In philosophy, ‘self-knowledge’ commonly refers to knowledge of one's particular mental states, including one's beliefs, desires, and sensations. It is also sometimes used to refer to knowledge about a persisting self—its ontological nature, identity conditions, or character traits. At least since Descartes, most philosophers have believed that self-knowledge is importantly different from knowledge of the world external to oneself, including others' thoughts. But there is little agreement about what precisely distinguishes self-knowledge from knowledge in other realms. Partially because of this disagreement, philosophers have endorsed competing accounts of how we acquire self-knowledge. These accounts have important consequences for the scope of mental content, for mental ontology, and for personal identity.
This entry will focus on the first sort of self-knowledge, knowledge of one's own particular mental states; but it will also briefly address on some central debates about knowledge of a persisting self. We begin with a survey of the leading candidates for the distinctive feature of self-knowledge (Section 1); the most influential accounts of self-knowledge are then outlined (Section 2). Section 3 takes up knowledge of the self. Sections 4 and 5 briefly describe two special topics in the philosophy of self-knowledge, respectively: the problem of self-deception, and the consequences of epistemically distinctive self-knowledge for the doctrine of content externalism.
- 1. The Distinctiveness of Self-Knowledge
- 1.1 Self-Knowledge as Epistemically Distinctive
- 1.2 Self-Knowledge as Distinctive in a Non-Epistemic Way
- 1.3 Doubts about the Distinctiveness of Self-Knowledge
- 2. Accounts of Self-Knowledge
- 3. Knowledge of the Self
- 4. Self-Deception
- 5. Self-Knowledge and Content Externalism
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What is special about self-knowledge, compared to knowledge in other domains? There are four leading views:
- Knowledge of one's own mental states is especially secure, epistemically.
- One uses a unique method to determine one's own mental states.
- One is uniquely positioned to regulate own's own mental states.
- One's pronouncements about one's own states bear a special authority or presumption of truth.
The differences between these are subtle. Position (1) identifies the distinctive feature of self-knowledge as the epistemic status of a certain class of beliefs, whereas position (2) identifies it by the method one uses in forming these beliefs. Position (3) emphasizes the subject's control over her own states. Position (4) rejects these first-person characterizations, focusing instead on the way self-attributions are treated by others. Only the first two of these positions see the distinctive feature of self-knowledge as plainly epistemic; since access is an epistemic notion, those who claim that ‘privileged access’ captures what is special about self-knowledge generally accept (1) or (2). (The looseness with which ‘privileged access’ is employed, and the ensuing possibilities for ambiguity, are illustrated by Alston (1971), who lists well over a dozen senses of this term.) Those who deny that the distinctive feature of self-knowledge is epistemic locate it instead in (3) or (4). Subsection 1.1 discusses epistemic accounts of what is distinctive about self-knowledge; subsection 1.2 discusses non-epistemic accounts. Subsection 1.3 explains why some have denied that self-knowledge is special in any of these ways (subsection 1.3).
Self-knowledge may be epistemically special in that (a) it is especially secure or certain; or (b) one uses a unique method to determine one's own mental states.
The strongest epistemic claims on behalf of self-knowledge are infallibility and omniscience. One is infallible about one's own mental states iff one cannot have a false belief to the effect that one is in a certain mental state. One is omniscient about one's own states iff being in a mental state suffices for knowing that one is in that state. Few if any contemporary philosophers accept infallibility or omniscience in their unqualified forms. Here is a simple counter-example to the claim of infallibility. Kate trusts a friend's insights into her own psychology, and so she believes the friend when he tells her that she wants to live in the country. But the friend is mistaken—Kate really wants an urban life, though she hasn't reflected on her desires enough to realize this. Hence, Kate has a false belief about her own desires. This case also undercuts the claim of omniscience: in the case described, Kate is unaware of her real desire, which is to live in the city.
Even if we are not strictly infallible about our states, there is a more plausible, qualified version of the infallibility claim. In the case described, Kate's belief about her desires is based on the testimony of another person. Relying on testimony is, of course, a way of gaining knowledge about all sorts of things, not only one's own mental states. As mentioned above, some philosophers believe that one has a special way of knowing about one's own states. (This is the second candidate for what is special about self-knowledge; particular accounts of this special access will be discussed in the following subsection.) If we limit the relevant domain to beliefs formed by use of a method unique to self-knowledge, we can formulate a more plausible infallibility thesis, as follows.
When one carefully, attentively employs the mode of knowing unique to self-knowledge, one will not form a false belief about one's own states.
This thesis avoids many counter-examples to the unrestricted infallibility thesis, which involve cases in which the subject uses a method other than introspection or exercises insufficient care in introspecting.
We can generate an even more plausible thesis by restricting this qualified infallibility claim to phenomenal states such as sensations. Descartes endorsed (at least) a qualified, restricted infallibility thesis of this sort. He says:
There remains sensations, emotions and appetites. These may be clearly perceived provided we take great care in our judgments concerning them to include no more than what is strictly contained in our perception—no more than that of which we have inner awareness. But this is a very difficult rule to observe, at least with regard to sensations. (Descartes 1644/1985, I.66, p. 216)
Jackson has also defended a qualified infallibility claim, restricted to one's current phenomenal states (Jackson 1973).
While this infallibility thesis seems preferable to the stronger version, it is still quite controversial. A common objection to a thesis of this sort is the claim, often attributed to Wittgenstein, that where one cannot be wrong, one cannot be right either. For instance, Wright maintains that the possibility of error is required for concept application, which is in turn required for substantial self-knowledge.“[E]rror—if only second-order error—has to be possible, if a genuine exercise of concepts is involved” (Wright 1989, 634). Even if we reject this claim, it will be very difficult to explain how a method guaranteed to yield true beliefs could be epistemically substantial enough to provide genuine knowledge (unless we specify the method trivially, as that which is used when and only when self-knowledge occurs). Yet some philosophers have argued that certain methods allow for infallible beliefs about a limited range of states.
The omniscience thesis seems even less plausible than the unrestricted infallibility thesis. But consider the following passage from Locke, which seems to express an omniscience claim.
[It is] impossible for any one to perceive, without perceiving that he does perceive. When we see, hear, smell, taste, feel, meditate, or will any thing, we know that we do so. (Locke 1689/1975 II.27.ix)
Is Locke really saying that all of our thoughts and sensations are accompanied by (justified, true) beliefs to the effect that we are having those thoughts and sensations? It is more likely that by “we know that we do so” Locke means that we are conscious that we do so. This statement is plausible if we assume that states of perceiving, willing, etc. are conscious, and that conscious states are states one is conscious of. (Locke's account of introspection is discussed in 2.2 below.)
In any case, the omniscience thesis may also be qualified. Some philosophers (such as Chisholm 1981) maintain that a restricted class of states is such that anyone who is in a state in that class knows that she is. Alternatively, one may modify the omniscience thesis by claiming (with Peacocke 1992 and Siewert 1998) that some states automatically justify self-attributing beliefs about them, even if they don't automatically issue in self-attributions.
The infallibility and omniscience theses may be weakened further. Weaker versions assert that, in certain normal circumstances, one will generally avoid false self-attributions, and will generally be aware of one's own mental states. These claims are obviously more modest than the unqualified versions; in particular, they lack the modal force of the previous claims. E.g., Hill (1993) maintains that we are generally accurate about and aware of our own sensations, but only contingently so, because this accuracy derives from “certain facts about the relationships between human cognitive mechanisms” (130). Such claims are probably too weak to deserve the label ‘infallibility’ or ‘omniscience’. What they share with the original infallibility and omniscience theses is the notion that we are especially reliable detectors of our own states.
Claims of infallibility and omniscience correlate the belief that p with p itself. But they are neutral between epistemic internalism and externalism. At least some externalists hold that a high correlation between p and the belief that p—such as one's p-beliefs ‘tracking the truth’—suffices for knowledge that p, whereas internalists will deny this. (See the entry on internalist vs. externalist conceptions of epistemic justification.) Epistemic internalists will favor a notion of epistemic security that is not directly linked with tracking. On the tracking model, the highest degree of epistemic security is perfect reliability: the subject believes that she is in mental state m when and only when she is, in fact, in m. By contrast, the highest degree of epistemic security on the internalist model is certainty. Certainty may be absolute (C.I. Lewis 1946) or relative (Chisholm 1977). (See entry on certainty.) The claim that one can be certain that one is in a particular mental state applies to a single self-attribution, whereas the reliability-based theses of infallibility and omniscience concern a person's general accuracy. One might hold that self-knowledge is special in that one can be certain that one is in a particular mental state, in the sense that the corresponding self-attribution is immune from doubt. This claim is compatible with the idea that many or even most of our actual self-attributions are false, and that we are aware of few of our mental states.
It is certainty, rather than a general reliability, which is relevant to one of the most famous philosophical uses of introspection, Descartes' cogito argument. This argument aims to demonstrate that, so long as you are carefully attending to your own thoughts, nothing—not even a supremely powerful evil genius—can undermine your evidence that you are thinking (and that, therefore, you exist). While most philosophers accept that certainty is possible in this highly specific case, others deny that absolute certainty is possible in any realm (Unger 1975). Another worry for certainty-based views is that, since our beliefs about external objects seem far from certain, the epistemic gulf between self-knowledge and knowledge of other objects and persons will lead to external-world skepticism or to solipsism. Those who maintain that self-attributions can achieve an especially high level of certainty typically account for this fact by citing the distinctiveness of the method used to determine our own mental states. Let us now turn to this ‘special methods’ claim.
