Contemporary Approaches to the Social Contract

First published Sun Mar 3, 1996; substantive revision Tue Dec 20, 2011

The idea of the social contract goes back, in a recognizably modern form, to Thomas Hobbes; it was developed in different ways by John Locke, Jean-Jacques Rousseau, and Immanuel Kant. After Kant the idea largely fell into disrepute until it was resurrected by John Rawls. It is now at the heart of the work of a number of moral and political philosophers. The basic idea seems simple: in some way, the agreement (or consent) of all individuals subject to collectively enforced social arrangements shows that those arrangements have some normative property (they are legitimate, just, obligating, etc.). Even this vague basic idea, though, is anything but simple, and even this abstract rendering is objectionable in many ways. To explicate the idea of the social contract we analyze contractual approaches into five variables: (1) the nature of the contractual act; (2) the parties to the act; (3) what the parties are agreeing to; (4) the reasoning that leads to the agreement; (5) what the agreement is supposed to show.

1. The Contractual Act

1.1 Consent and Agreement

The traditional social contract views of Hobbes, Locke, and Rousseau crucially relied on the idea of consent. For Locke only “consent of Free-men” could make them members of government (Locke 1689, §117). Now in the hands of these theorists—and in much ordinary discourse—the idea of “consent” implies a normative power to bind oneself. When one reaches “the age of consent” one is empowered to make certain sorts of binding agreements—contracts. By putting consent at the center of their contracts these early modern contract theorists (1) were clearly supposing that individuals had basic normative powers over themselves before they entered into the social contract (a point that Hume [1741] stressed), and (2) brought the question of political obligation to the fore. If the parties have the power to bind themselves by exercising this normative power, then the upshot of the social contract was obligation. As Hobbes (1651, 81 [chap xiv,¶7) insisted, covenants bind; that is why they are “artificial chains” (1651, 138 [chap. xxi, ¶5). According to James Buchanan, the key development of recent social contract theory has been to distinguish the question of what generates political obligation (the key concern of the consent tradition in social contract thought) from the question of what constitutional orders or social institutions are mutually beneficial and stable over time (1965b). The nature of a person's duty to abide by the law or social rules is a matter of a morality as it pertains to individuals (Rawls 1999, 293ff), while the design and justification of political and social institutions is a question of public or social morality. Thus, on Buchanan's view a crucial feature of more recent contractual thought has been to refocus political philosophy on public or social morality rather than individual obligation.

Although contemporary social contract theorists still sometimes employ the language of consent, the core idea of contemporary social contract theory is agreement. “Social contract views work from the intuitive idea of agreement” (Freeman 2007a, 17). Now one can endorse or agree to a principle without that act of endorsement in any way binding one to obey. Social contract theorists as diverse as Freeman and Jan Narveson (1988, 148) see the act of agreement as indicating what reasons we have. Agreement is a “test” or a heuristic. The “role of unanimous collective agreement” is in showing “what we have reasons to do in our social and political relations” (Freeman 2007, 19). Thus understood the agreement is not itself a binding act—it is not a performative that somehow creates obligation—but is reason-revealing (Lessnoff 1986). If individuals are rational, what they agree to reflects the reasons they have. In contemporary contract theories such as Rawls's, the problem of justification takes center stage. Rawls's revival of social contract theory in A Theory of Justice thus did not base obligations on consent, though the apparatus of an “original agreement” persisted. The aim of the original position, Rawls announced (1999, 16), is to settle “the question of justification … by working out a problem of deliberation.”

The social contract in contemporary moral and political theory is an attempt, then, to solve a justificatory problem by converting it to a deliberative problem. At its heart is the “question of justification.” As James Buchanan points out, “precepts for living together are not going to be handed down from on high” (1975, 3). Justifying social arrangements (showing that they have the requisite normative property, see §5 below) requires showing that all (suitably idealized) citizens have reasons favoring the arrangements. Now this would be an otiose requirement unless, to some extent, the reasons of citizens differed. If all citizens had precisely the same set of reasons there would be no point in showing what they all can agree to. The idea of a unanimous collective agreement only does justificatory work when the reasons of citizens can differ, and so it is an open question what everyone has reason to endorse—what everyone would agree to. Under conditions of reasonable pluralism, we cannot suppose that the reasoning of one member of the public is a proxy for everyone else's reasoning. Consequently, under reasonable pluralism the requirement that every member of the public has reason to endorse a social arrangement is not implied by one member doing so.

