Brentano's Theory of Judgement

First published Wed Nov 22, 2000; substantive revision Mon Apr 7, 2014

One of Brentano's foremost aims in philosophy was to provide a new foundation for epistemology and logic as two closely related disciplines. He tried to achieve this by a systematic analysis of the mental phenomena involved in attaining knowledge and in drawing inferences. For Brentano knowledge is reached by judgements that are directly or indirectly evident, and logical inferences contribute to our knowledge because they can make a judgement indirectly evident for us. Hence both epistemology and logic rely on a conception of judgements, how they differ from other mental phenomena, and how they are related to each other.

Brentano's view of the nature of judgement differs significantly from other views that can be found in Aristotle, Kant, or Frege. In contrast to Aristotle, Brentano emphasizes the importance of existential judgements with only one term, and claims that predicative judgements are a special case of existential ones. In contrast to Kant, he emphasizes the difference between presentations and judgements, rejecting their unification in the single category “thinking”. In contrast to Frege, he holds that judgements do not require the existence of complete thoughts or propositions which have to be grasped before a judgement is made. It is the mental act of judging, not its object or content, which is the bearer of truth-values. In view of these differences Brentano's theory of judgement has been called existential (non-predicative), idiogenetic (non-reductionist), and reistic (non-propositional).

Today Brentano's theory does not have many adherents. The now dominant view is that propositions or sentences are the objects of belief, and that judgements occur when beliefs are acquired, manifested, or changed. Logical inferences are then defined as relations between propositions or sentences, abstracting from the mental attitudes that go along with them. Although this anti-psychological approach is widely accepted today, there is still an open question concerning the order of explanation: Are beliefs and judgements true because they are directed at true propositions, or should we say that propositions (and sentences) are true because they express true beliefs and judgements? Once this question is raised, Brentano's theory of judgement remains an interesting alternative to the current mainstream in logic and epistemology.

1. The Nature of Judgement

The main elements of Brentano's theory of judgement can be found in chapter 7 and appendix IX of his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (1874, 1911). A more elaborate exposition of his theory is contained in the logic lectures which Brentano held at the University of Wuerzburg (1869–71) and at the University of Vienna (1875–1889). Unfortunately Brentano never realized his plan—announced in the Psychology (p.230n)—to publish his extensive writings on logic. A small selection of his lecture notes, mixed with excerpts from other writings by Brentano and his pupil Franz Hillebrand, has been published posthumously in Die Lehre vom richtigen Urteil (1956). An electronic edition of a complete set of lecture notes (with the number EL 80 in Brentano's literary remains) is available – in a provisional form – at the (see Brentano Archive).

Brentano's leading question was a psychological one: What happens in our minds when we make a judgement? Introspectively it is an act quite similar to making a decision, although its behavioral effects are different. Suppose you are uncertain what to think about the existence of extraterrestrial life. Some data suggest that life exists only on earth, others suggest that there may be intelligent beings somewhere else in the universe. Eventually you may become convinced one way or the other, and you either accept or reject the existence of extraterrestrial life. That is when you judge.

This example illustrates three crucial claims that Brentano makes:

  1. Judgements require that something (some object) is given in presentation, but not that something is predicated of it.
  2. Judgements are either positive or negative, depending on whether the presented object is accepted as existing, or rejected as fictitious or non-existing.
  3. Judgements are most perspicuously expressed in sentences of the form “A exists” or “A does not exist”, where the term “A” denotes the presented object which is also the object of the judgement, and the rest of the sentence indicates its quality.

These three claims form the core of Brentano's theory of judgement: The foundational thesis (1) concerns the relation between judgement and predication, the polarity thesis (2) determines the place of negation in judgements, and the existential thesis (3) determines a canonical form in which all judgements can be expressed. Of course, these claims must be seen in the context of Brentano's overall theory of mental phenomena, in particular in the context of his account of intentionality. This background cannot be discussed here, but it is worth mentioning that the term “object of judgement”, as it is used here, always refers to an entity which is distinct from the judgement itself and not contained in it. It is also assumed that judgements have a content or subject matter, which is not separable from the act itself, and which Brentano originally called the “immanent objectivity of a mental phenomenon”. The content of a judgement must not be conceived as a propositional entity, however, since Brentano explicitly denied that judgements have such entities as their contents. (Complex entities which are not propositional and which are just as ephemeral as the content of a judgement can already be found in Aristotle; see G. B. Matthews, 1982.)

All three of Brentano's claims above were highly controversial among his immediate pupils. We find for instance in Husserl's fifth Logical Investigation an account of judgements which deviates from Brentano in all three respects. According to Husserl judgements are intentional acts with a propositional content directed at proposition-like entities which he calls Sachverhalte. That term had been introduced by another Brentano pupil, Carl Stumpf, as a replacement of Brentano's notion of Urteilsinhalt (judgement content), and triggered an intense debate within the Brentano School. Are states of affairs products of the mind – what Stumpf and Twardowski called ‘Gebilde’ – or are they mind-independent entities? This debate soon overshadowed another crucial question that Brentano had raised. Does the linguistic expression of a judgement immediately reveal what the object of the judgement is? That this is not always the case, is a major concern for Brentano's theory of universal judgements. If one judges, for instance, that all men are mortal, one has first to analyse this judgement to find out that this is a negative judgement in which the object ‘immortal human being’ gets rejected. The introduction of states of affairs eliminates the need for such an analysis and therefore runs contrary to a basic tenet of Brentano's theory. Thus Brentano had a good reason to remain suspicious of all “realist” theories of judgement – including those of Twardowski and Meinong – in which propositional objects play a fundamental role (see Mulligan 1988, Frechette, 2014).

