption of existentialists is that human beings are more than the situation they find themselves in; they are more than their biological make-up; and they are more than the low expectations placed upon them. Human beings are capable of creating new social institutions, identities, and thereby new futures.

What enables humans to transform their worlds is their unique capacity for transcendence—what in the mainstream philosophical tradition is understood as free will. Transcendence also enables creativity—a departure from the routine, custom, and the well-worn path. However, many continental feminists, influenced by de Beauvoir and Fanon, who were more attuned to the peculiar ways that racism and sexism impinge upon human transcendence, argue that a pre-requisite of human transcendence is the ability to be a coordinated, fluid, intentional body. Thus a specific obstacle to women or racialized men, who wish to transform racist and sexist institutions, is the very self-awareness racialized or sexualized persons have—a self-awareness that emerges, for example, from both side-long glances of the white privileged and the sexual objectification of women's bodies. Part of women's struggle for liberation depends upon changing the still pervasive and dominant perception of women, and this is particularly true for women of color where race expectations intersect with those of gender.

A number of continental feminists, notably Luce Irigaray, argue that liberation, and the positive impact it has for all humans and their environs, requires the acknowledgement and protection of difference, especially the irreconcilable reality of sexual difference. Black feminist writers, such as Donna-Dale L. Marcano and Kathryn Gines, further stress that the recognition of the ontological existence of black female identity—the reality of black female identity—is crucial to the overcoming interlocking forms of oppression—sexism, racism, and classism. Thus in opposition to analytic philosophers—including Naomi Zack (1993)—who argue for the elimination of all forms of racial or gender identity to focus on what is universally “human,” continental feminists, particularly black feminists, argue that liberation is impossible without acknowledging the unique difference—both positively and negatively—that one's identity as ‘Other’ makes.

2.2 Embracing a Positive Notion of Difference

Given the specific focus on liberation integral to existentialist phenomenology, and given that existentialist phenomenology is bound up with hermeneutic phenomenology and phenomenology of the body, it is not surprising that a major debate within continental feminist thought is how to construct a positive notion of sexual and racial identity. Luce Irigaray focuses mainly on sexual difference as the primary ontological fact, which has lead to a healthy debate concerning whether positing sexual difference as fundamental ontology fully captures the specific, lived experiences of non-white women (see, for example, Chanter 1995, Bloodsworth 1999, Weiss 1999, Deutscher 2003, Grosz 2005). While surely Irigaray is a champion of pluralism, i.e. the dismissal of “a view from nowhere,” the question remains whether or not asserting sexual difference really is the difference from which all others spring.

2.2.1 Constructing a Positive Notion of Sexual Difference

One could argue two main schools of thought exist within continental feminism on the question of sexual difference. The first, best represented by Irigaray, approaches sexual difference as a more or less ontological reality, and asserts that rather than attempting to transcend or deny differences between men and women, feminism should embrace the fact of difference and take it as the very foundation of both theory and practice. The second, best represented by Butler (see section 1.2.1), questions the very reality of any sort of sexual difference, and views such a difference as part and parcel of a coercive and restrictive representational system.

Irigaray's central critique of Western philosophy rests upon her diagnosis of its inherent sexual indifference, that is, a failure on the part of those theories to recognize that the human species is always internally differentiated, certainly by sex. When such theories have allowed ‘male’ to stand in for ‘human’—whether by defining the human in terms of characteristics associated specifically with men, or constructing the male as the paradigm of the species, or by simply conflating the two linguistically by use of the male generic—they have necessarily rendered women as lesser humans. By considering the human species as essentially one, and then allowing the male to stand in for that ‘one,’ the philosophical tradition has defined women out of the specificity of their own existence, and has only allowed women to be seen in relation to men and their desires and needs.