1.2 Hypothetical Agreements

Given that the problem of justification has taken center stage, the second aspect of contemporary social contract thinking appears to fall into place: its reliance on models of hypothetical agreement. The aim is to model the reasons of citizens, and so we ask what they would agree to under conditions in which their agreements would be expected to track their reasons. Contemporary contract theory is, characteristically, doubly hypothetical. Certainly, no prominent theorist thinks that questions of justification are settled by an actual survey of attitudes towards existing social arrangements, and are not settled until such a survey has been carried out. The question, then, is not “Are these arrangements presently the object of an actual agreement among citizens?” (If this were the question, the answer would typically be “No”.) The question, rather, is “Would these arrangements be the object of an agreement if citizens were surveyed?” Although both of the questions are, in some sense, susceptible to an empirical reading, only the latter is in play in present-day theorizing. The contract nowadays is always hypothetical in at least this first sense.

There is a reading of the (first-order) hypothetical question “Would the arrangements be the object of agreement if___” which, as indicated, is still resolutely empirical in some sense. This is the reading where what is required of the theorist is that she try to determine what an actual survey of actual citizens would reveal about their actual attitudes towards their system of social arrangements. (This is seldom done, of course; the theorist does it in her imagination. See, though, Klosko 2000). But there is another interpretation that is more widely accepted in the contemporary context. On this reading, the question is no longer a hypothetical question about actual reactions; it is, rather, a hypothetical question about hypothetical reactions—it is, as we have said, doubly hypothetical. Framing the question is the first hypothetical element: “Would it be the object of agreement if they were surveyed?” Framed by this question is the second hypothetical element, one which involves the citizens, who are no longer treated empirically, i.e. taken as given, but are, instead, themselves considered from a hypothetical point of view—as they would be if (typically) they were better informed or more impartial, etc. (see further §2.2 below). The question for most contemporary contract theorists, then, is, roughly:“If we surveyed the idealized surrogates of the actual citizens in this polity, what social arrangements would be the object of an agreement among them?”

Famously, Ronald Dworkin has objected that a (doubly) hypothetical agreement cannot bind any actual person. For the hypothetical analysis to make sense, it must be shown that hypothetical persons in the contract can agree to be bound by some principle P regulating social arrangements. Suppose that it could be shown that your surrogate (a better informed, more impartial version of you) would agree to P. What has that to do with you? Where this second-stage hypothetical analysis is employed, it seems to be proposed that you can be bound by agreements that others, different from you, would have made. While it might (though it needn't) be reasonable to suppose that you can be bound by agreements that you would yourself have entered into if given the opportunity, it seems crazy to think that you can be bound by agreements that, demonstrably, you wouldn't have made even if you had been asked. This criticism is decisive, however, only if the hypothetical social contract is supposed to invoke your normative power to self-bind via consent. That your surrogate employs his power to self-bind would not mean that you had employed your power. Again, though, the power to obligate oneself is not typically invoked in the contemporary social contract: the problem of deliberation is supposed to help us make headway on the problem of justification. So the question for contemporary hypothetical contract theories is whether the hypothetical agreement of your surrogate tracks your reasons to accept social arrangements, a very different issue.

1.3 The Importance of Actuality

It is almost a commonplace today that contemporary social contract theory relies on hypothetical, not actual, agreement. As we have seen, in one sense this is certainly the case. However, in many ways the “hypothetical/actual” divide is artificial: the hypothetical agreement is meant to model, and provide the basis for, actual agreement. Understanding contemporary social contract theory is best achieved, not through insisting on the distinction between actual and hypothetical contracts, but by grasping the interplay of the hypothetical and the actual.

The key here is Rawls's (1996, 28) distinction among the perspectives of:

  1. you and me
  2. the parties to the deliberative model
  3. persons in a well-ordered society

The agreement of the parties in the deliberative model is certainly hypothetical in the two-fold sense we have analyzed: a hypothetical agreement among hypothetical parties. But the point of the deliberative model is to help us (i.e., “you and me”) solve our justificatory problem—what social arrangements we can all accept as “free persons who have no authority over one another” (Rawls 1958, 33). The parties' deliberations and the conditions under which they deliberate, then, model our actual convictions about justice and justification. As Rawls says (1999, 514), the reasoning of the hypothetical parties matters to us because “the conditions embodied in the description of this situation are ones that we do in fact accept.” Unless the hypothetical models the actual, the upshot of the hypothetical could not provide us with reasons. Gerald Gaus describes something like this process as a “testing conception” of the social contract (2011a, 425). We use the hypothetical deliberative device of the contract to “test” our social institutions. In this way, the contemporary social contract is meant to be a model of the justificatory situation that all individuals face. The hypothetical and abstracted (see §2) nature of the contract is needed to highlight the relevant features of the parties to show what reasons they have.