Even though Brentano does not accept states of affairs into his ontology, there is still room in his theory for distinguishing between the content and the object of a judgement. This distinction can be drawn for different reasons regarding different classes of mental states. In the case of presentations, it is natural to draw such a distinction because presentations with different contents may have the same object and because there are presentations of non-existing objects. In the case of judgements, Brentano offers us a different reason, why content and object must be kept apart. The content of a judgement reflects the positive or negative quality of the judgement, while the object remains neutral with respect to the quality of the judgement.

2. The Foundational Thesis and the Judgement/Predication Distinction

The claim that judgements are based on presentations is a commonplace in philosophy, but it is a matter of controversy how this relationship should exactly be spelled out. Traditional logic suggests that two presentations must be involved in every judgement, since a judgement is made when something is attributed or denied of something else. Therefore the sentences that are traditionally used for expressing judgements have the subject-predicate form “S is P” and “S is not P”.

Brentano rejects this traditional view by pointing out that judgements may arise also from a single presentation. (He mentions in a footnote that Aristotle seems to have recognized simple judgements of this form. Psychology p.211n). When someone judges that extraterrestrials exist, he does not connect the notion of extraterrestrial life with the notion of existence. He merely thinks of such beings and accepts their existence, i.e., he has a presentation of such beings and accepts it as a presentation of something existing. Existential judgements are therefore not to be expressed in the subject-predicate form “S is P”, but in the simple form “A exists”, when “A” is a singular term, and “A's exist” or “Some A exist”, when “A” is a general term. As a formal representation of these two kinds of judgements Brentano uses the schemata “A+” and “A−”.

Existential judgements show that predication is not necessary for forming a judgement, but neither is it sufficient according to Brentano. Many philosophers have assumed that a predicative judgement is nothing more than “the putting together of two ideas”—in the case of “S is P”—or “the separating of two ideas”—in the case of “S is not P”. This view is sometimes called the “combinatorial theory of judgement”, and Brentano was not the first to point out the deficiencies of this view. He refers to John Stuart Mill who already denied that judgements arise from a habit of associating or dissociating ideas. What Brentano adds to Mill's criticism is a precise diagnosis of the mistake: the combinatorial theory tries to locate the characteristic feature of a judgement in its content instead of locating it in its quality. When we combine a subject- and a predicate-term we just form a more complex idea which is again the content of a presentation. What is still missing is the qualitative moment of acceptance or rejection (see Psychology, p.221).

Thus Brentano's theory draws a sharp line between judgement and predication in recognizing judgements with a non-predicational content and in taking subjectless sentences at face value. Sentences like “It is raining” or “There is no water on the moon” need not be paraphrased into subject-predicate form along the lines of “The weather is rainy” or “The moon is lacking water”. They directly express a judgement by specifying an object which is given in presentation (rain, water on the moon) and by indicating whether this object is accepted or rejected. (This advantage of Brentano's theory was especially exploited by Marty 1884–1895).

Things get more complicated, however, when Brentano later (in appendix IX of the second edition of the Psychology) introduces so-called “double judgements”. In making a double judgement one first accepts the existence of something, and then adds to this first judgement a second one to the effect that the object, whose existence one already has accepted, either has or lacks some property. According to this refined view, a predication is made not by combining two ideas or presentations, but by combining two judgements.

The introduction of double judgements leaves the analysis of existential judgements intact, since in judging that S exists we do not first accept S as existing and then attribute existence or non-existence to it. However, one can now predicate P of S in two different ways: either by first forming the complex presentation of an object S which is P and then accepting this object, or by first accepting the existence of S and then attributing P to it, thus making the double judgement that S exists and is P. In this latter case too, the attribution of P involves two steps: first the predicate P is connected merely in presentation with object S whose existence has been accepted, and then the object S is accepted once more, but this time together with P as one of its properties. That predication and judgement remain distinct acts also in the case of double judgements can be seen from the following fact: When we imagine a person (perhaps oneself) who is double-judging that S is P, we can disagree with the second part of her judgement, and still form the complex presentation of an S which is P. And conversely, we can form the complex presentation of an S which is P and yet agree with the double judgement that S is not P. (See Psychology, p.295. This point is further elaborated in Terrell 1976).

In its final form Brentano's account of the relation between judgement and predication turns out to be less straightforward than the standard Fregean account with its simple distinction between “grasping a proposition” and “judging it to be true”. At no point did Brentano, however, lose sight of the claim that predication is not essentially connected with judging.

3. The Polarity Thesis and the Judgement/Negation Distinction

According to Brentano's second thesis, judgements are always positive or negative. In this respect they are like preferences and emotional attitudes which are for or against something. Presentations, on the other hand, are neither positive nor negative. They simply present an object to the mind without taking a stance towards it. This happens when we simply see or hear something, or when we imagine something in our phantasy. As long as no judgement is made (and no emotional evaluation and no preference is involved), there is nothing positive or negative about an act of presentation.