The term ‘introspection’—literally, ‘looking within’—captures a traditional way of conceiving how we grasp our own mental states. This term expresses, in spatial language, a divide between an ‘inner’ world and an ‘outer’ or ‘external’ world. For most philosophers, the spatial connotations of this language are purely metaphorical: to say that a state or entity is internal to the mind is not to say that it falls within a given spatial boundary. The term ‘introspection’ is standardly used to denote a method of knowing unique to self-knowledge, one that differs from the method we use to grasp the ‘outer’ world, namely, perception. (As we will see in Section 2, however, some philosophers maintain that introspection is importantly similar to perception.)
How, then, does introspection differ from other methods of knowledge? One standard answer to this question is that introspection, unlike most or all other methods of knowledge, gives one direct access to its objects. There are two senses of directness that are relevant here. In the first, epistemic sense, the claim is that we can grasp our own mental states without inference; we need not rely on reasoning from observation. The second sense of directness is metaphysical: there is no state or object that mediates between my self-attributing belief (that I am now thinking that it will rain, feeling thirsty, etc.) and its object (my thought that it will rain, my feeling of thirst). (On some views, these types of directness require that the self-attribution is contemporaneous with the state attributed; reliance on memory would constitute a failure of directness. But see Burge 1993 for an argument to show that memory needn't add an inferential step.)
These two types of directness are closely related. Some have argued that if my access to my own mental states is epistemically direct, it must be metaphysically immediate as well. For anything standing between my self-attributing belief and its object would, arguably, also constitute an epistemically mediating factor. For instance, Russell (1917) held that introspection is unique among epistemic methods in that it is the only process that yields non-inferential knowledge of contingent truths. He took the epistemic directness of introspective self-knowledge to show that nothing mediates between a subject and a mental state of which she is aware; in his terms, we stand in a relation of “acquaintance” to these mental objects.
The claim that introspective access is both epistemically and metaphysically direct is captured in the familiar view that, for mental states, an appearance and the reality that appears are numerically identical. This claim seems most plausible for the case of sensations. Here are a few representative statements of it.
Pain … is not picked out by one of its accidental properties; rather it is picked out by the property of being pain itself, by its immediate phenomenological quality. (Kripke 1980, 152–3)
[T]here is no appearance/reality distinction in the case of sensations. (Hill 1991, 127)
When introspecting our mental states, we do not take canonical evidence to be an intermediary between properties introspected and our own conception of them. We take evidence to be properties introspected. (Sturgeon 2000, 48)
What does this directness imply about the epistemic status of self-knowledge? Clearly, it does not imply that we are either infallible or omniscient about our own states. Consistent with the directness claim, we may be fallible in that we may use methods other than introspection, as in the case of Kate; and we may simply fail to reflect on our current mental states, in which case we are not omniscient. But if introspection affords epistemically and metaphysically direct access to one's sensations, there appears to be no room for error in introspective beliefs about sensations, for there is no process of inference (etc.) that could go wrong, and no ontological appearance-reality gap that could generate an illusion. On these grounds, Russell claimed that “it is not possible to doubt” the presence of mental objects of acquaintance (Russell 1912). As we will see in Section 2.1, contemporary foundationalists like BonJour and Fumerton argue that our direct access to (some of) our own mental states renders knowledge of these states highly epistemically secure; secure enough, in fact, that it can partly constitute an epistemic foundation. (See the entry on foundationalist theories of epistemic justification.)
While the term ‘introspection’ connotes a looking within, some philosophers have claimed that the method unique to self-knowledge requires precisely the opposite. On this view, we ascertain our own thoughts by looking outward, to the states of the world they represent. This is known as a ‘transparent’ method, in that one looks ‘through’ the mental state, directly to the state of the world it represents. Dretske argues that this is how we come to know our mental representations, but the 'looking outward' claim is especially prevalent as regards beliefs.
The most famous expression of this claim is from Gareth Evans.
[I]n making a self-ascription of belief, one's eyes are, so to speak, or occasionally literally, directed outward—upon the world. If someone asks me ‘Do you think there is going to be a third world war?,’ I must attend, in answering him, to precisely the same outward phenomena as I would attend to if I were answering the question ‘Will there be a third world war?’ (Evans 1982, 225)
This position has recently been defended by Fernandez (2003) and Byrne (forthcoming). It is discussed in 2.3 below.
The ‘looking outward’ claim has been criticized on the grounds that this procedure creates rather than reveals beliefs. Perhaps you hadn't formed a belief about the likelihood of a third world war until you were asked; the procedure treats this question as an invitation to form a belief. And it is unsurprising that forming a belief about whether p will involve considering evidence regarding the likelihood of p. (For more on this objection, see 2.3.)
Some versions of the ‘looking outward’ account are straightforwardly epistemic: e.g., Byrne (forthcoming) argues that the method of transparency is especially reliable, and so secures a high degree of externalist warrant. But others, such as the version defended by Moran, seem non-epistemic. We now turn to this and other non-epistemic accounts of what is special about self-knowledge.
Moran (2001) claims that first-person privilege is a matter of one's ability to regulate one's own states, and thereby to constitute oneself. This ‘self-constitution’ account builds on the idea that we look outward to determine our beliefs. The objection to this idea, that this process yields a new belief rather than revealing a pre-existing belief, poses no difficulty for the self-constitution view. For its proponents will claim that this objection depends on a naïve picture of self-reflection. According to the naïve picture, mental states are stable particulars, awaiting discovery through introspection. (This is sometimes called the ‘act-object’ conception of self-knowledge: introspection is a quasi-perceptual act of recognizing an independent object.) However, on the self-constitution view mental states are in fact dynamically related to first-person reflection. One's own mental states are not static entities merely to be observed: insofar as one is rational, in becoming aware of the state one subjects it to scrutiny. This line alleges that models of self-knowledge that treat what is special about self-knowledge as a purely epistemic matter are inadequate, since they neglect the fact that “self-consciousness has specific consequences for the object of consciousness” (Moran 2001, 28). For instance, awareness that one believes that p will, in a rational person, prompt the question whether p, so that one's ‘p’-belief is open to influence by one's current evidence regarding p.
According to this rejection of the naïve picture, self-knowledge does not consist in simple observation of one's thoughts. If one simply reflects on the evidence regarding the state and does not evaluate its object (by considering the likelihood that it will rain, say), one may gain knowledge about states that are in fact one's own, but not knowledge about states conceived reflexively as one's own, that is, as ‘mine’. For conceiving a belief or intention (etc.) as my own requires treating it as open to change. What is special about the method of knowing one's own states, on this view, is that we are each agents, relative to our own states: we are uniquely able to constitute ourselves. (This view is examined in more detail in 2.5.)
The agential powers of the self-ascriber also play an important role in another non-epistemic construal of what is special about self-knowledge, the authority view. According to this view, each of us is authoritative as to her own mental states. This means that, in ordinary conversational contexts, self-attributions enjoy a presumption of truth, and it is unreasonable or improper for others to gainsay them. First-person authority is present in our ordinary use of self-attributing statements like “I believe that it is raining”: one who responds “no, you don’t”, under normal circumstances (where there is no obvious reason to think that the self-attributing person is insincere or insane), simply fails to understand how such statements operate. The point is not that each of us is in a privileged position to ascertain her own states; it is, rather, that an understanding of how self-attributions operate is partially constituted by being disposed to defer to self-attributors.
Wright describes this view, which he attributes to Wittgenstein, as follows.
[T]he authority standardly granted to a subject's own beliefs, or expressed avowals, about his intentional states is a constitutive principle. (Wright 1989, 632)
In other words, what is special about self-attributions is that each of us is the default authority about her own mental states, in the sense that self-attributions are not—except in extraordinary circumstances—open to challenge by others. Default first-person authority is non-optional, on this view, since possession of the relevant psychological concepts requires treating self-attributions as immune from challenge.
The default authority view does not require that self-attributions be epistemically grounded, for the fact that one is treated as an authority about one's own states does not show that one knows those states at all, let alone that one has any sort of privileged access to them. But this view does see self-attributions as statements that are exceptionally likely to be true. The fact that we defer to others regarding their own states thus cries out for explanation: what justifies the practice of treating others as default authorities on their own states, given that they are not in an epistemically privileged position to determine those states? Critics of this view, including Wright (1998), say that it fails to justify or even explain the practice of treating persons as default authorities, but is “a mere invitation to choose to treat as primitive something which we have run into trouble trying to explain” (45). In a similar vein, Moran (1997) charges that on the default authority view, self-knowledge fails to be a “cognitive achievement”. Of course, if we find that no more substantive explanation will work, the strategy of treating our deferential practices as primitive may become more appealing.
The basic idea that each of us is ordinarily the authority on her own states appears compatible with the claim that the distinctive feature of self-knowledge is epistemic. For we may be the authority on our own states precisely because our beliefs about them are especially secure, epistemically, or because we enjoy a special, privileged mode of access to them. The default authority view radically departs from this claim, by identifying the specialness of self-attributions in a conceptual or pragmatic factor. What is special about self-attributions, on this view, may be that they are non-epistemic. Wittgenstein appears to hold that an understanding of what it means to ‘know what someone is thinking’ will preclude all claims to knowing one's own thoughts.
I can know what someone else is thinking, not what I am thinking. It is correct to say ‘I know what you are thinking’, and wrong to say ‘I know what I am thinking.‘ (A whole cloud of philosophy condensed into a drop of grammar.) (Wittgenstein 1953, p.222).
Strictly speaking, then, this position is not primarily concerned with what is special about self-knowledge, but is instead concerned with the distinctive feature of self-attributions.
There is another, more extreme view which also denies that utterances like “I am in pain” are epistemically special. On this expressivist view, which is sometimes attributed to Wittgenstein as well, such utterances are not genuine self-attributions at all. Rather, they are non-propositional expressions of mental states, on a par with winces and laughter. Recently, Bar-On (2004) has advanced a somewhat similar view. She claims that such utterances are immediately tied to the states they express, while allowing that they are genuine self-attributions. According to this ‘neo-expressivism’, the specialness of self-attributions in the non-epistemic fact that each of us is uniquely situated to “give voice to” her own states. (These views are discussed in 2.6 below.) Both of these views provide alternative, non-epistemic diagnoses of the apparent epistemic specialness of self-attributions.