Freeman has recently stressed the way in which focusing on the third perspective—of citizens in a well ordered society— shows the importance of actual agreement in Rawls's contract theory. On Freeman's interpretation, the social contract must meet the condition of publicity. Freeman (2007b:15) writes:

Rawls distinguishes three levels of publicity: first, the publicity of principles of justice; second, the publicity of the general beliefs in light of which first principles of justice can be accepted (“that is, the theory of human nature and of social institutions generally)”; and, third, the publicity of the complete justification of the public conception of justice as it would be on its own terms. All three levels, Rawls contends, are exemplified in a well-ordered society. This is the “full publicity” condition.

A justified contract must meet the full publicity condition: its complete justification must be capable of being actually accepted by members of a well-ordered society. The hypothetical agreement itself provides only what Rawls (1996, 386) calls a “pro tanto” or “so far as it goes” justification of the principles of justice. “Full justification” is achieved only when actual “people endorse and will liberal justice for the particular (and often conflicting) reasons implicit in the reasonable comprehensive doctrines they hold” (Freeman 2007b, 19). Thus understood, Rawls's concern with the stability of justice as fairness, which motivated the move to political liberalism, is itself a question of justification (Weithman, 2010). Only if the principles of justice are stable in this way are they fully justified. Rawls's concern with stability and publicity is not, however, idiosyncratic and is shared by all contemporary contract theorists. It is significant that even theorists such as James Buchanan (2000 [1975], 26-27), David Gauthier (1986, 348), and Ken Binmore (2005, 5-7)—who are so different from Rawls in other respects—share his concern with stability.

2. Modeling the Parties

2.1 Non-moralized v. Moralized Parties

How the contract theorist models the parties to the hypothetical agreement, then, is determined by our (actual) justificatory problem, and what is relevant to solving it. A major divide among contemporary social contract theories thus involves defining the justificatory problem. A distinction is often drawn between the Hobbesian (“contractarian”) and Kantian (“contractualist”) interpretations of the justificatory problem. These categories are imprecise, and there is often as much difference within these two approaches as between them, yet, nevertheless, the distinction is useful in isolating some key disputes in contemporary social contract theory. Among those “contractarians” who—very roughly—can be called followers of Hobbes, the crucial justificatory task is, as David Gauthier puts it, to resolve the “foundational crisis” of morality:

From the standpoint of the agent, moral considerations present themselves as constraining his choices and action, in ways independent of his desires, aims, and interests….And so we ask, what reason can a person have for recognizing and accepting a constraint that is independent of his desires and interests? … [W]hat justifies paying attention to morality, rather than dismissing it as an appendage of outworn beliefs? (Gauthier 1991, 16)

If our justificatory problem is not simply what morality requires, but whether morality ought to be paid attention to, or instead dismissed as a superstition based on outmoded metaphysical theories, then obviously the parties to the agreement must not employ moral judgments in their reasoning. Another version of this concern is Gregory Kavka's (1984) description of the project to reconcile morality with prudence. On both these accounts, the aim of the contract is to show that commitment to morality is an effective way to further one's non-moral aims and interests. The justificatory problem is the problem of satisfactorily answering the question “why be moral?” This “contractarian” project is reductionist in a pretty straightforward sense: it derives moral reasons from non-moral ones. Or, to use Rawls's terminology, it attempts to generate the reasonable out of the rational (1996, 53).

This approach is appealing for several reasons. First, insofar as we doubt that moral reasons are genuine or motivationally effective, such a reductionist strategy promises to ground morality on the prosaic requirements of instrumentalist practical rationality. The justificatory question “why be moral?” is transformed into the less troubling question “why be rational?” Second, even if we recognize that moral reasons are, in some sense, genuine, contractarians like Kavka also want to show that prudent individuals, not independently motivated by morality would have reason to reflectively endorse morality. Furthermore, if we have reason to suspect that some segment of the population is, in fact, knavish then we have good defensive reasons based on stability to build our social institutions and morality so as to restrain those who are only motivated by prudence, even if we suspect that most persons are not so motivated. Anticipating concerns about evolutionary stability (see §4 below) Geoffrey Brennan and James Buchanan argue that a version of Gresham's law holds in political and social institutions that “bad behavior drives out good and that all persons will be led themselves by even the presence of a few self-seekers to adopt self-interested behavior” (2008 [1985], 68). We need not think people are mostly self-seeking to think that social institutions and morality should be justified to and restrain those who are.