This essential difference tends to be overlooked when one uses the single category of “thinking” for both judgements and presentations, as does the Kantian tradition. According to Brentano presentations and judgements are as different from each other as they are different from feelings and acts of will. (Brentano holds the controversial view that feelings and acts of will belong to the same category and that they all involve such a polarity.) The difference between judgements and other mental phenomena is not just external—having to do with the way in which they influence our actions—it is an internal difference lying in the distinctive quality of judgements. Therefore, if one acknowledges that feelings or acts of will form a separate category besides the category of “thinking”, one should accept for the same reason that judgements and presentations form distinct categories as well.

With his polarity thesis Brentano not only dismisses the Kantian tradition, he also rejects a view that Frege made popular, namely that there are no negative judgements. When we deny the existence of something, e.g., the existence of extraterrestrial life, we still accept something as true, Frege would say, namely the negative thought that there are no extraterrestrials. Negation enters the formation of thoughts, it does not divide judgements into positive and negative.

Frege's elimination of negative judgements rests on the assumption that thoughts (or judgement-contents) can be true or false independently of being accepted or rejected, and therefore can also be negated. Brentano does not explicitly discuss this view, but his objection to it seems clear: The polarity between truth and falsity must be grounded in our ability to form opposite judgements. We first have to realize that from two opposing judgements with respect to the same subject matter, one will be true and the other one false. Only then can we understand what it means for a sentence, (a judgement content, a proposition, a thought, or whatever), to be true or false.

Much depends here on how one analyses the terms with which Brentano describes positive and negative judgements: anerkennen (accepting) and verwerfen (rejecting). The ambiguity of these notions inspired Adolf Reinach, a pupil of Husserl, to dismiss the idea that the category of judgement comprises two equally fundamental sub-categories (see Reinach 1911). Like Frege, Reinach thinks that all judgements are positive in quality. Frege defended this view by citing the fact that within logic there is no need for such a division, while Reinach appeals to the nature of judgement to establish this view. His arguments therefore directly engage with the view of Brentano, but even more effectively with the views of other 19th century philosophers like J. Bergmann and W. Windelband who also defended the polarity thesis (see Textor (ed.) 2013).

Reinach's arguments are successful at least in a clarificatory way. They help us to see how one must not understand the notions of ‘accepting’ and ‘rejecting’ in Brentano's theory. As Reinach points out, in common usage these terms denote what he calls ‘social acts’ (now called ‘speech acts’). They are responses either to claims or to “yes/no” questions put forward by another person. If someone asserts that Aristotle was the greatest philosopher ever, I can either accept or reject this statement, and when I say “yes” or “no” to the question, whether this proposition is true, I am responding to the question. These responses are social acts, Reinach points out, and must be sharply distinguished from judgements proper. A judgement is a mental act that precedes such social communicative responses. I first have to make up my mind about who I think was the greatest philosopher, and after making this judgement, I will then respond accordingly to claims and questions made by others. So far, Brentano would have no reason to disagree with that. But Reinach then goes on to argue that the judgements that precede these social responses always have a positive quality. To think that negative judgements are “on all fours” with positive judgements, is to confuse the act of judging with a “polemical” rejection of what others think or say.

In the case of Brentano, this argument has little force since he arrives at the polarity thesis on a quite different route. His starting point is the view that the objects of judgement are non-propositional in nature, comparable to what classical empiricsm calls ‘ideas’. They are objects given in simple or complex presentations. The mind can then ask itself – without engaging yet with others – whether the objects thus presented exist or not, and depending on how it resolves this question, one arrives at a positive or negative judgement. Reinach finds this view utterly incomprehensible. What could it mean to accept or reject an object? And what could it mean to reject objects that do not exist? It seems that Brentano had no good answer to these worries, at least not until he developed his view of the intentional relation as a quasi-relation (see Betti 2013). A more favorable reading of Brentano would grant that the problem of true negative existential judgements requires a special treatment, but allow that such treatment can be given within the confines of Brentano's theory. Basically, Brentano can say that one can reject an object that is presented as if it would exist, and thus form a true negative existential judgement.

There is nothing in Reinach's argument that could dismantle Brentano's view so far. He simply changes the starting point by assuming – with Husserl – that the objects of judgements are states of affairs. Since these are propositional entities, it is natural to assume that there are both positive and negative states of affairs – e.g. the state of affairs that Aristotle was not the greatest philosopher ever. Negative judgements can then easily be converted into positive ones whose objects are negative state of affairs. From Brentano's point of view, this whole argument amounts to a petitio principii. If one believes in negative judgements, one will of course reject its very first premise that the objects of judgements are states of affairs.

While Reinach's argument is not successful against Brentano's view, it does highlight an important feature of his theory. The terms ‘accepting’ and ‘rejecting’, as Brentano uses them, are technical terms that do not carry the same meaning as in ordinary discourse. They neither signify the social acts we commonly associate with these terms, nor do they signify the acknowledging of some good or the rejection of some disvalue. Brentano criticises such an evaluative interpretation sharply in his response to Windelband (see Brentano 1889). Since Brentano takes judgements to be a basic category of mental acts, he allows himself to use the terms ‘accepting’ and ‘rejecting’ in a distinctive sense that is irreducible to any ordinary meaning of these ambiguous terms. The best way to understand the meaning of these terms is to compare judgements with mental decisions about what exists and what does not exist. Judgements are like acts of the will – as Descartes suggested – but they are not reducible to the will according to Brentano.

