Notes to Skepticism

1. For an interesting discussion of rejecting or neutralizing the skeptic's objections, see Lehrer 2000, 131–136.

2. Wittgenstein 1969. In paragraph 519, he writes:

Doubt itself rests only on what is beyond doubt… But since a language-game is something that consists in the recurrent procedures of the game in time, it seems impossible to say in any individual case that such-and-such must be beyond doubt if there is to be a language-game—though it is right enough to say that as a rule some empirical judgment or other must be beyond doubt.

3. Peter Unger's view is an exception. He directs the attack on the psychological condition which he takes to be required for knowledge, namely certainty. He thinks very little, if anything, is such that we are certain of it since “certainty” is an absolute term. Further, he claims that since “certainty” is an absolute term, if we are more (nearly) certain of x than we are of y, y cannot be something about which we are certain. And virtually everything is such that we are more (nearly) certain of something else. See Unger 1975.

4. There is no term readily available. A natural one would be “cognitivist” but that term already has a very specific application in ethics. “Cognitist” just strikes my ears as cacophonic.

5. Sextus Empiricus, Outlines of Pyrrhonism, I:226. Also see his discussion of Carneades in Against the Logicians, I:159–190. The “logicians” were considered to be dogmatists by Sextus. (In fact, the essays against the logicians were part of his larger work called “Against the Dogmatists.” See the preface by Bury, ibid., vii.)

6. Indeed, Keith Lehrer 1997 seems to be giving that response.

7. For a contrasting discussion of the realm of the doubtful, see Stroud 1984, Chapter 1.

8. I say “seriously” here because, in fact, the next ground for doubt that he mentions is that perhaps he is mad (insane). He asks whether he could be mad and like people who imagine that they are kings when they are in reality poor, or that they are clothed when they are naked, or that they are pumpkins or made of glass. His answer is “But they are mad, and I should not be any the less insane were I to follow examples so extravagant” (ibid., 145). This is somewhat puzzling because on the face of it, the evil genius hypothesis seems no less “extravagant.” One way of explaining this way of rejecting the possibility that he is insane as a genuine basis for doubt is to embrace the minimal counter-evidence account (discussed later) of what makes a proposition a genuine ground for doubt. If a genuine ground for doubt must be a proposition for which Descartes has some evidence, however minimal, then the mere lack of evidence for the proposition that he is insane would disqualify that proposition as a genuine ground for doubt. Perhaps he is saying that it would be mad for him to seriously entertain something for which he has no evidence whatsoever.

9. Strictly speaking, condition (1) entails (3), and hence, (3) is not needed. For if S did have a way of neutralizing the effect of d, then adding d to S's beliefs would not have the effect of making assenting to p no longer adequately justified. (That is, ~(3) entails ~(1).) (3) was included to make clear the distinction between denying the potential ground for doubt and neutralizing it.

10. See, for example, DeRose and Warfield 1999. In that volume most of the authors take the CP-style argument to be the primary one. There is an excellent discussion of Academic Skepticism in the Introduction to that volume.

11. For the sake of clarity, it is important to point out that the restoring proposition could itself have a genuine ground for doubt, so that even if (r & d) did not reduce the warrant for x, [(r & d) & d1] could defeat the justification for x since d1 would defeat the restoring effect of r. But then, (d & d1) would be a new grounds for doubt. So, we need not include this epicycle.

12. Two propositions, x, y are contraries just in case x entails ~y, but ~x does not entail y. Here are some examples: The ball is red all over, the ball is yellow all over; X is an aunt, X is an uncle. More to the point, h and sk are contraries since h entails ~sk, but ~h does not entail sk. For example, it could be the case that there is no hand before me and I am not in a switched-world (or it doesn't appear that there is a hand before me).

13. The probability could be either subjective or objective. The reason for including “non-overridden” in the supposition is that it would not be sufficient for S to be entitled to believe something if S only had good enough grounds to render a proposition sufficiently likely to be true because S might also have counter evidence that overrides those positive grounds.

14. For another, similar, proposed counterexample, see Audi 1988, 77.

15. For the sake of employing consistent terminology, “P” has been changed to “p” and “Q” to “q.”

16. For a full discussion of Nozick's account of knowledge, see Luper-Foy 1987.

17. It is crucial to note that the truth of CP does not depend upon the antecedent being fulfilled.

18. The claim here is not that the evidential relationship between h and ~sk is such that S must use Pattern 2. The claim is merely that such a path is available.

19. Much of the material in this section recapitulates Klein 2000a.

20. The caricature is mentioned by Diogenes Laertius, but is also somewhat mitigated by pointing out that the suspension of assent was only “his philosophy” and that Pyrrho lived to be nearly ninety. Here is what he says:

He [Pyrrho] led a life consistent with his doctrine, going out of his way for nothing, taking no precaution, but facing all risks as they came, whether carts, precipices, dogs or what not, and, generally leaving nothing to the arbitrament of the senses; but he was kept out of harm's way by his friends who…used to follow close after him. But Aenesidemus says that it was only his philosophy that was based upon suspension of judgement, and that he did not lack foresight in his everyday acts. He lived to be nearly ninety. (Diogenes Laertius, Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Bk IX, 62)

21. Strictly speaking, there is a fourth possibility, namely that there are foundational propositions and that there are an infinite number of propositions between a foundational proposition and the one for which reasons are initially being sought. Interestingly, such a hybrid view might be indistinguishable in practice from infinitism and, hence, for our purposes we can treat this as a form of infinitism.

22. These are glosses on a selection of the best arguments. No claim is made that the Pyrrhonians gave these very arguments.

23. The matter is put that way in order to make clear that foundationalism can embrace some aspects of coherentism. Basic propositions with only minimal justification, if coherent, can gain additional credibility. Thus, this account of foundationalism includes both weak and strong foundationalism as characterized in BonJour 1978.

24. This is the suggestion put forward in BonJour 1985.

25. Note that nothing said here implies that infinitism is an inappropriate model for reasoning that is not meant to result in having settled a matter once and for all. For a defense of infinitism, see Klein 1999, 2000, 2003, and 2007.

Copyright © 2010 by
Peter Klein <>

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