Some of those discussed in the previous subsection reject the claim of epistemic privilege, on the grounds that what is special about self-attributions is a non-epistemic factor. Others reject the claim of epistemic privilege on its own, without proposing an alternative picture of the distinctiveness of self-knowledge. These philosophers reject the exalted epistemic claims made on behalf of introspection; believe that the method we use in determining our own states is broadly similar to epistemic methods we use in other domains; or are skeptical about the notion that a disparity between self-knowledge and other-knowledge is inherent in our psychological concepts. This subsection outlines the grounds for these denials.
The denial that self-knowledge is truly special was especially prevalent during the heyday of behaviorism. For instance, Ryle (1949) claims that the difference between self-knowledge and other-knowledge is at most a matter of degree, and stems from the mundane fact that each of us is always present to observe our own behavior. His chief criticism of traditional claims about self-knowledge targets the idea that self-knowledge involves a uniquely direct epistemic process. If self-knowledge were direct, he argues, then the higher-order mental state that constitutes immediate grasp of one's own mental state would have to be grasped as well. This would quickly lead to a regress, which could be blocked only by positing a state that somehow comprehends itself. But Ryle believes that this sort of reflexivity is impossible. Interestingly, skepticism about reflexive self-awareness was already present in James (1884).
Self-consciousness, if the word is to be used at all, must not be described on the hallowed paraoptical model, as a torch that illuminates itself by beams of its own light reflected from a mirror in its own insides. (Ryle 1949, 39)
No subjective state, whilst present, is its own object; its object is always something else. (James 1884, 2)
Ryle suggests an alternative, which does not involve any sort of second-order grasp of a first-order state: self-knowledge is simply a “standing condition or frame of mind”, in which one is “ready to perform” certain tasks, and thereby “alive to” what one is doing or thinking (Ryle 1949). This does not differentiate self-knowledge from other-knowledge, for one can be similarly “alive to” another's activities and thoughts.
Doubts about self-knowledge are also fueled by more general epistemological views, such as doubts about the possibility of theory-free observations. Dennett (1991) questions whether our self-attributions are due to anything like a direct grasp of our mental states, unsullied by independent theories about the mental. On Dennett's view, the assumption that mental states are inaccessible from the third-person perspective encourages ungrounded speculation about one's own states, for it means that self-attributions go unchecked.
I suspect that when we claim to be just using our powers of inner observation, we are always actually engaging in a sort of impromptu theorizing—and we are remarkably gullible theorizers, precisely because there is so little to observe and so much to pontificate about without fear of contradiction. (Dennett 1991, 55–6)
Relatedly, some (including Stich 1983) deny that self-knowledge is special, relative to knowledge of others’ states, by claiming that ordinary (‘folk’) concepts of psychological states are theoretical concepts. If psychological states are theoretical entities, both self-attributions and other-attributions will proceed by inference from observed data—presumably, behavior. This understanding of folk psychology is known as ‘theory theory’; it stands in opposition to ‘simulation theory’ (Gordon 1986), which is usually thought more conducive to the claim that self-knowledge is special. According to simulation theory, one learns of another's states by imaginatively projecting oneself into the other's situation and thereby determining, perhaps through a special mode of self-reflection, what one would believe or desire (etc.) if one were in that situation oneself.
Another general epistemological contention which generates doubt about self-knowledge is the familiar worry that the observational process unavoidably alters the target of observation. The introspective process may be especially vulnerable to this worry, since the observer arguably has some control over that which she observes. One reaction to this worry is to adopt the position, mentioned above, that denies that thoughts are stable entities. (See also 2.5.) A more sweeping reaction is to claim that thoughts are never fully grasped: the attempt to grasp a thought inevitably changes the thought, so unobserved thoughts have a nature which is distinct from that which we grasp in introspection, and forever inaccessible. This global skepticism about self-knowledge is rejected by nearly all current philosophers.
Empirical work in psychology constitutes another source of doubt about the epistemic status of self-attributions. In a much-cited paper, Nisbett and Wilson (1977) present studies showing that subjects routinely misidentify the factors which influenced their reasoning processes. For instance, subjects in one study explained their preference for a product by its apparent quality, while in fact the preference seemed to be fueled by the product's spatial position relative to its competitors.
The accuracy of subject reports is so poor as to suggest that any introspective access that may exist is not sufficient to produce generally correct or reliable reports. (Nisbett and Wilson, 1977, 33)
While these studies are instructive, their results are limited in that they apply only to the causal sources of one's decisions. The original Nisbett and Wilson study was silent as to the epistemic status of self-attributions of one's current states, and it is current states to which the claim of specialness least controversially applies. Wilson now acknowledges this limitation. As he notes, the earlier experiments show only that we lack introspective access to causal sources of our decisions when those sources are unconscious. “But to the extent that people's responses are caused by the conscious self, they have privileged access to the actual causes of these responses; in short, the Nisbett and Wilson argument was wrong about such cases.” (Wilson 2002, 106)
In a number of recent papers, Schwitzgebel has marshalled other sorts of empirical evidence to show that introspective reports are unreliable. Here is one representative instance. Schwitzgebel (2002) cites a study (McElvie 1995) that analyzes scores on the ‘Vividness of Visual Imagery Questionnaire’ (VVIQ), which has subjects rate the intensity of their current visual images. McElvie concludes that the reported intensity of a visual image is not well correlated with abilities that we’d expect to correlate with actual intensity, such as the ability to remember the visual image, to mentally rotate it, etc. If these abilities do correlate with the intensity of the images, and VVIQ ratings reflect introspective beliefs about intensity, then introspective beliefs are erroneous. Schwitzgebel concludes that “we can be, and often are, grossly mistaken about our own current conscious experiences even in favourable circumstances of quiet attention”. (ibid., 50).
An obvious response to this argument is to question whether the actual intensity of visual imagery does correlate with these sorts of abilities. While we ordinarily assume that relatively vivid images are easier to remember, or to mentally rotate, the lack of correlation between one's performance on these tasks and one's responses to the VVIQ may in fact undermine this assumption.
So should we accept Schwitzgebel's conclusion, or instead treat his evidence as implying that intensity is not closely linked to these mental abilities? Our choice may depend on our prior attitudes about the trustworthiness of introspection. Prior attitudes about introspection seem to be not only influential but also particularly stubborn. The obstinacy of such attitudes is borne out by Schwitzgebel's recent collaboration with a psychologist (Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel 2007). The authors investigate the extent of introspective accuracy by collecting introspective reports from a single individual, who is given the pseudonym ‘Melanie’. Melanie is equipped with a beeper which sounds at random moments; when it sounds, she is to note what she is currently thinking and feeling. In the ensuing analysis of these reports, the two authors sometimes differ as to the correct interpretation of Melanie's claims, and as to her introspective accuracy. It is striking that even after lengthy discussion of the results, the authors disagree about the reliability of introspection: in his closing remarks, Schwitzgebel attributes this disagreement, in part, to their respective prior attitudes about introspection. (Hurlburt is ‘optimistic’ while Schwitzgebel is ‘a skeptic’.)
This result suggests that determining the accuracy of introspective judgments will require not only careful empirical work, but difficult conceptual work as well. Goldman calls this task the ‘problem of calibration’ for introspection.
A crucial problem for the theory of introspection is to fix its range of reliability. This is the problem of calibration, which arises for any scientific instrument and cognitive capacity. I would subdivide the problem into two parts. One would seek to specify the operational conditions under which introspection is (sufficiently) reliable. The second would seek to specify the propositional contents for which it is reliable. (Goldman 2004, 14)
As Goldman notes, we can fix the range of introspective reliability only by using introspection and evaluating its results for internal coherence and for consistency with other sources. But as the results of Hurlburt and Schwitzgebel's study reveals, there is no clear consensus as to how to evaluate the results of introspection, or what weight to accord ‘other sources’. Introspection therefore faces an especially thorny and complex problem of calibration.
Williamson (2000) has argued against a particular, seemingly plausible epistemic thesis regarding self-knowledge. This thesis asserts that one who is in a particular phenomenal state, such as feeling cold, can know that she is in that state. (This is the claim that phenomenal states are ‘luminous’.) Williamson imagines a subject who feels cold at dawn, but gradually warms until she feels warm at noon. At some point she is barely cold, and truly believes ‘I feel cold’. At the next moment, she feels only very slightly warmer than at the previous moment; but since she felt barely cold at the previous moment, she may not, in fact, feel cold at this later moment. Williamson treats the fact that a self-attribution at the later moment would be false as evidence that the previous self-attribution is not reliable enough to constitute knowledge. Phenomenal states seem to be the best candidates for privileged access, so the fact that one is not always in a position to know whether one is in a given phenomenal state suggests that one is not always in a position to know whether one is in any given mental state. Williamson's argument therefore threatens a broad class of claims about self-knowledge.
There are a variety of possible responses to Williamson. Two deserve special attention.
The first response highlights the limits of Williamson's argument. That argument appears to show that one is not always in a position to know all of one's own states; in particular, one is not always able to detect those of one's states that are marginal or near-marginal, like one's being barely cold. But consider a more central case, such as being very cold. The belief ‘I am cold’ would not be false, in a nearly identical situation, if one is now very cold. (Cf. DeRose 2002. The term ‘central case’ is taken from Reed 2006.) Even if one is not always in a position to know all of one's own states, when one is very cold, one can know that one is cold. This may well be a distinctive feature of our knowledge of our own mental states.