At this point, one might still ask what positive reason there is to hold on to the polarity thesis. Modern “rejectivists” like Bendall, Smiley, and Rumfitt believe in propositional entities and argue for negative judgement in terms of its usefulness for logic (see Bendall 1978; Smiley 1996; Rumfitt 2000). A more difficult task is to argue against the assumption of states of affairs (or some other propositional entities) on the ground that intensional entities are ontologically precarious entities (see Leclercq 2013). However, there is a further problematic issue lurking in the background here. Where does the opposition between the two truth-values ‘true’ and ‘false'come from? Those who accept propositional objects in their ontology tend to agree with Frege that it is a completely objective fact of the matter whether a thought is true or false (ignoring vagueness, context-sensitivity, etc). Thoughts, in the Fregean sense, are true or false independently of whether there is anyone judging them to be true or false. Although Brentano does not explicitly discuss this view, it is noteworthy that his theory has the resources to reject it without lapsing into a form of relativism. If we want to understand what ‘truth’ or ‘falsity’ mean, and why they are opposed to each other, we have to think of a mind that faces a decision between a positive and a negative judgement on the same matter. This mind need not be a finite human mind. Brentano refers here to the infinite mind of God and thus prevents truth and falsity from being tied to the restrictions of the human mind.

4. Negative Concepts

Brentano's treatment of negation has further ramifications. If the act of negation is conceived of as a basic form of judgement and the ultimate ground for our understanding of truth and falsity, then the question arises what one should say about negative concepts, e.g. the concept ‘not great’. It might seem that one can form such concepts prior to engaging in an act of judgement, hence also prior to forming a negative judgement. But can one form such negative concepts merely by thinking of an object that appears not to be great, without judging about its greatness?

In Brentano's mature theory, the formation of such concepts requires a higher-order mental operation. We do not form such concepts by removing an attribute – e.g. greatness – from an object, leaving behind, so to speak, the ‘lack of greatness’ as a new attribute. Rather, when we form such concepts we think of a mind that denies the greatness of an object. If such denial is correct, we can express this by saying that something is ‘not-great’. In this way, negative concepts can be formed by reflecting on acts of negative judgement. Brentano's doctrine of reism, according to which only individual things exist, heavily makes use of this kind of analysis (see Körner 1978).

Brentano's treatment of syllogistic logic provides a test-case for his analysis of negative concepts. Here he shows how the use of negative concepts can be completely eliminated from the four types of categorical judgements. Initially, Brentano paraphrased these judgements in existential form as follows:

(I) Some S are P There is an S which is P
(E) No S is P There is no S which is P
(O) Some S are not P There is an S which is a non-P
(A) All S are P There is no S which is a non-P

The negation in E-judgements poses no problem: it properly indicates that a negative judgement is made. The negative concept “non-P” used in the paraphrases of O- and A-judgements is more problematic. Here a negation enters at the level of presentations, not at the level of judgement, as the polarity thesis requires.

A more complicated analysis is required to get around this difficulty. In the case of O-judgements the introduction of double judgements will help. It then turns out that an O-judgement does not consist in predicating non-P of S, but in first accepting S and then making a negative judgement to the effect that S is not P, i.e., a judgement that denies the application of P to S. This still leaves the A-judgements as a problem case. At this point Brentano again invokes a higher-level presentation, namely the presentation of someone whose judgements are evaluated as right or wrong. With these additional tools at hand, Brentano arrives at the following analysis of the four categorical judgements (see Psychology, pp.295–298):

(I) Some S are P There is an S and that S is P
(E) No S is P There is no one who correctly judges “Some S is P
(O) Some S are not P There is an S and that S is not P
(A) All S are P There is no one who correctly judges “Some S are not P

All negations here indicate that a negative judgement is made. This vindicates the claim that the polarity between positive and negative judgements is basic and provides the distinguishing mark that separates judgements from presentations. Brentano admits, however, that for practical reasons it may be convenient to use negative concepts, e.g., for simplifying inferences. When one does so, one should keep in mind however that these concepts do not properly pick out objects of presentation. Along these lines one could also justify the use of propositional clauses and thereby avoid all the complications of the existential analysis; but Brentano does not seem to have considered this more radical simplification (see Psychology, p.299).

5. The Existential Thesis

Brentano's third thesis says that all simple judgements (that involve only a simple act of judging) can be expressed in sentences of the form “A exists” or “A does not exist” (or “A's exist” and “A's do not exist” respectively). This thesis marks the contrast to all propositional theories of judgement. Propositional theories assume that a complete sentence (or a that-clause) is needed for expressing the content of a judgement. That a proposition (or sentence) is actually accepted, i.e., that a judgement is made, must therefore be indicated by an additional sign—like Frege's judgement-stroke—or it remains implicit in the assertive use of a declarative sentence.