On the other hand, “contractualists,” such as John Rawls, John Harsanyi (1977), Thomas Scanlon (1998), Stephen Darwall (2006), and Nicholas Southwood (2010) attribute ethical or political values to the deliberative parties, as well as a much more substantive, non-instrumentalist form of practical reasoning. The kinds of surrogates that model the justificatory problem of ‘you and me’ are already so situated that their deliberations will be framed by ethico-political considerations. The agents' deliberations are not, as with the Hobbesian theorists, carried out in purely prudential or instrumentalist terms, but they are subject to the ‘veil of ignorance’ or other substantive conditions. Here the core justificatory problem is not whether the very idea of moral and political constraints makes sense, but what sorts of moral or political principles meet certain basic moral demands, such as treating all as free and equal moral persons, or not subjecting any person to the will or judgment of another (Reiman 1990, chap. 1). This approach, then, is non-reductionist in the sense that not all of morality is derived from the non-moral. Many of the concerns with this approach to contract theory are related to the particular idealization of the parties that the substantive conception of practical rationality in the contract procedure requires.

2.2 The Level of Idealization and Abstraction

The core idea of social contract theories, we have been stressing, is that the deliberation of the parties is supposed to model the justificatory problem of “you and me.” Now this pulls social contract theories in two opposing directions. On the one hand, if the deliberations of the hypothetical parties are to model our problem and their conclusions are to be of relevance to us, the parties must be similar to us. The closer the parties are to “you and me” the better their deliberations will model you and me, and be of relevance to us. On the other hand, the point of contract theories is to make headway on our justificatory problem by constructing parties that are idealizations of you and me, suggesting that some idealization is necessary and salutary. To recognize that some forms of idealization are problematic does not imply that we should embrace what Gaus has called “justificatory populism” that every person in a society must actually assent to the social and moral institutions in question (Gaus 1996, 130-131). Such a standard would take us back to the older social contract tradition based on direct consent. But, as we saw in §1, modern contract theories are concerned with appeals to our reason, not our self-binding power of consent.

Despite possible problems, there are two important motivations behind idealization of the deliberative parties. First, you and I, as we now are, may be confused about what considerations are relevant to our justificatory problem. We have biases and false beliefs; to make progress on solving our problem of justification we wish, as far as possible, to see what the result would be if we only reasoned correctly from sound and relevant premises. So in constructing the hypothetical parties we wish to idealize them in this way. Ideal deliberation theorists like Habermas (1985) and Southwood (2010), in their different ways, are deeply concerned with this reason for idealization. On the face of it, such idealization does not seem especially troublesome, since our ultimate concern is with what is justified, and so we want the deliberations of the parties to track good reasons. But if we idealize too far from citizens as they presently are—suppose we posit that they are fully rational in the sense that they know all the implications of all their beliefs and have perfect information—their deliberations may not help much in solving our justificatory problems. For example, suppose that hyper-rational and perfectly informed parties would have no religious beliefs, so they would not be concerned with freedom of religion or the role of religion of political decision making. But our problem is that, among tolerably reasonable but far from perfectly rational citizens, pluralism of religious belief is inescapable. Consequently to gain insight into the justificatory problem among citizens of limited rationality, the parties must model our imperfect rationality.

Secondly, social contract theories are pulled towards idealized and abstracted representations of the parties in order to render the choice situation determinate. This goal of determinacy, however, can have the effect of eliminating the pluralism of the parties that was the original impetus for contracting in the first place. In his Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy Rawls tells us that “a normalization of interests attributed to the parties” is “common to social contract doctrines” and it is necessary to unify the perspectives of the different parties so as to construct a “shared point of view” (2007, 226). Here Rawls seems to be suggesting that to achieve determinacy in the contract procedure it is necessary to “normalize” the perspectives of the parties.

The problem, however, is this. Suppose that the parties to the contract closely model you and me, and so they have diverse bases for their deliberations— religious, secular, perfectionist, and so on. In this case it is hard to see how the contract theorist can get a determinate result. Just as you and I disagree, so will the parties. Social contract theorists have sought to generate a determinate result by modeling the parties in a very abstracted way, supposing that they are all centrally concerned with promoting their conception of the good, and insuring that they reason in the same way. Rawls (1999, 121) acknowledges that his restrictions on particular information in the original position are necessary to achieve a determinate result. If we exclude “knowledge of those contingencies which set men at odds … ” then since “everyone is equally rational and similarly situated, each is convinced by the same arguments”(Rawls 1999, 17, 120).