The second response to Williamson is given by Weatherson (2004), who describes a subject for whom phenomenal states like feeling cold are luminous. In this subject, these phenomenal states are constituents of (or perhaps just are) corresponding self-attributions. (This response thus dovetails nicely with the modern version of the Unmediated Observation Model described in 2.1 below.) If having a sensation generally allows the subject to form a belief with that sensation as a constituent, then feeling cold may be luminous after all. For even a slight difference between feeling cold and not feeling cold will make a difference in the self-attribution that has that phenomenal state as a constituent.
We have seen that some characterizations of what is distinctive about self-knowledge construe the special feature as an epistemic one, while others construe it as non-epistemic. Corresponding to this difference, accounts of how self-knowledge proceeds are of two sorts, epistemic and non-epistemic. The current section surveys accounts within each of these categories. Subsections 2.1–2.4 describe epistemic accounts, and subsections 2.5 and 2.6 describe non-epistemic accounts.
As is the case with many other issues in epistemology and the philosophy of mind, the model of self-knowledge that most current views define themselves against is associated with Descartes. The Unmediated Observation model of self-knowledge attributed to him holds that we observe our own thoughts, but that these ‘inner’ observations differ from ordinary perceptual observations in that nothing mediates, epistemically or metaphysically, between the observational state and the state observed. Inner observations are thus non-inferential and metaphysically direct. Those who endorse the Unmediated Observation model generally limit its application to a subject's current states, as they claim that the use of memory would involve inference. As explained above, the epistemic and metaphysical directness is thought to provide for infallibility and/or certainty by closing off sources of introspective error such as faulty inferences and appearance-reality gaps. For this reason, the Unmediated Observation model has special appeal for epistemic foundationalists. Foundationalists claim that all of our knowledge rests on a foundation of beliefs that are justified, but not justified by other beliefs. The Unmediated Observation model is conducive to foundationalism in that it provides for highly secure self-attributions, which could form part of the epistemic foundation.
One contemporary version of the Unmediated Observation model (Chisholm 1981) claims that some psychological properties are ‘self-presenting’, where self-presenting properties are those with particular psychological and epistemic characteristics. Specifically, (i) no one who has a self-presenting property directly self-attributes its negation (though of course one may indirectly self-attribute its negation, e.g., by attributing it to “the person in the mirror”, when one fails to recognize that it is she herself who is reflected in the mirror); (ii) anyone who has a self-presenting property and considers whether she does, will self-attribute that property; and (iii) a direct attribution of a self-presenting property is certain, in a relative sense.
While Chisholm's view does not explain the metaphysical basis of self-presentation, most versions of the Unmediated Observation model require that the observed mental state, and the observation of that state, be directly linked in both an epistemic and metaphysical sense. Fumerton (2005) nicely expresses the dual directness that is required; terms in square brackets are mine.
One wants the truth-maker ‘before’ consciousness [metaphysical directness] in a way that provides complete intellectual assurance [epistemic directness] concerning the truth of what one believes. (Fumerton 2005, 122)
For Fumerton, the metaphysically direct relation at work here is a relation of acquaintance. (See the entry on knowledge by acquaintance vs. description.) Fumerton advances this account in service of epistemic foundationalism; BonJour (2003) advances a broadly similar account.
My suggestion is that one has a noninferentially justified belief that P when one has the thought that P and one is acquainted with the fact that P, the thought that P, and the relation of correspondence holding between the thought that P and the fact that P. (Fumerton 1996, 75)
On my view, … a foundational belief results when one directly sees or apprehends that one's experience satisfies the description of it offered by the content of the belief. (BonJour 2003, 191)
On both of these views, an experience can directly justify the belief that one is having that experience.
An alternative modern version of the Unmediated Observation Model, advanced by Chalmers (2003) and Gertler (2001), applies exclusively to knowledge of one's own phenomenal states. On this account, one's introspective belief that one is currently experiencing phenomenal quality F (e.g., phenomenal greenness) subsumes or embeds the experience which is the token of F. In other words, the instance of the phenomenal quality to which one attends, in introspection, partially constitutes the phenomenal belief. This partial constitution secures the metaphysical directness described above, as nothing mediates between the known state and the knowing state. And this sort of account also aims to secure epistemic directness, by drawing on the relation between a phenomenal quality's appearance and its reality emphasized in the passages from Kripke, Hill and Sturgeon above. Since an appearance of a phenomenal quality and the reality which appears (the phenomenal quality itself) are one and the same, on this account, one can enjoy epistemically direct access to the phenomenal quality by attending to it.
The Unmediated Observation model has been criticized on various grounds. First, as stated above, some deny that any method will yield the strong epistemic results—most notably, infallibility or certainty—it claims. In response, proponents of the Unmediated Observation model may narrowly define the observational method, so that self-attributions will be said to be infallible or certain only under sharply limited conditions. Or they may simply forego the more extreme epistemic claims on behalf of self-attributions, maintaining that we directly observe our own states but denying that this directness produces such strongly justified beliefs.
A second objection charges that this model pays an excessively high price for securing metaphysical directness: namely, it construes introspective belief as too close to its object to qualify as genuine, substantial knowledge. For instance, Wright argues that the Unmediated Observation model will not allow for truly epistemic access to one's own states, since genuine knowledge that one is having a seeing-red experience, say, requires that one is correctly applying the concept ‘red’. This in turn requires the possibility of error, for a judgment that is guaranteed to be correct will not qualify as a “substantial cognitive accomplishment”; but the directness posited by the Unmediated Observation model seems to foreclose the possibility of error, and thus to render the resulting judgment cognitively insubstantial (Wright 1989). James beat contemporary philosophers to the punch here as well, by denying that the mere lack of an appearance-reality gap ensures self-knowledge.
[Even if] the esse of a mental state is its sentiri, [in self-knowledge the mental state] must be more than experienced; it must be remembered, reflected on, named, classed, known, related to other facts of the same order. (James 1884, 1)
Another way of putting this second objection is to say that the Unmediated Observation model threatens to reduce one's understanding of the self-attributed quality to an event, viz., one's attending to an instance of that quality. The model thus faces Wittgensteinian concerns about the legitimacy of private language. Sellars expressed related worries when he claimed that the concepts used in understanding putatively “private” episodes cannot themselves be wholly private:
[T]he reporting role of these concepts, their role in introspection, the fact that each of us has a privileged access to his impressions, constitutes a dimension of these concepts which is built on and presupposes their role in intersubjective discourse. (Sellars 1963., sec. 62)
The strength of this objection depends on the legitimacy of private language, an issue beyond the scope of this entry. (See the entry private language.) But the Unmediated Observation model requires only that the subject can refer to her mental state by using an introspective demonstrative, such as “it is thus (here, now)”. It does not require that introspection can yield, on its own, a more conceptualized grasp of the introspected state, such as “it is as if there is something fuchsia before me”.
A third objection also derives from the role of concepts in self-attributions. According to this objection, the content of a concept is partly constituted by one's dispositions to apply that concept in various circumstances (Cf. Sosa 2003). The content of my judgment ‘I am now having an F experience’ then rests on facts about my dispositions to apply the concept ‘F’. Even if I am highly reliable in applying it, as is plausible for phenomenal concepts, the relation to these counterfactuals means that the judgment ‘I am now having an F experience’ is not (as) internalistically certain as proponents of the Unmediated Observation model suggest. More specifically, if the content of my F concept is partly dispositional, I cannot ‘directly apprehend’ that the experience falls under ‘F’, or that the judgment corresponds to the experience, contra BonJour and Fumerton. Nor is my phenomenal concept “partly constituted by an underlying phenomenal quality” (Chalmers 2003, 235); nor can I “pick out the phenomenal content by sheer attention” (Gertler 2001, 318). For their part, proponents of the Unmediated Observation model will likely reject the dispositional account of concepts, but this of course raises its own questions.
A final worry about the Unmediated Observation model, articulated by Boghossian (1989), questions whether this model can capture the relational features which, on most views, define propositional attitude contents. Such contents are construed relationally not only by externalist theories of content, but also by non-externalist versions of functionalism and conceptual role semantics. Presumably, it is only intrinsic features of states that can be directly observed. If propositional attitude contents cannot be directly observed, then observations can at most provide an inferential ground for knowledge of such contents. And the need for inference is at odds with the epistemic immediacy required by the Unmediated Observation model. Since phenomenal properties are more often—though not universally—regarded as non-relational, this objection is less worrying for versions of the model exclusively concerned with phenomenal states. (For more on knowing one's own relationally individuated thought contents, see Section 5 below.)
Many philosophers deny that self-knowledge is as exceptional as the Unmediated Observation model implies. Proponents of the Unmediated Observation model emphasize introspection's distinctiveness by construing it as fundamentally different from perception, both metaphysically and epistemically. Whereas perceptual beliefs are causally related to their objects, introspective beliefs are related to their objects by a much tighter relation, such as acquaintance or partial constitution; whereas perceptual beliefs fall short of certainty, introspective beliefs are sometimes sufficiently secure to serve as an epistemic foundation. Far from emphasizing the distinctiveness of introspection, the Inner Sense model instead seeks to minimize the anomalousness and associated mystery of self-knowledge by construing introspection as fundamentally similar to perception. Locke, an early champion of the Inner Sense model, described the introspective faculty as follows.
This Source of Ideas, every Man has wholly in himself … And though it be not Sense, as having nothing to do with external Objects; yet it is very like it, and might properly enough be call’d internal Sense. (Locke 1689/1975, II.1.iv.)