On Brentano's theory, by contrast, only a simple or complex term is needed to express the content of a judgement, and hence a complete sentence can express both the content and the quality of a judgement. In making this claim, Brentano relies on the distinction between categorematic and syncategorematic expressions, i.e., between terms that purport to denote entities, and expressions like “is”, “and”, “or”, etc. that do not. The former specify the content of a judgement, whereas the latter are used for specifying its quality. This distinction also applies to sentences of the form “A exists”. Here the “exists” does not purport to denote anything—the property of existence—rather it indicates which judgement is made: A positive judgement in present tense in the case of “A exists (now)”, a negative judgement in the present tense in the case of “A does not exist now”, a positive judgement in the past tense in the case of “A existed”, a negative apodictic judgement in the case of “A does necessarily not exist”, etc.

Brentano also introduces two special signs to separate those sentence parts that specify the content of a judgement from those that specify its quality. As already mentioned, he uses the sign “A+” to express the positive judgement that A exists, and the sign “A−” to express the negative judgement that A does not exist. These signs remind one of Frege's judgement stroke, but the theory behind them is quite different. Two important differences should be noted here:

Firstly, “A+” is not be read as “it is accepted that A exists”. This would suggest that the sign “+” functions as a sign of affirmation expressed by the operator “it is accepted that”, while the term “exists” expresses part of the content of the judgement. The whole point of Brentano's theory is that the term “exists” is syncategorematic and merely expresses the quality of the judgement. “A” alone must therefore express the whole (non-propositional) content. This also tells against a suggestion made by Arthur Prior, namely to read “A exists” as “Something is A”. It is not enough to treat “existence” as a second-level predicate to avoid the misinterpretation that it contributes to the content of the judgement (see Prior 1976, p.115).

Secondly, “A−” should not be read as “the existence of A is rejected”. This would suggest that there is a difference between “the existence of A is rejected” and “the non-existence of A is accepted”, and equally between “A is rejected as existing” and “A is accepted as non-existing”. Brentano's theory leaves no room for such distinctions. Otherwise it would reduce to the (non-controversial) claim that all categorial judgements are expressible in the form of existential propositions. Brentano's much stronger claim is that no propositions at all are accepted in such judgements, not even existential ones.

What, then, is the best way to read the formulas “A+” and “A−”? There is no better way than reading them as “A exists/does not exist” or as “A is accepted/rejected”. Whatever term we use for the symbols “+” and “−”, they will have no specific meaning beyond their function of indicating the quality of the judgement expressed.

Having noted these differences between Brentano's and Frege's symbolism, one may wonder whether Brentano really has a consistent theory here.

One problematic fact is that it is unclear how to interpret the formulas “A+” and “A−” when they are not used, but merely mentioned. When such a formula is quoted, the expression “A” is still meaningful and expresses the content of a judgement, but the signs “+” and “−” become completely idle. This, of course, is also true of Frege's judgement stroke, which loses its function when it is not used to make an assertion.

However, there seems to be a further difficulty that is peculiar only to Brentano's symbols. Whereas Frege's judgement-stroke is added to complete sentences, Brentano's symbols are parts of complete sentences. But every complete sentence can be used without expressing a judgement, for instance as the antecedent or consequent of a conditional. There is no obstacle in forming the complex judgement “If A exists, then B does not exist”, and yet we cannot symbolize it as “If A+, then B−”. Apparently, then, the term “exist” is not (or not merely) an indicator of the judgement-quality, as Brentano would have it. (This objection was raised in Geach 1965.)

In dealing with this objection one might appeal to Brentano's own treatment of conditional (or hypothetical) judgements. He reduces them to single existential judgements with a complex object. Thus, a judgement of the form “If A exists, then B does not exist” gets analysed as “An A together with a B does not exist”, where “A together with B” denotes the complex object which is rejected (see Psychology p.299; see also Lehre p.123).

But there is more to Geach's objection. It shows that on Brentano's theory the term “exists”, like the copula “is”, can be used in two different ways. It can either be used to express a judgement or to talk about a judgement made by someone (possibly by oneself). We have already seen how Brentano uses this distinction for separating judgement and presentation, and for analysing A-judgements without invoking negative concepts. He also needs to make use of this distinction when it comes to conditional judgements. The judgement “If A exists, then B does not exist” might then be analysed as “It is impossible correctly both to accept A and to reject B”, which can be expressed in existential form as “Someone who can correctly accept A and reject B does not exist”. (This analysis is suggested in Chisholm 1982, p.36).

In this way Brentano's theory of judgement may be applicable to a wider range of complex judgements (see Pasquarella 1987). Even if these extensions are rejected as unnecessarily complicated, Brentano's existential analysis offers a viable alternative to the propositional theory for basic kinds of judgements, like the ones used in syllogistic. This may not be very significant from the point of view of modern logic, which does not distinguish between basic and non-basic judgements in this way, but it may have a considerable ontological significance. Brentano's theory shows how a commitment to propositional entities can be avoided at least within certain limits. Entities like “propositions”, “states of affairs”, “facts”, “Meinongian objectives”, etc. might be introduced for convenience, but they need not be taken ontologically seriously. Any stronger commitment to such entities remains dubious. It is for this reason that Brentano came to reject the correspondence theory of truth. Judgements are true, according to his existential thesis, because certain entities exist (or do not exist), not because certain entities “correspond” to our judgements. (Advocates of a correspondence theory have criticized Brentano precisely for this reason. See Schlick 1925, pp.60ff and 176ff).

