Notes to Social Epistemology

1. Many philosophers have held that attitudinal states per se already involve, constitutively, matters of rationality or normativity. That assumption will not be taken on board here.

2. Frederick Schmitt (1994a) also considers the possibility of a reliabilist approach, though without providing details and without explicitly endorsing the idea.

3. In Lackey’s usage the term “deflationary” seems intended to convey the idea that group justification is “reducible” to the justification(s) of its members, and perhaps that the group belief is reducible to the beliefs of its members. But Goldman’s approach rejects both of these theses. Goldman would also presumably agree that some groups are epistemic agents. Hence, Lackey’s label for her own positive view “Group Epistemic Agent Account”, does not mark a contrast with other views in the field.

4. In modern work on CJT (as contrasted with the 18th century version) , the theorem has been shown to hold even when one suitably relaxes the requirement of universal competence at a fixed value greater than 0.50. In particular, the theorem holds if the average competence exceeds 0.50 and different individual competences are distributed symmetrically (Grofman, Owen, and Feld 1983).

Copyright © 2015 by
Alvin Goldman <>
Thomas Blanchard <>

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