Gaus (2011a, 36-47) has recently argued that a determinative result can only be generated by an implausibly high degree of abstraction, in which the basic pluralism of evaluative standards—the core of our justificatory problem—is abstracted away. Thus, on Gaus's view, modelings of the parties that make them anything approaching representations of you and me will only be able to generate a non-singleton set of eligible social contracts. The parties might agree that some social contracts are better than none, but they will disagree on their ordering of possible social contracts. This conclusion, refined and developed in (Gaus 2011a, Part Two) connects the traditional problem of indeterminacy in the contract procedure with the contemporary, technical problem of equilibrium selection in games (see Vanderschraaf, 2005). A topic we will explore more in §4 below.

It is possible, however, that determinacy may actually require diversity in the perspective of the deliberative parties in a way that Rawls and others like Harsanyi didn't expect. The reason for this is simple, the proof is somewhat complex. Normalizing the perspectives of the parties assumes that there is one stable point of view that has all of the relevant information necessary for generating a stable and determinate set of social rules. There is no reason, antecedently, to think that such a perspective can be found, however. Instead, if we recognize that there are epistemic gains to be had from a “division of cognitive labor” there is reason to prefer a diverse rather than normalized idealization of the parties to the contract (see Weisberg and Muldoon, 2009 and Muldoon 2009). There is reason to conclude that if we wish to discover social contracts that best achieve a set of interrelated normative desiderata (e.g., liberty, equality, welfare, etc.), a deliberative process that draws on a diversity of perspectives will outperform one based on a strict normalization of perspectives (Gaus 2011b). James Buchanan goes even further, eliminating all idealization and normalization of the parties (2000 [1975], 221-222). Although, insofar as Buchanan and other contractarians model the parties as guided solely by the reasoning characteristic of Homo Economicus there is some idealization of the parties in terms of their practical rationality.

3. The Object of Agreement

Social contract theories differ about the object of the contract. In the traditional contract theories of Hobbes and Locke the contract was about the terms of political association. In particular, the problem was the grounds and limits of citizen's obligation to obey the state. In his early formulation, Rawls's parties deliberated about “common practices” (1958). In his later statement of his view Rawls took the object of agreement to be principles of justice to regulate “the basic structure:”

The basic structure is understood as the way in which the major social institutions fit together into one system, and how they assign fundamental rights and duties and shape the division of advantages that arises through social cooperation. Thus the political constitution, the legally enforced forms of property, and the organization of the economy, and the nature of the family, all belong to the basic structure. (Rawls 1996, 258)

For Rawls, as for most contemporary contract theorists, the object of agreement is not, at least directly, the grounds of political obligation, but the principles of justice that regulate the basic institutions of society. Freeman (2007a: 23), perhaps the preeminent student of Rawls, focuses on “the social role of norms in public life.” James Buchanan is concerned with justifying constitutional orders of social and political institutions (2000[1975]). Gauthier (1986), Scanlon (1998), Darwall (2006), Southwood (2010), and Gaus (2011a) employ the contract device to justify inter-personal moral claims. The common thread that runs through all of these contemporary accounts is an idea at the heart of the contract theory, namely that rules and constraints, at whatever level, must be justified to those whom they apply. There is some debate over how to understand this condition (see Gauthier 2003) but some version of it underlies the desire for agreement inherent in the idea of the social contract.

The level at which the object of the contract is described is apt to affect the outcome of the agreement. “A striking feature of Hobbes' view,” Russell Hardin points out, “is that it is a relative assessment of whole states of affairs. Life under one form of government versus life under anarchy” (2003, 43). Hobbes could plausibly argue that everyone would agree to the social contract because “life under government” is, from the perspective of everyone, better than “life under anarchy.” However, if a Hobbesian sought to divide the contract up into, say, more fine-grained agreements about the various functions of government, she is apt to find that agreement would not be forthcoming on many functions. As we “zoom in” (Lister, 2010) on more fine-grained functions of government, the contract is apt to become more limited. If the parties are simply considering whether government is better than anarchy, they will opt for just about any government (including one that funds the arts); if they are considering whether to have a government that funds the arts or one that doesn't, it is easy to see how they may not agree on the former. In a similar way, if the parties are deliberating about entire moral codes, there may be wide agreement that all the moral codes, overall, are in everyone's interests; if we “zoom in” in specific rights and duties, we are apt to get a very different answer.