Irigaray claims that, for both philosophical and political reasons, Western culture must recognize that difference lies at the very foundation of the human species and experience. The human species, she says, is ‘at least’ two (1996, 37). Her point here is that, trapped as Western culture and thought is within a male-centered metaphysics, both sexes (and those that may remain unrecognized) have been constructed contrary to their ontological distinction. Therefore, we do not really know who men are; their sexual specificity has been veiled by their paradigmatic sex-neutral status. And, we certainly do not know who women are, as their sexual specificity has been utterly denied in the construction of their inferior status.

In order to rectify both our philosophical understanding of human beings and our sexual politics, Irigaray elevates the philosophical virtue of wonder (1994). The sexes must approach each other with a sense of humility and awareness of the unknown, a recognition that no one person or subset of persons can represent the human species in its totality, and that therefore the other has something to teach, and something to say. To approach the other as different is not (as some other philosophical traditions would have it) to construct it as inferior. Difference need not be understood as deviations from a norm, nor signify the lack of important qualities. Women differ from men, not as less faithful examples of ideal human beings. Women differ from men in that they are a wholly distinct category. Irigaray's ontological point here has important political implications: women cannot understand their own identities on male terms. Women need to “become who they are”: to unleash and live out their own particular modalities of being in the world.

Other thinkers committed to thinking through the political implications of sexual difference include Rosi Braidotti and Elizabeth Grosz. Braidotti (1994) rethinks the project of sexual difference as a project of rethinking female subjectivity. She makes a helpful distinction between identity and subjectivity: identity is rooted in the imaginary (and unconscious) identifications we make with “culturally available positions,” while subjectivity is a conscious, willful form of political resistance (162, 157). Braidotti agrees with Irigaray (who is echoing Heidegger) that sexual difference is the question of our age (Irigaray 1984, 5). She alternates between describing her philosophical project as an affirmation of a “feminist female subjectivity” and a “nomadic subjectivity,” because for Braidotti the affirmation of a female subjectivity is necessarily an historically contingent project rather than a permanent project; if a future moment no longer requires the thinking through of sexual difference, her nomadic subject will move onto a new political horizon (1994, 33).

Drawing heavily on the work of Gilles Deleuze, Braidotti argues that subject positions entail practices, habits, and activities energized and propelled forward by a non-conscious affective center. Desire, on a Deulezian as opposed to a Freudian reading, is experimental: “producing ever new alignments, linkages, and connections” (168). For our present historical moment, Braidotti asserts, the affirmation of sexual difference is the unleashing of a positive, affective force that will usher in “open spaces for experimentation” (171). Sexual difference is a site for the production and proliferation of even more differences. And difference, for Braidotti and Irigaray, is a counterweight to the rigidity, dogmatism, and statism of the status quo of Western thought; without difference, in fact, there is no future, only a decaying past ill-equipped to handle the multifarious challenges of posed by the profound political and cultural shifts of globalization.

Elizabeth Grosz is, perhaps, the most faithful proponent of Irigaray's project of sexual difference. In her works Volatile Bodies (1994) and In the Nick of Time (2004), Grosz draws insights from Gilles Deleuze, Friedrich Nietzsche, Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Michel Foucault, Henri Bergson and Charles Darwin with the aim of rethinking ontology and nature as essentially dynamic, differentiating, proliferating and progressive. In her early work, Grosz (1994) follows Irigaray in positing a “pure … material difference” between the sexes; sexual difference, on this view, is not solely a symbolic difference, but a fact of materiality (i.e., understanding sexual difference is not solely an epistemological project or study of culture) (190). However, various cultural inscriptions place significance and value on material, corporeal differences, which the body enacts and embodies. Grosz's insight helps us see the nature of the ethical harm in a dominant, patriarchal meaning system (symbolic order) that inscribes differentiated bodies. Drawing on Julia Kristeva's work (1982), Grosz argues that women's bodies have functioned as the abject (viz., polluting underbelly) to this patriarchal order. Women's bodies have been represented as unruly, uncontrollable, seeping, leaky, viscous and entrapping. Rather than see women's differences as a positivity (both in terms of value and pure material presence), the patriarchal symbolic order rewrites these corporeal differences as vile. As a result many women come to understand themselves —form a body-image of themselves—on these harmful terms.