Contemporary versions of the Inner Sense model vary as to the extent of the analogy between introspection and perception. Armstrong's (1981) view lies at one extreme. He describes introspection as the brain's “self-scanning process”: the introspective process is “a mere flow of information or beliefs”, resulting in a higher-order awareness of a lower-order state of the brain (Armstrong 1981, 112). In contrast to the Unmediated Observation model, the connection between the introspective (scanning) state, and the introspected (scanned) state, is causal and contingent. In fact, on this view there is no bar, in principle, to scanning others’ states: this would simply require that one's scanning process is properly linked up with another's brain. Armstrong argues, against the Unmediated Observation model, that the relation between the introspected state and the introspective state must be causal, and so these states must be “distinct existences”. Armstrong's view does share with the Unmediated Observation model the claim that introspection is non-inferential, because the causal connections between the scanner and the states scanned need not be known by the subject in order to deliver self-knowledge. But the fact that introspection is non-inferential does not mean that it is especially secure, epistemically. After all, on most accounts perceptual beliefs are also non-inferential.
Other versions of the Inner Sense model construe the analogy with perception as less comprehensive. Lycan (1996) claims that, unlike perception, introspection need not involve any sensory quality. (Armstrong would perhaps agree with this. Shoemaker is probably right when he says that No one thinks that one is aware of beliefs and thoughts by having sensations or quasi-sense-experiences of them. (Shoemaker 1996, 255) More importantly, he argues that introspection is limited in principle to one's own states, for in introspective self-attribution one refers to oneself with “semantically primitive lexemes” (of a language of thought) that are applicable only to oneself (Lycan 1996, 61). Still, Lycan's version of the Inner Sense model sees introspection as deeply akin to perception in that it involves a monitoring mechanism, causally sensitive to its objects, that yields representations of its objects through attention.
An interesting side note: proponents of the Inner Sense model often accept the Higher-Order Perception, or HOP, theory of consciousness. On this theory, conscious states are just those mental states of which the subject has higher-order, quasi-perceptual awareness. [See Consciousness: higher-order theories.] If HOP theories are correct, assimilating introspection to perception will help to resolve the puzzle of consciousness.
The Inner Sense model has faced three main criticisms. The first is that, by construing the relation between the introspective ‘scanner’ and the state scanned as causal, the model fails to accommodate the profound difference between self-knowledge and other-knowledge. Gertler (2000a) argues that, because perceptual models construe this relation as causal, they cannot accommodate the genuine, noncontingent epistemic disparity between self-knowledge and other-knowledge. In response, the Inner Sense theorist can maintain that this epistemic disparity is only a contingent one.
A second objection challenges a related commitment of the Inner Sense model: the claim that the capacity for self-awareness as a merely contingent—albeit evolutionarily important—feature of persons. Some of the competing models discussed below are predicated on the claim that this capacity is essential to rationality. For instance, Shoemaker (1994) argues that no rational agent with the relevant concepts could be incapable of self-knowledge. (See 2.4 below.)
The third main criticism (Evans 1982, Dretske 1999) alleges that, in construing self-knowledge as looking within oneself, the Inner Sense model neglects the transparency of mental content. This criticism is based on the view (discussed in 1.1 above) that self-awareness does not involve directing one's attention inward, as the Inner Sense model requires. Instead, one becomes aware of one's own mental states by attending to features of the world external to oneself. This objection is the impetus for the Transparency model of self-knowledge.
In contrast to the Inner Sense view, the Transparency model denies that there is a perception-like mechanism which is directed inward. The Transparency model holds, instead, that the self-knowledge that the model accounts for requires an outward rather than an inward look. Dretske expresses this by saying that self-knowledge is “a form of perceptual knowledge that is obtained—indeed, can only be obtained—by awareness of non-mental objects” (Dretske 1994, 264). Dretske's particular version of the Transparency model construes self-knowledge as inferential. For instance, one infers that one is in a mental state that represents ‘car in the driveway’ from awareness of a non-mental object, namely, the car parked in the driveway. The claim that self-knowledge is inferential differentiates Dretske's view from other versions of the Transparency model, as well as from the Unmediated Observation and Inner Sense models.
In using beliefs about the external world as the basis for this type of inference, Dretske's version of the Transparency model avoids one problem faced by most inferential models: if they purport to account for all knowledge of one's own mental states, they lead to a regress. They ground knowledge of a mental state on an inference from knowledge of other mental states, which according to the model is inferred from knowledge of other mental states, and so on (Boghossian 1989). But the use of external objects invites other worries, given the large inferential gap between non-mental and mental states. An objection to Dretske's account questions whether any belief that would justify the required inference from external-world facts to mental states could itself be justified (Aydede 2003). Even supposing that there were such a belief, it seems unlikely that everyone capable of self-knowledge has it. Dretske might respond by claiming that awareness of external objects is all that could ground self-awareness, and so it must somehow perform this task, in a way yet to be determined.
While Dretske's version of the Transparency model concerns mental representations generally, most versions of this model focus on belief. In fact, as we shall see, one problem for the Transparency model is its apparent incapacity to cover all of the knowledge of our own minds that we seem to have. Concerning belief, recall the claim from Evans quoted above:
[I]n making a self-ascription of belief, one's eyes are, so to speak, or occasionally literally, directed outward—upon the world. If someone asks me ‘Do you think there is going to be a third world war?,’ I must attend, in answering him, to precisely the same outward phenomena as I would attend to if I were answering the question ‘Will there be a third world war?’ (Evans 1982, 225)
This passage suggests that, in order to determine whether one believes that p, one must try to determine whether it is the case that p, and one does this by examining the relevant evidence regarding p. This method is significantly different from ordinary perception. Knowledge by ordinary perception requires directing one's attention towards the object of knowledge, whereas on the current view one directs one's attention away from the object of knowledge, the belief, and toward the external world instead. Our ability to ascertain our beliefs by looking outward at the beliefs’ objects is attributed to the ‘transparency’ of belief. One's own beliefs are transparent to one in that one does not notice them as beliefs, but instead looks ‘through’ them directly to their objects.
Martin nicely expresses a puzzle about the claim that knowledgeable self-attributions of belief is acquired by an ‘outward’ look. ”[W]hy should the evidence that the subject has about how the world is have any bearing on what beliefs a particular person has?” (Martin 1998, 110). That is, what one sees when looking outward is the external world as one's evidence indicates that it is. Yet the content of the self-knowledge is an inner state of believing. So isn't the external world the wrong place to investigate in order to find out about one's inner states?
Recent versions of the Transparency model, in Fernandez (2003) and Byrne (forthcoming), seek to address this question by providing an epistemic account of transparency. Fernandez claims that, generally, evidence that p will lead to a belief that p. On his view, this means that one who has evidence that p—e.g., one who perceives that p, remembers that p, etc.—is warranted in self-attributing the belief that p. So believing that one believes the propositions that are supported by one's evidence is a generally reliable belief-forming process. Byrne describes a somewhat different source of warrant for self-attributions. He argues that following the rule “If p, believe that you believe that p” is in a certain way self-verifying. Byrne stipulates that one counts as following the rule only if one implements the consequent because one recognizes that p. Recognizing that p implies believing that p. Thus, only true beliefs will result from self-attributing the belief by following the rule. Attempts to follow this rule can fail, as when an outward look leads one to believe that p although p is actually false and so cannot be known. Even in such cases, though, the attempt to follow the rule leads to the true belief that one believes that p. And obviously, following the counterpart to this rule that calls for attributing the belief that p to someone else is not generally accurate, since the other person may not believe the propositions that one's own outward looks reveal to be true. Byrne concludes that these features of the rule explain why our access to our own beliefs is privileged, in that attempting to follow this sort of rule is especially conducive to knowing one's own beliefs.
The idea that one looks outward to determine one's own states need not be restricted to the case of beliefs. A parallel case can be made for desires: when asked, “do you want some ice cream?”, I do not look inward to consult my desires, but instead I think about ice cream, to determine its desirability. A somewhat different case can be made for sensations: when asked “are you experiencing pain in your ankle?”, I consider whether the ankle (a non-mental object) has the quality of hurting, rather than thinking about my pain as such.
It is noteworthy that both the Inner Sense model and the Transparency model locate the asymmetry between self-knowledge and other-knowledge as a difference in the direction of attention. For the Inner Sense view, what is special about self-knowledge is that it proceeds via a special perception-like mechanism, which is unique in being directed inward. For the Transparency model, what is special about self-knowledge, relative to knowledge of others’ mental states, is that it proceeds from directing one's attention outward, towards the features of the world which the mental state represents. Knowledge of others’ mental states may incorporate knowledge of their environment, but even on the Transparency model, it will involve attending to the other person and not just to the features of the world her mental state represents.
One objection to the Transparency model was discussed above: that the ‘looking outward’ method doesn’t allow us to determine pre-existing mental states, but rather serves as an invitation to form new mental states. Some of these new states will be renewed affirmations of propositions that we already believe. Still, this procedure seems not to describe a way for us come to know what belief states we are currently in.
Another worry about this model is that it is relevant only to a small subset of our beliefs: occurrent judgments based on current evidence. Byrne's rule will be helpful in explaining this worry. The first step in enacting the rule is to try to determine whether p, by examining the world. For instance, if p is “it is bad luck to have a black cat cross one's path”, I may examine the relation between black cats and fortune, and conclude that this is a baseless superstition. However, this exercise may not shake my long-held belief that black cats bring bad luck. I may remain firmly disposed to go far out of my way to avoid meeting black cats, retain the tendency to steer my enemies towards black cats, etc. This is not to deny that, at the moment I reflect on the evidence, I occurrently judge that encounters with black cats are harmless. But my deep-seated superstitious belief may withstand this counter-evidence, and the Transparency model seems not to explain how I gain access to this belief (Gertler forthcoming).
In response, proponents of the Transparency model might argue that we simply lack privileged access to dispositional beliefs that run counter to our current evidence. However, there is reason to think that we can access these beliefs by another sort of introspective method. A study by Schultheiss and Brunstein (1999) suggests that I could detect my superstition by a kind of simulation: I imagine encountering a black cat, and notice that this exercise of imagination elicits a slight feeling of dread. But noticing such a feeling is not the sort of outward investigation that is sanctioned by the Transparency model.