6. The Reform of Logic

In the second half of the 19th century logic freed itself from the constraints of the Aristotelian tradition. This move is often linked with the demise of “psychologism”, the view that logic needs to be based on psychology. Mathematical logicians like Bolzano and Frege established modern logic as a strictly non-psychological, “objective” discipline. From this point of view Brentano appears as one of the last advocates of the “old logic”, and his theory as a final attempt at providing a psychological foundation for logic.

Brentano's plan of reforming logic in accordance with his theory of mental phenomena is a highly ambitious project. This becomes clear when we compare his project with the much more modest attempt to integrate Brentano's theory of mental phenoma with the now standard Fregean conception of judgement. This modest attempt would grant Frege's point that negative judgements are superfluous for the purposes of logic, while at the same time accepting Brentano's view that, when it comes to the classification of mental phenomena, negative judgments play a fundamental role. Such a hybrid view may be consistent, but there is price to pay for it. It follows from it that “how we think, and how the mental acts we perform in doing so, may not be faithfully reflected in the logic” (Textor, 2013, 573). Brentano was not ready to pay this price. The point of his “psychologism” was that logic should represent inferences in the very same way in which they occur in a mind that reasons with evidence. The proper analysis of logical inferences therefore needs a psychologica “guideline”, which is provided by an accurate description of evident reasoning processes.

In pursuing this project, Brentano expected very little form the rising “mathematical logic”, as he found it in the writings of George Boole (see Psychology, Appendix X). It is surprising that despite this deep disagreement about Psychologism, there is still substantial common ground left between Brentano and Frege. Of course, neither of them was aware that they converged on the following three points: (1) judgement is distinct from predication, (2) existence is not a first-level predicate, (3) logical analysis must penetrate the linguistic expressions which often disguise the form of our judgements. But this is not all. There is even more agreement between Brentano and modern logic when one compares them with the old syllogistic logic.

This further convergence becomes visible when one considers Brentano's criticism of the traditional square of opposition. This square is made up of the four categorial judgements (A) (“All S are P”), (E) (“No S are P”), (I) (“Some S are P”), and (O) (“Some S are not P”), among which the following relations have been claimed to hold:

  1. (A) contradicts (O), and vice versa.
  2. (E) contradicts (I), and vice versa.
  3. (A) and (E) can be false but not true together (= law of contrariety)
  4. (I) and (O) can be true but not false together (= law of subcontrariety)
  5. (A) implies (I) (= subalternation)
  6. (E) implies (O) (= subalternation)
  7. (I) converts into “Some P are S” (simple conversion)
  8. (E) converts into “No P is S” (simple conversion)
  9. (A) converts into “All non-P are non-S” (conversion by contraposition)
  10. (O) converts into “Some non-P are not non-S” (conversion by contraposition)

Brentano rejects almost all of these claims. After translating the categorical judgements into existential form (leaving aside double-judgements for the moment), he reaches the following conclusions:

(i) and (ii) are the only logical relationships correctly identified by traditional logic.

(iii) to (vi) are mistaken: If S is an empty term, both (A) and (E) are true, and both (I) and (O) are false.

(vii) and (viii) are correct, but not because of a conversion of one judgement into another, but only because one judgement is expressed in two ways.

(ix) and (x) are correct, but no contraposition is needed; only a simple conversion is used.

All these results emerge from one major shift in the underlying theory of judgements: Traditional logic takes (A) and (I) to be positive judgements, and (E) and (O) to be negative ones. According to Brentano all universal judgements (both (A) and (E)) are negative and therefore lack any existential import, whereas all particular judgements (both (I) and (O)) are positive and have such import. Once this “mistake” is corrected, most of the traditional disputes about their logical relationships become obsolete. This is why Brentano said that his theory “leads to nothing less than a complete overthrow, and at the same time, a reconstruction of elementary logic. Everything then becomes simpler, clearer, and more exact” (Psychology p.230). (For a critical survey of Brentano's logic reform see Prior 1962, pp.166ff. and Simons 1987).

When we compare Brentano's results with the doctrines of modern logic, we see that they are in complete agreement concerning (i)–(vi). With respect to (vii) and (x) there is at least no major disagreement. It is still acceptable to say that the simple conversion of terms is only a change in the linguistic expression of a judgement, not in the judgement itself, and the same can be said about the conversion of an A-judgement. Here, too, no contraposition is needed, since in predicate logic an A-judgement can be either expressed as an implication or a negated conjunction.

One can see from this comparison that Brentano's reform of logic was not as conservative as it is sometimes described. Wayne Martin, for instance, sees it as no more than a strategy for capturing a limited set of traditionally warranted inferences “by systematically translating or transposing the classically recognized forms.” (Martin 2006, 69). In fact, however, Brentano exhibits many of these inferences as invalid and offers reasons for accepting just those that are validated by the standards of modern logic.

Why is it then that Brentano's logic reform appears to be rather modest from a contemporary perspective? A possible explanation can be found in its underlying semantic theory. While Frege treated complete sentences as a basic unit of significance, for Brentano the basic unit of significance are singular and general terms. This focus on terms, rather than sentences, makes Brentano's logic semantically conservative. Even so, logical rigor can be achieved also within this framework. Following a suggestion by Peter Simons, one may regard Brentano's reformed logic “a sensible and pedagogically accessible approach to term logic” that is—“with a little tidying up”—“fully amenable to the most rigorous mathematical treatment.” (Simons 2004, 46).