The point is that the level of agreement on the object of the contract will likely be very different depending on how concretely the contract itself is specified. One way to specify the alternative to the contract so as to make the choice situation more determinate is to think of the alternative to the contract not as an idealized “state of nature” but rather as the status quo. Both Binmore (2005, 5) and Gaus (2011a, 424-446) suggest that the contract procedure can be used as a device to test different sets of rules against the status quo. This is one way to incorporate the insight from Buchanan that when we theorize:

We start from here, from where we are, and not from some idealized world peopled by beings with a different history and utopian institutions. Some appreciation of the status quo is essential before discussion can begin about the prospects for improvements. (2000 [1975], xv)

Binmore, for instance, argues that we should think of the status quo as analogous to the state of nature in traditional contract theories. He makes this explicit in his representation of the contract device as a bargaining problem, making the disagreement point of the bargain (the equivalent of the state of nature) the status quo (2205, 25). To some, this identification of the state of nature with the status quo may seem unduly conservative, but this may be a mistake. Recall that Hardin's complaint against contract theories is that they, in effect, rig the game in favor of a particular outcome by making the disagreement point or state of nature so horrible that almost any alternative will look attractive in comparison. By making the disagreement point the status quo instead of the Hobbesian state of nature, however, agreement will be harder to achieve because, presumably, many will find the status quo attractive. Whether or not this will lead to conservative outcomes depends on the alternatives that are put up against the status quo. It also depends on the nature of the status quo. Each starting point will present new challenges and will likely result in different points of agreement.

Another way to avoid ambiguity is the determination of the object of agreement is to follow Buchanan and, arguably, Gauthier in developing a two-stage contract theory. Buchanan divides his contract procedure into two stages: the constitutional and post-constitutional. The object of the constitutional stage is to develop a system of constraints that will allow individuals to peacefully co-exist, what Buchanan calls the “protective state” (2000 [1975]). The state of nature, for Buchanan, is characterized by both predation and defense. The amount of time one can engage in productive enterprises is decreased because of the need to defend the fruits of those enterprises against those who would rely on predation rather than production. We have reason to contract, according to Buchanan, in order to increase the overall ability of everyone to produce by limiting the need for defense by constraining the ability to engage in predation. Once the solution to the predation-production conflict has been solved by the constitutional contract, members of society also realize that if all contributed to production of various public goods, the productive possibility of society would be similarly increased. This second, post-constitutional stage, involves what Buchanan calls the “productive state”. Each stage is logically distinct though there are causal relationships between changes made at one stage and the efficacy and stability of the solution at the later stage. The distinction between the two stages is analogous to the traditional distinction between commutative and distributive justice. Although these two are often bound up together in contemporary contract theory, one of Buchanan's novel contributions is to suggest that there are theoretical gains to separating these distinct objects of agreement.

4. The Reasoning of the Parties

Suppose we have identified the object of the parties' deliberations: practice, norms, basic institutions, moral codes, etc. Now social contract theories fundamentally differ in whether the parties reason differently or the same. As we have seen (§2.2) in Rawls's contract everyone reasons the same: the collective choice problem is reduced to the choice of one individual. Any one person's decision is a proxy for everyone else. In social contracts of this sort, the description of the parties (their motivation, the conditions under which they choose) does all the work: once we have fully specified the reasoning of one party, the contract has been identified.

The alternative view is that, even after we have specified the parties (including their rationality, values and information), they continue to disagree in their rankings of possible social contracts. On this view, the contract only has a determinate result if there is some uniquely rational or correct way to commensurate the different rankings of each individual to yield a social choice (D'Agostino, 2003). We can distinguish three different commensuration mechanisms.

4.1 Bargaining

As Rawls recognized in his 1958 essay “Justice as Fairness” one way for parties to resolve their disagreements is to employ bargaining solutions, such as that proposed by R.B. Braithwaite (1955). Rawls himself rejected bargaining solutions to the social contract since, in his opinion, such solutions rely on threat advantage and “to each according to his threat advantage is hardly a principle of fairness” (Rawls 1958, 58n). Gauthier, however, famously pursued this approach, building his Morals by Agreement on the Kalai-Smorodinsky bargaining solution (see also Gaus 1990, Ch. IX). Binmore (2005) has recently advanced a version of social contract theory that relies on the Nash bargaining solution, as does Muldoon (2009) while Moehler (2010) relies on a “stabilized” Nash bargaining solution. In addition to Rawls's concern about threat advantage, a drawback of all such approaches is the multiplicity of bargaining solutions, which can significantly differ. Although the Nash solution is most favored today, it can have counter-intuitive implications. Furthermore, there are many who argue that bargaining solutions are inherently indeterminate and so the only way to achieve determinacy is to introduce unrealistic or controversial assumptions (Sugden, 1990, 1991). Similar problems also exist for equilibrium selection in games (see Vanderschraaf 2005 and Harsanyi and Selten 1988) Although appealing to a bargaining solution can give determinacy to a social contract, it does so at the cost of appealing to a controversial commensuration mechanism.