A final difficulty is that much of our self-knowledge seems not to be available from our judgments about the external world. For example, in many instances we know such things as what we are imagining, what we have decided to do, and what affective condition we are in, such as feeling eager or amused. None of this self-knowledge seems to be available by giving our attention to the external world.
The accounts of self-knowledge canvassed thus far share a common feature: they gloss what is special about self-attributions in terms that are not only epistemic but empirical. It is obvious that the Inner Sense model, which emphasizes similarities between introspection and ordinary perception, sees self-knowledge as an empirical matter. And it is also plain that the Transparency model interprets self-knowledge as empirical, since it holds that we determine our own states in part by gathering evidence about external matters that can be known only empirically. While this is less obvious, the Unmediated Observation model is empirical as well. For it portrays introspection as a process of inner examination, albeit one whose objects are directly available to the introspective faculty. By contrast, the next set of views (subsections 2.4–2.6) highlight the importance of a priori or rationality-based connections between mental states and self-attributions. While the empirical and the rationalistic approaches to self-knowledge differ profoundly, some philosophers believe that certain types of states are known empirically, while others are known through purely rational means. For instance, Zimmerman (2008) applies an empirical model to our knowledge of our own experiences, and a rationalistic model to knowledge of beliefs.
Proponents of the Rationality model reject the notion that self-knowledge consists in introspective access to evidence, or perception-like reliability. But this rejection leaves room for an alternative epistemic analysis of self-knowledge. We will examine two versions of the Rationality model, one that is purely epistemic and one that is partially non-epistemic.
Purely epistemic versions of the Rationality model claim that rationality can justify self-attributions. On one such model (Gallois 1996), anyone who fails to self-attribute beliefs will be faced with “a bizarre picture of the world”, since a change in beliefs will appear, to the subject, as an inexplicable change in the world itself. Because a rational person can know a priori that the world is not bizarre, the ability to self-attribute beliefs is a requirement on rationality. These self-attributions are epistemically underwritten: for conscious beliefs are at least subjectively justified, and one is rationally justified in taking herself to believe everything for which she has subjective justification. That is, your evidence that it is raining suffices to justify your belief that you believe that it is raining. This account covers knowledge of other propositional attitude states as well: for instance, one's reasons for desiring something can suffice to justify her belief that she desires that thing.
In claiming that one's evidence about p can justify a self-attribution of the belief that p, Gallois’ account is broadly similar to the Transparency model just discussed. But the Transparency model emphasizes the reliability of this connection, and construes the resulting justification in epistemically externalist terms. By contrast, Gallois takes the relevant justification to be epistemically internalist, as it derives from the a priori rational belief that the world is not bizarre.
Shoemaker (1994) offers a version of the Rationality model which is only partially epistemic. He argues that no rational person who had the concepts ‘belief’, ‘desire’, ‘pain’, etc., could be incapable of self-knowledge—in his terms, “self-blind”. For a self-blind person would not function as a normal, rational person. He would (i) fall into certain conceptual errors, such as asserting transparency-violating sentences (“It's raining but I believe that it isn't raining”); (ii) lack the ability to share his beliefs with others, and hence to engage in cooperative endeavors; (iii) be devoid of true agency, since agency involves higher-order deliberation regarding lower-order states; and (iv) regard himself “as a stranger”, e.g., in observing his own pain-avoidance behavior without grasping his own pain.
Importantly, Shoemaker sees the capacity for self-knowledge as an essential part of our rational nature. He rejects the notion that self-knowledge is a matter of access to logically independent evidence, on the grounds that this notion treats our capacity for self-knowledge as contingent. He therefore rejects perceptual models of self-knowledge that construe higher-order states of self-awareness, and the lower-order states they concern, as ‘distinct existences’. If the relation between lower-order states and higher-order self-attributions is causal—Shoemaker (1994) is undecided about this—the causal relation here is importantly different from the relation posited by the Inner Sense model. For it is essential to lower-order states that, under certain conditions, they give rise to awareness of them. One way to secure this necessary connection, while allowing that higher-order beliefs are caused by the lower-order states they concern, is to construe one or both of these in functional terms. This option was envisioned by David Lewis:
Suppose that among the platitudes [of commonsense psychology] are some to the effect that introspection is reliable: ‘belief that one is in pain never occurs unless pain occurs’ or the like. ... Then the necessary infallibility of introspection is assured. Two states cannot be pain and belief that one is in pain, respectively (in the case of a given individual or species) if the second ever occurs without the first. (Lewis 1972, 258)
A final difference between self-knowledge and perceptual knowledge, on Shoemaker's account, is that the former is “immune to error through misidentification relative to the first-person pronoun” (Shoemaker 1968). This means that when we introspectively grasp that there is pain, for instance, we cannot be mistaken about whose pain it is. By contrast, it is clearly possible to perceptually recognize that a property is instantiated, yet misidentify the object which instantiates it: perhaps I think that the brick building in the distance is my house, when in fact it is my neighbor's barn.
Because it limits the sorts of error that are possible, Shoemaker characterizes his own view as somewhat Cartesian. But of course the Rationality model is not fully Cartesian. First, the Cartesian Unmediated Observation model is an empirical model in that it construes introspection as a kind of observation. Second, according to that model self-awareness is something that occurs within the subject, by a process ordinarily unknown to third-person observers. Shoemaker instead claims that anyone who appears to be self-aware is, in fact, self-aware; there is no inner process, hidden from others, which could allow one's epistemic state to deviate from apparent behavioral manifestations of it. (Compare Ryle 1949, Sellars 1963.) For instance, he thinks that appearing rational—avoiding (i)–(iv) above—is conclusive evidence that one knows one's own states in a distinctively first-person way. This differs from Gallois’ version of the Rationality model, which treats the capacity for self-awareness as, most basically, a fact about the subject's inner life.
In its insistence that the possession of certain mental concepts entails a capacity for self-knowledge, and its rejection of hidden “inner” processes, this second version of the Rationality model resonates with non-epistemic accounts (discussed in 2.5 and 2.6). Still, the view qualifies as epistemic because the rationally necessitated link between mental states and self-attributions that it posits is an epistemic one.
Siewert (2003) has argued that Shoemaker's account faces a circularity worry. In order for me to accept, on the basis of Shoemaker's argument, that I am an accurate introspector, it seems I must have reasons to believe that I am rational. After all, Shoemaker claims that my general accuracy is ensured by my rationality. And it is unclear how to establish that I am rational without using the accuracy of my self-attributions, or how to establish that I’m an accurate self-attributor without using the fact of my rationality. (For a related criticism, which challenges whether self-blindness is incompatible with rationality, see Kind (2003). For a slightly different worry about Gallois’ version of the Rationality model, see Gertler (2000b).)
More generally, the chief problem for the Rationality model is to defend the picture of rationality on which it depends. It may be objected that this picture is overly demanding, in that the results of failing to self-attribute beliefs—e.g., having “a bizarre picture of the world”, or satisfying one or more of Shoemaker's (i)–(iv)—is compatible with a modest degree of rationality. For instance, the phenomenon of self-deception (discussed in Section 4 below) poses a prima facie difficulty for the claim that rational agents cannot be self-blind. Of course, proponents of the Rationality model are free to use a robust notion of rationality; after all, they do not claim that all subjects meet the requirements for rationality. But requiring an excessively high degree of rationality threatens to trivialize the model. For the more rational subjects are, the less surprising it is that they are self-aware.
Epistemic accounts seek to provide an epistemological picture that meshes with the special—in some cases, only slightly special—epistemic character of self-knowledge. But as noted above (1.2), some philosophers deny that the special character of self-attributions consists in an epistemic feature. These denials have two main sources: (i) broadly Wittgensteinian worries about inner operations conducted in private language, unknowable by others; and (ii) the belief that, by exclusively focusing on the epistemic, these accounts ignore the self-evaluation inherent in recognizing one's own states, and thus neglect the fact that we are responsible for our attitudes (Sartre 1956).
The first non-epistemic account of introspection is the Commitment Model. Proponents of this model argue that purely epistemic models don’t do justice to what is special about self-knowledge: that in recognizing an attitude, one also implicitly endorses—avows—it.
But, as I conceive of myself as a rational agent, my awareness of my belief is awareness of my commitment to its truth, a commitment to something that transcends any description of my psychological state. (Moran 1997, 151)
We may allow any manner of inner events of consciousness, any exclusivity and privacy, any degree of privilege and special reliability, and their combination would not add up to the ordinary capacity for self-knowledge. For the connection with the avowal of one's attitudes would not be established by the addition of any degree of such epistemic ingredients. (Moran 2001, 93)
One who treats her own thoughts as simple objects of knowledge, without taking any responsibility for them, is “self-alienated”. (This complements Shoemaker's contention that failure to self-attribute thoughts may lead to treating oneself “as a stranger”.) While we may have epistemic access to our own states which others lack, proponents of the Commitment model hold that what is most distinctive about self-awareness is this: so long as a rational person attributes attitudes to herself as such (i.e., as ‘mine’), she must be committed to those attitudes. The requirement that one be committed to one's self-attributed attitudes ties in with the transparency of mental states. We reflect on our attitudes by directly considering their contents; it is because we consider our attitudes and their contents inseparably that we avoid pragmatic paradoxes such as “It is raining but I believe that it isn’t” and “Ice cream is wholly undesirable, but I want some”. (These are known as ‘Moore Paradoxes’, after Moore (1942).) Despite the fact that such statements may be true, one who utters them apparently fails to grasp that the subject whose attitudes are specified is identical to the person making the utterance. Grasping this identity will lead any rational person to self-attribute only those attitudes she endorses. But whereas epistemic accounts explain this result by claiming that awareness of the lower-order state justifies (and causes) the self-attribution, the Commitment model explains it by reference to the fact that avowing the state commits one to endorsing it. Because of its focus on non-epistemic responsibility and commitment, this model is especially relevant to debates in moral psychology. (See 3.4 below.)
