Notes to William David Ross

1. This entry focuses mainly on Ross's engagement with ideal utilitarianism.

2. In RG, Ross argues that what we are obliged to do is a certain act; that is, we are obliged to bring about a certain state of affairs, e.g., that a friend receives a book one promised to send her (RG 42–46). However, he changed his mind about this in FE, where he argues (following Prichard 1932) that what we obliged to do is to set ourselves to do something rather than bring about a state of affairs (FE 108, 153–154, 160–161).

3. Ross argues that pleasure is only prima facie good because some pleasures, e.g., those taken in lust or in cruelty, are bad (RG 136–137).

4. In FE, he describes justice as a situational good: it does not involve ‘activities or enjoyments resident in individuals, but would involve relations between individuals’ (FE 286).

5. Ross notes that as a mere condition of the intellect knowledge is not better than pleasure. An instance of knowledge is better than an instance of pleasure only in the event that it is ‘to some extent the actualization of a desire for knowledge’ (RG 151). This desire is virtuous and so makes the knowledge better than the pleasure (RG 152).

6. In the case of pleasure, there are other reasons for thinking that it is not worthy of admiration, namely, that pleasant experiences are not admirable like virtue and intellectual activity and that one is not considered admirable in respect of feeling pleasure, though one is in respect of behaving virtuously and in respect of intellectual activity (FE 271).

7. Initially, Ross thought that all innocent pleasures were good, including one’s own, and that we ought to promote them (RG 24–26). In FE, denies that we have reason to promote our own pleasure.

8. Stratton-Lake suggests that if both pleasure and virtue are non-instrumentally valuable, they would be on the same scale (2002a, 129n54). This is precisely what Ross denies. In RG, Ross thought that virtue and pleasure were on the same scale, though virtue was (somehow) higher up on the scale than pleasure could ever reach (RG 150; FE 275). However, he rejected this view in FE (FE 180, 275, 283). He argues that they are not valuable in the same way and so not on the same scale.

9. Stratton-Lake (2002 xlii, n.51) argues that it is ‘unclear’ how Ross can ‘believe that pleasure is good in any sense and avoid the conclusion that we have a prima facie duty to promote our own pleasure.’ But given the distinction between goods that Ross draws in FE it is clear: my own pleasure is not from my point of view an object worthy of satisfaction therefore I have no reason or responsibility to promote it.

10. In his discussion of the idea that it is right to take satisfaction in a promise being kept he is careful not to say that promise keeping is good: indeed, he thinks that it is right to take satisfaction in this because it is an instance in which a duty is discharged, not a good promoted (FE 289).

11. This seems to be the view he held in OJ; see 119, 123. He does, note, appear to rely on a different view of justice (OJ 123).

Copyright © 2012 by
Anthony Skelton <>

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