4.2 Aggregation

We might distinguish bargaining from aggregation solutions. Rather than seeking an outcome that (as, roughly, the Kalai-Smorodinsky solution does) splits the difference between various claims, we might seek to aggregate the individual rankings into an overall social choice. Arrow's theorem and related problems with social choice rules casts doubt on any claim that one specific way of aggregating is uniquely rational: all have their shortcomings (Gaus 2008, chap. 5). Harsanyi (1977, chaps. 1 and 2; 1982) develops a contractual theory much like Rawls's. Reasoning behind a veil of ignorance in which people do not know their post-contract identities, he supposes that rational contractors will assume it is equally probable that they will be any specific person. Moreover, he argues that contractors can agree on interpersonal utility comparisons, and so they will opt for a contract that aggregates utility at the highest average (see also Mueller 2003, chap. 26). This, of course, depends on the supposition that there is a non-controversial metric that allows us to aggregate the parties' utility functions. Binmore (2005) follows Harsanyi and Amartya Sen (2009, Chap. 13) in arguing that interpersonal comparisons can be made for the purposes of aggregation, at least some of the time. One of the problems with this approach, however, is that if the interpersonal comparisons are incomplete they will not be able to produce a complete social ordering. As Sen points out, this will lead to a maximal set of alternatives where no alternative is dominated by any other within the set but also where no particular alternative is optimal (Sen, 1997). Instead of solving the aggregation problem, then, interpersonal comparisons may only be able to reduce the set of alternatives without being able to complete the ordering of alternatives.

4.3 Equilibrium

There is a long tradition of thinking of the social contract as a kind of equilibrium. Within this tradition, however, the tendency is to see the social contract as some kind of equilibrium solution to a prisoner's dilemma type situation (see Gauthier, 1986 and Buchanan, 2000 [1975]). Brian Skyrms (1996, 2004) suggests a different approach. Suppose that we have a contractual negotiation in which there are two parties, ordering four possible “social contracts”:

  1. both Alf and Betty hunt stag
  2. both hunt hare;
  3. Alf hunts stag, Betty hunts hare;
  4. Alf hunts hare, Betty hunts stag.

Let 3 be the best outcome, and let 1 be the worst in each person's ranking (Alf's ranking is first in each pair). We thus get Figure 1

  Hunt Stag Hunt Hare
BETTY     Hunt Stag
Hunt Hare
Figure 1: A Stag Hunt

The Stag Hunt, Skyrms argues, “should be a focal point for social contract theory” (2004, 4). The issue in the Stag Hunt is not whether we fight or not, but whether we cooperate and gain, or each go our separate ways. There are two Nash equilibria in this game: both hunting stag and both hunting hare. Alf and Betty, should they find themselves at one of these equilibria, will stick to it if each consults only his or her own ranking of options. In a Nash equilibrium, no individual has a reason to defect. Of course the contract in which they both hunt stag is a better contract: it is Pareto superior to that in which they both hunt hare. The Hare equilibrium is, however, risk superior in that it is a safer bet. Skyrms argues that the theory of iterated games can show not simply that our parties will arrive at a social contract, but how they can come to arrive at the cooperative, mutually beneficial contract. If we have a chance to play repeated games, Skyrms holds, we can learn from Hume about the “shadow of the future”: “I learn to do a service to another, without bearing him any real kindness; because I foresee, that he will return my service, in expectation of another of the same kind, and in order to maintain the same correspondence of good offices with me and with others” (Skyrms 2004, 5). Sugden, along different lines, also suggests that repeated interactions, what he calls “experience” is essential to the determination of which norms of social interaction actually hold over time (1986).

The problem with equilibrium solutions is that, as in the stag hunt game, many games have multiple equilibria. The problem then becomes how to select one unique equilibrium from a set of possible ones. The problem is compounded by the controversies over equilibrium refinement concepts (see Harsanyi and Selten 1988). Many refinements have been suggested but, as in bargaining theory, all are controversial to one degree or another. One of the interesting developments in social contract theory spurred by game theorists such as Skyrms and Binmore is the appeal to evolutionary game theory as a way to solve the commensuration and equilibrium selection problem (Vanderschraaf 2005). What cannot be solved by appeal to reason (because there simply is no determinate solution) may be solved by repeated interactions among rational parties. The work of theorists such as Skyrms and Binmore also blurs the line between justification and explanation. Their analyses shed light both on the justificatory problem—what are the characteristics of a cooperative social order that people freely follow?—while also explaining how such orders may come about.