In Grosz's (2004) more recent work, she focuses on a rethinking of nature—including bodies—as a dynamic, differentiating, complex force in its own right. Rather than the “raw material” of cultural inscriptions, nature in its tendency toward greater complexity and differentiation “impels the complications and variability of culture itself” (4). Perhaps one of the most intriguing aspects of Grosz's work is her bringing together Charles Darwin's theory of natural selection with Irigaray's affirmation of sexual difference. Grosz explains that, according to Darwin, there is

an evolutionary advantage to the interbreeding of pairs over forms of self-generated or hermaphroditic reproduction. He suggests that it is the combination of inherited material from two individuals that generates much greater variation, more difference, and gives new individuals an evolutionary edge (69).

Grosz not only finds an ally for Irigaray in Darwin's work, but she also uses Darwin's insights about the dynamism, unpredictability, and endless inventiveness of nature to undergird a feminist politics. Arguing by analogy, if endless variation gives individuals an evolutionary advantage, i.e., helps them survive and thrive, then fostering a cultural appreciation for difference and differentiation and the various “experiments in living” that flow from such plurality will enable humanity to better thrive and survive. Sexual difference, understood as an originary, natural difference (cutting across species and plant life) is the very engine of our basic existence. Without difference, we are dead.

2.2.2 Constructing a Positive Notion of Racial Difference

More recently, Irigaray's, and by extension those continental feminists who further her project, persistent emphasis on sexual difference as the most fundamental difference among human beings has been met with concern: prioritizing sexual difference over racial difference as a lived experience simply is untenable to many non-white feminists who fervently argue that we cannot subordinate racial difference to sexual difference. Hence, black feminists, who come out of the continental tradition, are currently debating how to embrace racial difference (see Davidson, Gines and Marcano 2010). The underlying concern is to make clear that a person's race positions them socially, politically, and economically in distinct ways. To insist that social and political systems ignore a person's race is to contradict this lived experience. In this sense, the project of embracing racial difference is similar to embracing sexual difference: to demonstrate how ill suited many of our social institutions are when they embrace liberalism or color-blindness. Black feminists and race theorists are focusing both on the issue of the “reality of race” and the specific experience of being a woman of color.

A helpful way to map the two main positions concerning the nature of race in both Africana and continental philosophy is: eliminativism vs. conservationism. The former argues that we should dispense with treating race as an ontological reality, while the latter argues for both the existential and epistemological significance of racial difference.

In Africana studies and race theory, analytically-trained philosophers, Kwame Anthony Appiah (1993) and Naomi Zack (1994), have defended the elminativist argument concerning the ‘reality’ of race by showing that the concept of race is incoherent (it does not actually pick out anything real in the world) and, moreover, involves obviously racist premises that do not accord with biological facts about the world. Race, is a socially constructed category, which for eliminativists means that it contingent, not-inevitable, and thus capable of being eliminated. Race is an artifact of racist institutions and racist science. Hence, the move to retain race as a useful category for social scientific research, for example, perpetuates racism. When African Americans cling to their racial identity—so the argument goes—they are preserving what is essentially a racist notion. The eliminativist argument stamps those who embrace race as essentialists.

In continental feminism, Judith Butler (1990) and Joan Scott (1992), represent the eliminativist position insofar as both criticize identity politics as a liberation strategy. Continental feminists, however, typically do not characterize their position as eliminiativist, but rather postmodern. Moreover, unlike eliminativists, postmodern feminists suspicious of embracing racial or gender identities do not posit a reality outside of language (or systems of representation). For example, Butler (1990) asserts that the oppressive discursive systems, such as law, produce racial and gender identities and thus political organization around these identities only serves to reinforce the legitimacy of oppressive discourses—such identities have no reality outside discourse. And, Scott cautions against multiculturalism (recognition of racial, ethnic, or cultural identities), because it “…naturalize[s] identity, making it a matter of biology or history or culture, an inescapable trait…” (1992, 14). Despite their different metaphysical commitments from eliminativists, postmodern feminists and eliminativists alike reject essentialist (naturalizing) approaches in feminist and race theory.