7. Fictional Discourse as a Test Case

A special topic of logical theory is the analysis of sentences – or judgements—that involve empty terms. In modern predicate logic, problems with empty terms arise primarily from the use of singular terms like “the fountain of youth” or “the Loch Ness monster” that refer to nothing or at least to no real object. In a term logic, as envisaged by Brentano, both singular and general terms can give rise to such difficulties when their denotation is empty. Hence, a wider range of judgements, including general judgements about unicorns and golden mountains, require a special treatment. The following remarks are intended to show what Brentano's theory might contribute to this task, and which objections it has to face.

Let us first consider simple negative existential judgements. These are the simple judgements that Brentano formalizes as ‘A-’, where ‘A’ can be either a singular or a general term. Examples would be: ‘The fountain of youth does not exist’ or ‘Unicorns do not exist’. The first point one can make here on behalf of Brentano's theory is that it offers a possible definition of what it means for a term to be empty: it means that ‘A-’ is a correct judgement. Denying the existence of an object is thereby taken to be a primitive mental act, parallel to the affirmation of its existence.

One might suspect that with such a definition Brentano is simply hiding the basic problem that empty terms raise, namely how non-existent objects can enter a semantic or epistemic relation. Given that unicorns cannot be observed, how can we think about them? One might go even further and criticize Brentano for making this problem worse by introducing the principle which I have called his ‘foundational thesis’. According to this principle, to make a judgement means to judge about an object that is given in presentation. But if something is given in presentation, this already implies that the presented object exists at least as an immanent object in our minds. So how can one legitimately deny its existence? 

In order to sort out this confusion, we need to observe that the term ‘object’ is used by Brentano in a narrower and in a wider sense. When Brentano explains in his Psychology that every mental phenomenon “includes something as object within itself” (Brentano 1995, p. 88), he is using the term ‘object’ in a technical sense for those objects that exist in our minds whenever we entertain a thought or idea. In its broader sense, the term ‘object’ refers to everything we can think about or make judgements about, including all ordinary objects that we believe to exist, and even objects that we believe not to exist. Now, in which sense do we have to interpret this term, as it is used in the foundational thesis? It is quite clear, I think, that Brentano uses the term here in its broadest possible sense. The possibility of making correct negative existential judgements shows that we can make judgements about objects that do not exist. This means that objects, which do not exist, can nevertheless be present to our minds. The foundational thesis is therefore not to be taken as a claim about mental objects that exist whenever we think about anything. These objects could not be objects of a correct negative existential judgement. That point is highlighted in Brentano's theory.

Let us now turn to judgements with empty terms that include a predication, e.g. the judgement ‘All unicorns are four-legged’. In predicate logic, this judgement is interpreted as saying that if something is a unicorn, it has four legs. That can be true even though unicorns do not exist. For the same reason, one might suggest that the same holds for judgements with empty singular terms. For instance, it is true that if something is identical with the Loch Ness monster, then it lives in Scotland. Hence the judgement ‘The Loch Ness monster lives in Scotland’ can be true as well. But intuitions are divided at this point. Some would insist that a singular statement of the form ‘Fa’ cannot be true, if ‘a’ is an empty singular term, because an object that does not exist can not have any properties. This conflict of intuitions is readily explained in Brentano's theory with his notion of double-judgement. In denying that a judgement about a non-existent object could be true, one actually thinks of judgements of the form ‘A exists and it is B’. These judgements commit us to the existence of A, and therefore are necessarily false if that commitment is broken. This is not the case with simple judgements of the form ‘A is B’. Since they carry no commitment to the existence of A, the judgement ‘The Loch Ness monster lives in Scotland’ can be true on such an interpretation.

Again, one might suspect that Brentano's solution is hiding a deeper problem here. Wayne Martin has raised a puzzle for Brentano's theory that nourishes this suspicion (see Martin 2006, 69). Martin uses the example ‘Cyclops are monocular’ for illustrating his puzzle, but the unicorn-example will serve the purpose as well. As we have seen, Brentano translates it as a complex negative existential judgement of the form ‘There are no S which are not-P’. But if ‘S’ is an empty term, any judgement of this form will be true no matter what we put in place of the predicate term ‘P’. Given that there are no unicorns, there are neither unicorns that are four-legged, nor unicorns with n legs, whatever number we take n to be. By applying Brentano's scheme of translation once more, we arrive at the conclusion that all of the following judgements are true: ‘Unicorns have no legs’, ‘Unicorns have one leg’, ‘Unicorns have two legs‘, etc. That is puzzling.

Fortunately, the problem that Martin raises here is not fatal to Brentano's theory. It is just another case that proves the importance of his distinction between simple and double- judgements. Let us see how Martin's objection can be dissolved by employing this distinction. To start with, the judgement ‘All unicorns have four legs’ has to be analyzed as a double-judgement as follows:

  1. There is no one who can correctly assert ‘Some unicorns are not four-legged’.

Next we have to consider how the embedded judgement ‘Some unicorns are not four-legged’ should be interpreted. Taken as another double-judgement, it would be equivalent to:

  1. There are unicorns which are four-legged.

Since there are no unicorns, (2) is false, and since no one can correctly assert something false, (1) is true on this interpretation. However, we do not need to invoke a double-judgement interpretation for the embedded judgement at this point. We can get the same result if we replace (2) by the simple judgement:

  1. Some unicorns are not four-legged.

This judgement is also false, because according to mythology unicorns are four-legged animals. Since mythology is authoritative in this matter, nobody can correctly assert (3), which means that (1) is still true.