The use of evolutionary game theory and evolutionary techniques is a burgeoning and exciting area of contract theory. One of the many questions that arise, however, is that of why, and if so under what circumstances, we should endorse the output of evolutionary procedures. Should one equilibrium be preferred to another merely because it was the output of an evolutionary procedure? Surely we would want reasons independent of history for reflectively endorsing some equilibrium. This problem highlights the concern that social contracts that are the product of evolutionary procedures will not meet the publicity condition (§1.3) in the right kind of way. If the publicity condition seems harder to meet, the evolutionary approach provides a powerful and dynamic way to understand stability. Following Maynard Smith, we can see stability as being an evolutionarily stable strategy equilibrium or an ESS (1982). Basically this is the idea that an equilibrium in an evolutionary game where successful strategies replicate at higher rates is stable if the equilibrium composition of the population in terms of strategies is not susceptible to invasion by a mutant strategy. An ESS is an application of the Nash equilibrium concept to populations. A population is evolutionarily stable when a mutant strategy is not a better response to the population than the current mix of strategies in the population. This gives a formal interpretation of Rawls's conception of “inherent stability” and to Buchanan's notion that social contracts should be able to withstand subversion by a sub-population of knaves. This new conception of stability combined with the dynamic nature of evolutionary games provides interesting new ways for the social contract theorist to model the output of the contract.

5. What Does the Contract Show?

Suppose, then, that we have arrived at some social contract. Depending on the initial justificatory problem, it will specify principles (P) that have some normative property (N)— such as justice, morality, authority, obligation, legitimacy, mutual benefit, and so on. But, supposing that the contract has generated principle P with the relevant normative property N, precisely what is shown by the fact that P was generated through the contractual device?

Throughout we have been distinguishing the justificatory problem from the deliberative model. Now the strongest that could be claimed for a contractual argument is that the outcome of the deliberative model is constitutive of both the correct solution of the justificatory problem and that P has N. On this “constructivist” reading of the outcome of the deliberative model, there is no independent and determinate external justification that P has N that the contractual device is intended to approximate, but, rather, that P is the outcome of the deliberative model is the truth-maker for “P has N”. Rawls, along with Gauthier and Buchanan, were attracted to such a reading. Rawls (1999, 104) describes the argument from the original position as invoking “pure procedural justice”—the deliberative situation is so set up that whatever principles it generates are, by the fact of their generation, just. But though Rawls sometimes seemed attracted to this strong interpretation, his considered position is that the outcome of the deliberative model is indicative (not constitutive) of the correct solution to “the question of justification” (1999, 16). We might say that the deliberative model is evidence of the proper answer to the question of justification. However, this is still consistent with Rawls's “constructivism” because the answer to the justificatory problem is constitutive of P’s having N. So we might say that Rawls's two principles are just—simply because they are in reflective equilibrium with the considered judgments of you and me, and that they would be chosen in the original position is indicative of this.

The weakest interpretation of the contract is that the contractual result is simply indicative of the correct answer to the justificatory problem, which itself is simply indicative of the fact that P has N. One could be a “realist,” maintaining that whether P has N is a fact that holds whether or not the contract device generates principle P with N, and independently of whether the correct answer to our justificatory problem (i.e., what we can justify to each other) is that P has N. There is still room for contractualism here, but not “constructivism.” Some, for example, have argued that T.M. Scanlon's theory is actually based on a sort of natural rights theory, where these rights are prior to the contract (Mack 2007). Even if this is correct, Scanlon can be a sort of social contract theorist. The diversity of possible approaches within social contract theory indicates the variety of different uses to which social contract theory can be applied.

6. Conclusion: The Social Contract and Public Justification

The social contract theories of Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau all stressed that the justification of the state depends on showing that everyone would, in some way, consent to it. By relying on consent, social contract theory seemed to suppose a voluntarist conception of political justice and obligation: what is just depends on what people choose to agree to—what they will. Only in Kant (1797) does it become clear that consent is not fundamental to a social contract view: we have a duty to agree to act according to the idea of the “original contract.” Rawls's revival of social contract theory in A Theory of Justice did not base obligations on consent, though the apparatus of an “original agreement” persisted as a way to help solve the problem of justification. As the question of public justification takes center stage (we might say as contractualist liberalism becomes justificatory liberalism), it becomes clear that posing the problem of justification in terms of a deliberative or a bargaining problem is a heuristic: the real issue is “the problem of justification”—what principles can be justified to all reasonable citizens or persons.


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In September 2008, Gerald Gaus became a co-author of this entry for the purpose of maintaining it and keeping it current. In December 2011, Gaus was joined by co-author John Thrasher. Changes introduced in thes and subsequent versions reflect joint modifications to the entry which had been solely authored and maintained by Fred D'Agostino.

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