There is a noteworthy hybrid account, advanced by Peacocke (1998), which combines elements of the Commitment model with elements of the Rationality model. Like the Rationality model, it claims that rational subjects who possess the concepts ‘belief’, ‘desire’, etc., are necessarily self-aware. But it also sees commitment to the attitude as a requirement on self-knowledge. A direct grasp of a conscious, occurrent attitude constitutes knowledge if it simultaneously causes and rationalizes a self-attributing belief. And the conscious attitude will simultaneously cause and rationalize the belief if and only if it is one the subject would endorse. By making the belief rational, in these conditions, the presence of the conscious attitude justifies the belief; the account is thus at least partially epistemic, and closely related to the Rationality model. Yet in requiring that a subject be disposed to endorse a self-attributed attitude, it is also similar to the Commitment model. Martin (1998) questions whether Peacocke's account is ultimately substantial enough to explain first-person access.
The Commitment model appears to have only limited application. It is unclear how one can be “committed to” a sensation in the same way that one is committed to beliefs, desires, and intentions.
But even in this restricted realm, the Commitment model may not be epistemologically adequate. The model seems not to explain how commitment to an attitude can provide warrant or justification for a self-attribution of that attitude. Moran does deny that what is most distinctive about self-knowledge is an epistemic feature; still, the model will not qualify as an account of self-knowledge unless it provides some reason to think that the relevant self-attributions have the epistemic qualifications required for knowledge.
A related worry, voiced by O'Brien (2003), is that Moran's account is too demanding. She argues that commitment to an attitude, based in one's reasons for the attitude, will not justify a self-attribution of the attitude unless the subject understands the link between the reason and the presence of the attitude itself. For instance, my self-attribution of the belief that p, which is based in my considering whether p, is justified only if I recognize that my reasons for accepting p are evidence that I believe that p. But this requires, in turn, a reflective grasp of the nature of deliberation that seems unnecessary for ordinary self-attributions. (O'Brien 2003, 379-81).
A natural response would be to maintain that, in these cases, the link between reasons and belief is what justifies the self-attributions; the thinker needn’t be aware of that link. But Moran appears to accept that ordinary self-attributions involve at least an implicit understanding of the nature of deliberation. He concedes that, on the Commitment model, reasons for attitudes are so closely related to actual attitudes that this model “brings us up to the region of something like a Transcendental assumption of Rational Thought as it has figured elsewhere in Kantian and post-Kantian philosophy, as venerable and familiar as it is obscure.” (Moran 2003, 406). Moran's concession raises challenges for the Commitment model that are similar to those facing the Rationality Model. The Commitment model must somehow accommodate cases of (apparently) rational agents falling prey to self-deception; and it must provide a notion of rationality that is robust enough to bear the substantial implications which the model requires, but not so robust that it trivializes the account.
The Commitment model shares with other non-epistemic models the challenge of accommodating the strong intuition that what differentiates self-knowledge from knowledge in other realms is, first and foremost, an epistemic feature. For instance, it might be argued that an epistemic model will best explain what is special about self-knowledge, while the Commitment model pertains to distinct issues. These issues include: what is involved, conceptually and psychologically, in reflecting on one's attitudes considered as one's own; and what is required for avoiding self-alienation or maintaining agential integrity. But even if Moran's version of the Commitment model does not explain self-knowledge, it may provide a set of desiderata for such an explanation.
The second non-epistemic model construes self-attributions as performances that express one's mental states. It highlights the similarity between self-attributions and other modes of self-expression, such as shouting “yay!” or “ouch!” or “give me that!” These expressions or performances have no propositional content; they cannot be true or false. The most extreme version of this model, Pure Expressivism, holds that self-attributions that appear to be propositional—such as “I am happy”, “I am in pain”, and “I want that”—are also devoid of propositional content, but express one's mental states in much the same way that shouting “yay!” expresses joy, and blushing expresses embarrassment. It's not clear whether anyone has seriously defended Pure Expressivism, but some have interpreted Wittgenstein as holding this sort of view. In diagnosing the apparent propositional structure of self-attributions as merely apparent, Pure Expressivism parallels Expressivism in ethics.
The deepest objections to Pure Expressivism target its implication that self-attributions are non-propositional. For instance, if self-attributions are non-propositional, then subjects seem unable to give a true (or false) description of their own states. But Pure Expressivism allows that others can describe one's state, correctly or incorrectly. The idea that subjects are thus restricted is unpalatable on its own; and it blocks this view from accommodating substantial first-person authority, since the subject cannot so much as articulate her own condition.
The appeal of Pure Expressivism lies in its recognition that the subject is uniquely situated to express her own states. Bar-On and Long have formulated a ‘Neo-Expressivist’ view also based in this recognition (Bar-On and Long 2001, 2003; Bar-On 2004). Neo-Expressivism avoids the strongest objections to Pure Expressivism by allowing that self-attributions are propositional. What is special about some self-attributions—attributions they call ‘avowals’—is that they are not the product of observation or reflection, and are not based on reasons. Instead, avowals serve to express or “give voice to” one's mental states, by issuing directly from those states. This process is not an epistemically special method for determining one's own states; Bar-On and Long deny that there is any such special method. But avowals are nonetheless special, on their view, for it is only through an avowal that one can express a condition in a way which both possesses propositional content and is epistemically direct. Avowals are epistemically direct in that they “do not involve the use of epistemic methods of identification and recognition.” (Bar-On and Long 2003, 189). A blush directly expresses one's embarrassment, but is not propositional; a verbal report that “my toenails are painted red” is propositional, but is epistemically indirect. Exclaiming “I want the teddy!” is both propositional and directly expresses one's desire for the teddy. (To say that this is epistemically direct is not to say that the subject has any sort of special access to her own states, on this view. Rather, it is to deny that avowals are epistemically based at all.)
Neo-Expressivism thus identifies the distinctive element of self-attributions as non-epistemic. Still, the account sees first-person authority as justified by the subject's unique ability to express her states, and hence rejects outright epistemic deflationism.
At first blush, the epistemic import of this ‘authority’ seems to be primarily third-personal: others are warranted in treating the subject's avowals as reflections of her states. This warrant stems from the fact that avowals—such as “I want the teddy!”—are ordinarily caused by the corresponding mental states (without any intervening recognitional process), and are therefore likely to be true. Neo-Expressivism can thereby explain why one who witnesses someone avowing “I want the teddy!” is warranted in attributing a desire for the teddy.
But Bar-On claims that this account also explains what warrants the avowing subject in self-attributing the desire. She says that subjects enjoy a ‘default entitlement’ relative to the content of their avowals. This entitlement appears to derive from the fact that each of us is uniquely placed to avow our own states, in a way that does not involve the types of epistemic processes that others use: one need not distinguish the state from a class of alternatives, identify oneself as the subject of the state, etc. Rather, simply being in a particular mental state warrants an avowal of that state.
The [avowed] state is not a justifier in the traditional sense, since it represents no epistemic effort on the subject's part. But the subject is still epistemically warranted—warranted simply through being in the state—and the avowal can still be said to represent an epistemic achievement on the subject's part. (Bar-On 2004, 390)
This picture of the epistemology of avowals raises some questions. One concerns the nature of avowals: in issuing an avowal, is the subject expressing a belief or judgment of the sort self-knowledge requires? Arguably, if the avowal “I want the teddy!” is directly triggered by her desire, she may not be making a self-attribution at all, despite the form of the uttered sentence. (The utterance may instead be an imperative, akin to “Give me the teddy!”.) A related worry is that, even if the avowal expresses a self-attribution, the notion of ‘default entitlement’ does not deliver the epistemic goods required for self-knowledge. It is unclear how simply having a mental state confers a positive epistemic status onto the content of an avowal of that state.
Neo-Expressivism thus faces a difficult challenge similar to that faced by the Commitment view. Each must explain how our self-attributions are epistemically grounded, without sacrificing a non-epistemic construal of the special features of self-attributions: viz., that self-attributions involve a commitment to one's attitudes, or that we are uniquely well-placed to avow our states. But as with the Commitment model, the value of Neo-Expressivism may lie outside its contribution to our understanding of the epistemology of self-knowledge. Neo-Expressivism may help us to understand how avowals provide third-person warrant, that is, warrant for others to attribute mental states to the avower.
This entry has thus far focused on knowledge of one's own mental states. Yet as was mentioned at the outset of this article, ‘self-knowledge’ can also be used to refer to knowledge of the self and its nature. Issues about knowledge of the self include: (1) how it is that one distinguishes oneself from others, as the object of a self-attribution; (2) whether self-awareness yields a grasp of the material or non-material nature of the self; (3) whether self-awareness yields a grasp of one's personal identity over time; and (4) what sort of self-understanding is required for rational or free agency. These issues are closely connected with referential semantics, the mind-body problem, the metaphysics of personal identity, and moral psychology, respectively. This section briefly sketches some prominent views about knowledge of the self arising from debates in these areas.
In self-attributing a mental state, I recognize the state as mine in some sense, and my self-attribution partially consists in a reference to myself. This reference is reflexive, in that I think of myself as myself and not, e.g., as BG, or as the shortest person in the room. Nozick (1981) underscores the significance of being able to thus refer to oneself: “To be an I, a self, is to have the capacity for reflexive self-reference.” This raises the question: how is it that I identify myself, and distinguish myself from others?