How then can Brentano make room in his theory for false judgements of the form ‘All S are P’, where S is an empty term? This is the challenge raised by Martin's puzzle. Let us therefore consider the intuitively false judgement ‘All unicorns are one-legged’. To start with, we have to analyze it as a double-judgement like (1):

  1. There is no one who can correctly assert ‘Some unicorns are not one-legged’.

In this case, however, it makes a difference whether we analyze the embedded judgement as a double-judgement or as a single judgement. In the first case, the embedded judgement—like (2) –  comes out as false, and (4) would be true, as Martin predicts. But if we analyze the embedded judgement in (4) as a simple judgement, we get a different result because mythology tells us that the following judgement is true:

  1. Some unicorns are not one-legged.

This is the interpretation we have to choose to save our intuitions. Since (5) is true, (4) is false. Translating this back into standard form, we get the intuitively correct result: The judgement ‘All unicorns are one-legged’ is false.

In putting Brentano's theory of judgement to a test in this area, it becomes clear why judgements about non-existent objects raise special difficulties for philosophical logic. A possible objection could only be that Brentano's theory is unnecessary complicated. There is reason however to think that judgements about non-existent objects have a “deep structure” that is more complex than what their surface appearance reveals. So it is not quite unreasonable to make use of Brentano's theory in uncovering this hidden complexity in judgements about non-existent objects.

8. Prospects for Future Research

There is a continued and lively interest in Brentano's philosophy, including his theory of judgement. A number of recent publications provide useful guidelines to those issues that invite further exploration. The ongoing research on these matters can be roughly divided into two areas: historical investigations and systematic treatments.

From a historical perspective, the overall goal is to depict as completely as possible the historical context in which Brentano's theory has to be located. There are several strands here that need to be woven together. There is the classical model of the so-called ‘combinatorial theory of judgements’ whose inadequacy Brentano tried to prove. As this model came under general attack in the 19th century,  Brentano's reaction to it can be fruitfully compared with similar attempts by his contemporaries (see Schmit 1985, Martin 2006). A specific strand in this history is formed by theories making use of abstract objects corresponding to complete sentences. Here Brentano's theory stands out as an opponent that eschews such objects in its ontology. The debate about his so-called ‘reism’ divided Brentano's pupils and became a formative element in the  so-called Austrian tradition of philosophy in which Brentano plays the counterpart to Bolzano (see Rojszczak & Smith 2003, Rollinger 2004). Connected with that tradition is also the Lvov-Warsaw School, founded by Brentano's pupil Kazimir Twardowski. Here the influence of Brentano's theory of judgement can be traced in the work of Kotarbinski, Lesniewski and perhaps even of Tarski (see Simons 1984, Rojszczak 2006). Finally, there is the strand of phenomenological writings, which take their inspiration from Husserl and therefore indirectly from Brentano. Dissatisfaction with each of the central elements of Brentano's theory of judgement has been a motive in this tradition to explore alternative routes in analyzing the relation between presentations and judgements, the polarity of positive and negative judgements, and the special role of existential judgements (see Husserl 2009, Reinach 1911, Heidegger 1913; Schuhmann 1998).

From a systematic point of view, the main question remains why one should adopt Brentano's theory instead of following the mainstream view that in judging we acquire beliefs with a propositional content. Several possible routes can be explored here.

As mentioned before, in philosophical logic so-called ‘rejectivists’ have revived the view that judgements come in two qualities: positive or negative, (see also H. Price (1990), L. Humberstone 2000, and P. Gibbard 2002.) While there is an obvious continuity here with Brentano's position, there are also important differences to be noted. The major point of agreement consists in the claim that rejection is not only a real psychological phenomenon, but has also logical significance. The agreement stops, however, when contemporary philosophers explain the act of rejection on the model of speech acts that constitute a disagreement with other persons. Brentano had a strictly individualistic conception of the nature of judgement. He would explain the dialectic of social agreement and disagreement in terms of the more basic duality built into the nature of judgement, not the other way round.

Another avenue is opened up by the claim that accepting a proposition is a reflective mental operation that involves more than just believing something to be the case (see Cohen 1992). Accordingly, the basic act of belief-formation might be a process that is more adequately explained by a non-propositional theory following Brentano's lines. A related issue that invites further inquiry is the relation between the intentional character of mental phenomena and the nature of judgement. Brentano's explanation of intentionality is often criticized as being confused and incomplete. This criticism overlooks that his theory of judgement may hold the key for resolving some of the problems that his account of intentionality creates (see Chrudzimski 2001). An equally large area of research is opened up by the relation between the concepts of judgement and truth. Brentano used his theory of judgement in arguing against the classical correspondence theory of truth, replacing it by an epistemic account (see Wolenski 1989). In contemporary terms, Brentano's strategy may be reconstructed as defining truth along deflationist lines, while proposing an epistemic criterion for separating true and false judgements (see Parsons 2004). Finally, it is noteworthy that Brentano's theory of judgement draws a close parallel between the correctness of our judgements and the correctness of our emotional attitudes, which could be taken as a starting point for exploring how epistemic and moral virtues are connected.


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