Borrowing a phrase from Susan Bordo (2003), Donna-Dale L. Marcano (2010) characterizes Butler's position as “postmodern gender skepticism,” which has the practical consequence of undermining the conditions African-American women thrive in for collective action against racist institutions and habits. Anika Maaza Mann (2010) illustrates, following Jean-Paul Sartre's Critique of Dialectical Reason, that the wellspring of a unified, collective struggle lies in solidarity that many oppressed groups will readily feel with each other due to common experiences of danger and limitations. And, this solidarity springs from embracing one's marginal identity rather than eliminating it due to its contingent or constructed nature. Maria del Guadalupe Davidson (2010) further stresses that the postmodernist stance on race is coextensive with the modernist project, because it fails to recognize as real, plural identities and thereby plural experiences. When postmodernist feminists take up the identity of black female subjectivity, it is largely to stress their ‘alterity,’ and thus belie the constructed nature of the philosophical project. But drawing attention only to their alterity, Davidson argues, following Hortense Spillers, Barbara Smith, Barbara Christian, and Alice Walker, effectively deprives black women of a voice as well as fails to capture their real, lived experience in the world.

Thus, on the other side of this debate over the reality of race, are the conservationists, who, like Marcano, Davidson and Maaka Mann, argue that not only should we acknowledge the reality of race, but also perhaps preserve it as an important and valuable feature of our social ontology. Kathryn Gines (2003), for example, argues that conserving and preserving a positive concept of racial identity serves as “a source of heritage and even resistance and empowerment” against future possible assaults against the humanity of non-white people striving together for the accomplishment of certain more or less vividly conceived ideals of life (66). Another argument in favor of preserving race as real is that a reconstructed and positively valued notion of race—as was evident in the slogan “Black is Beautiful”—plays an important role in restoring various psychic wounds inflicted by racism and racist ideology. Lewis Gordon (2000), for example, points out blackness and whiteness function as metaphors for pollution and purity, respectively. To represent African Americans as “black,” is not a neutral choice, but designed to conjure up the various imaginary associations of blackness and dirt, darkness, or pollution. So, part of conservation is to associate more self-affirming notions with race, which is consistent with and inspired by earlier existentialist projects of Frantz Fanon and Simone De Beauvoir; conservationists consider the redescription of social ontology as a crucial part of promoting justice and social progress.

3. Limits of a Methodological Approach

The guiding heuristic to this description of continental feminism has been to characterize the work as three different methods—psychoanalysis, postmodernism, and phenomenology—divided between critical (deconstructive) and reconstructive projects. From this point of view, one might reasonably conclude that continental feminists often come to opposing conclusions concerning feminist work. For example, one major debate in continental feminist work is the value of reconstructing the concepts of gender or race (i.e., constructing a positive notion) to improve the status of women and women of color in philosophy and beyond. Those drawn to phenomenology are more likely to endorse such a reconstructive project, while those drawn to postmodern analysis—whether Derridean or Foucauldian—consider the project fatally flawed and argue that the real liberatory work lies in critical (deconstructive) genealogies of contemporary attitudes and practices.

However, the more deeply one reads continental feminist work, the more one recognizes that many theorists are employing all three methods—often within the same work—for different purposes. Very few continental feminists identify exclusively with one method or with one project, but find value in all three methods depending on the particular argument at hand. Thus, the approach in this entry on continental feminism is limited and risks unnecessarily sharpening divisions among continental feminists.

As the field of continental feminism continues to evolve, new hybrid methods will be more clearly discernable that enable a general description of the field that does not artificially divide theorists along methodological, epistemological and metaphysical lines. Until this work more clearly emerges, it is best to see that the methods and basic projects (deconstruction and reconstruction) outlined here is merely a heuristic.


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