Consider: seeing a flushed red face on film, I might wonder whether the face I see is mine or my identical twin's, and therefore I may say, “someone is embarrassed, but is it me?” Evans (1982) argues that for some kinds of self-attributions, such a question will not arise. Adopting the term from Shoemaker (1968) mentioned above (2.4), he describes self-attributions of the relevant type as “immune to error through misidentification.”
None of the following utterances appears to make sense when the first component expresses knowledge gained in the appropriate way: “Someone's legs are crossed, but is it my legs that are crossed?”; “Someone is hot and sticky, but is it I who am hot and sticky?”; “Someone is being pushed, but is it I who am being pushed?” (Evans 1982, 220–1)
Evans believes that my immunity to error through misidentification, in such cases, shows that I identify myself directly in these cases. If in identifying myself as the one who is hot and sticky, I used some information beyond the information involved in determining that someone is hot and sticky, then I could possibly be justified in believing that someone was hot and sticky but mistaken in thinking that it was me. Because that scenario doesn't “make sense”, he thinks, I must recognize myself directly, without any identifying information.
Others deny that self-identification is direct, claiming instead that it occurs by way of some sort of description. For instance, Rovane argues that, in self-reference, the way one thinks of oneself can be analyzed as “the series of psychologically related intentional episodes to which this one [the current intentional episode] belongs” (Rovane 1993, 86). While Rovane sees intentional states as the anchor to self-reference, Howell (2006) provides an alternative descriptive picture, in which the self is identified through awareness of an occurrent sensation.
Proponents of descriptive accounts claim that such accounts can accommodate the fact that we don't actually err about who it is that is hot and sticky. For instance, Rovane claims that it is unsurprising that we are reliable self-identifiers, given that understanding ourselves and our place in the world is required for genuine agency. (We return to the issue of agency in 3.4 below.) Still, there is an important epistemic disagreement between those, like Evans, who claim that self-reference is “identification-free”, and those who claim that we refer to ourselves via a description. The former maintain that there is, in a real sense, no room for error about who is hot and sticky, whereas the latter will say that while such errors are possible, we simply avoid them.
Notably, both “direct reference” and descriptive accounts capture the reflexivity of first-person reference. (For descriptive accounts, this reflexivity lies in the fact that ‘this one’ refers to the very thought of which it is a part.) They thereby fit with the widely accepted belief that self-reference in the distinctively first-person mode is essentially indexical. (See Castañeda 1966, Perry 1979, Lewis 1979.) The dispute between Evans and Rovane is then, in part, a disagreement as to whether the indexical term ‘I’ refers to the self directly, as Evans believes, or instead refers via an implicit indexical of another sort, e.g. ‘this’ or ‘here’. In general, one's epistemology of self-identification will depend on what sort of indexical one considers most fundamental, in self-reference.
A final issue concerns the relation between self-awareness and awareness of other persons. On the leading traditional view of this relation, one first grasps that one bears psychological properties, and reasons by analogy to the conclusion that other creatures do as well. (This is the “argument from analogy” to the existence of other minds, articulated by J.S. Mill (1867).) Some recent philosophers have challenged this traditional view, contending that self-awareness is logically dependent on at least a conceptual grasp of other persons. For instance, here is Bermúdez:
[A] subject's recognition that he is distinct from the environment in virtue of being a psychological subject depends on his ability to identify himself as a psychological subject within a contrast space of other psychological subjects. (Bermúdez 1998, 274)
In a much-criticized piece of reasoning, Descartes (1641/1984) contrasts the certainty afforded by introspection with the dubitability of knowledge of the physical, to show that introspective objects (thoughts) are ontologically distinct from physical things. This strategy for supporting dualism has few current proponents. Commentators still adhere to the basic criticism lodged by Arnauld (1641/1984): that a purely epistemic premise cannot support an ontological conclusion. It is clearly possible to be (relatively) certain that there is water in the tub, while doubting that there is H2O in the tub; yet water is identical to H2O. Many contemporary materialists are similarly concerned to restrict the deliverances of introspection, arguing that while mental states appear, to introspection, to be non-physical, the grasp which introspection affords is partial at best, and systematically misleading at worst.
However, there are materialists who take the opposite tack: rather than rejecting self-reflection as a guide to ontology, they claim that some mental states appear physical. These arguments employ three types of self-reflection: introspective awareness of sensations, introspective awareness of perceptual states, and proprioceptive awareness of bodily states. Proprioception is the putatively direct, non-perceptual awareness of one's bodily state; it is what allows you to know that your arm is raised “from the inside”, that is, without looking at your arm.
The argument for materialism from proprioceptive awareness, due to Brewer (1995), is as follows. Proprioception is epistemically on a par with introspective knowledge, in that (i) it is a species of direct, non-inferential awareness, and (ii) it is “immune to error through misidentification of the first-person pronoun” in Shoemaker's sense (see 2.4 above).
Presumably, introspective awareness of mental states justifies the claim that we are mental beings, by virtue of its epistemic character. But proprioceptive awareness of physical states shares this epistemic character; so we are equally justified in the claim that we are physical beings. This argument falls short of disproving dualism, for it leaves open the question how our mental nature is related to our physical nature.
Brewer (1995) also builds an alternative argument along these lines, which seeks to rule out dualism by focusing on introspective awareness of sensations. This argument takes introspective awareness of sensations as intrinsically mental and, at the same time, intrinsically physical. Like the previous argument, it claims that awareness of physical properties is epistemologically equivalent to awareness of mental properties. But it goes further, contending that introspection provides an awareness of physical and mental properties, in sensations, as inextricable. It thus tries to block the possibility of distinctness between the mental subject and the physical subject.
A final argument to show that self-knowledge supports materialism, advanced by Cassam (1997), uses a somewhat different approach. Rather than relying on the spatial quality of bodily sensations or proprioception, this argument exploits one's awareness of one's own perceptual states. It says that in becoming aware of our own perceptual states and taking these states to represent a physical world, we are driven to conceive of ourselves as physical objects.
Broadly Cartesian objections to introspection-based arguments for materialism illuminate possible ways that the ontological conclusion can be flawed, consistent with the introspective evidence. For instance, the apparent proprioceptive awareness of the position of one's limbs could be nonveridical: an amputee might have a similar sense that her legs are crossed, even if she doesn’t, in fact, have any legs. (This does not violate Evans’ claim that such judgments are immune to error through misidentification: the error here is not one of misidentifying the subject, but instead of falsely ascribing a property to the self.) A similar argument could be made against the claim that sensations are intrinsically spatial, and that perceptual states represent a physical world. Even if one's sensations portray oneself as spatially extended, the idea that one is non-extended (immaterial) is logically consistent with the presence of those sensations or (apparent) perceptual states. Proponents of these arguments for materialism could respond by claiming either that knowledge of oneself as a mental thing is less certain than this alleged contrast implies, or that knowledge of oneself as a physical thing is more certain than it implies.
The ontological views described in the previous subsection have no immediate consequences for personal identity. For it may be that the criteria of persistence through time, for persons, differ from the criteria of persistence for (other) material objects even if, as materialists contend, a person at a time is necessarily constituted by some matter or other. (See the entry on personal identity.) Knowledge of mental states is not usually thought to provide any special insight into one's persistence through time, since it is typically assumed that one enjoys privileged access only to one's current states. In particular, the individual has no special insight into whether her current apparent memories are veridical, and so has no special way to determine whether a particular prior experience was hers. Since views about first-person access played a greater part in shaping theories of personal identity during the modern period than they do today, my brief remarks here will focus on that period.
As mentioned above, Descartes’ meditator uses the proposition that there is thinking occurring, to which she purportedly has immediate (indubitable) introspective access, to establish her own existence with certainty. But this does not allow the meditator to grasp a persisting self. For Descartes, the self, like every other substance, is not directly apprehended; it is understood only through its properties.
Hume also claims that we never directly apprehend the self. Unlike Descartes, he concludes from this that there is no substantial self. In a famous passage, Hume uses introspective awareness to show that the self is a non-substantial “bundle” of perceptions.
For my part, when I enter most intimately into what I call myself, I always stumble on some particular perception or other, of heat or cold, light or shade, love or hatred, pain or pleasure. I can never catch myself at any time without a perception, and can never observe anything but the perception. When my perceptions are remov’d for any time, as by sound sleep; so long am I insensible of myself, and may truly be said not to exist. (Hume 1739–40/1978, 252)
Locke agrees that self-reflection is important to the nature of the self. But while Descartes takes self-reflection to reveal that nature, Locke seems to suggest that one's self-conception constitutes the self.
[A person is] a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection, and considers itself as itself, the same thinking thing in different times and places. (Locke 1975, II.27.ix, my emphasis).
On some interpretations, what it is for an experience or action to belong to me (a Lockean person) is for me to appropriate it, or to impute it to myself (Winkler 1991). This interpretation underscores the importance of Locke's claim that ‘person’ is a forensic term.
‘Person’...is a forensic term, appropriating actions and their merit; and so belongs only to intelligent agents, capable of a law, and happiness, and misery. This personality extends itself beyond present existence to what is past, only by consciousness,- whereby it becomes concerned and accountable; owns and imputes to itself past actions, just upon the same ground and for the same reason as it does the present. (Locke 1689/1975, II.27.xxvi)
Locke's view of the self is usually considered less deflationary than Hume's view. But these philosophers agree that, in a very real sense, the nature of the self is bound up with one's reflections on one's states. For Hume, this means that the self is nothing over and above a constantly varying bundle of experiences. For Locke, it means that the self is defined by what we do—or, perhaps, can—self-attribute, through recollection and/or appropriation.
Kant repudiates the basic strategy shared by Locke and Hume, for he denies that self-awareness reveals objective facts about personal identity. He concurs with Descartes and Hume that we never directly apprehend the self (this fact is what he calls “the systematic elusiveness of the ‘I’”). And while he holds that we cannot avoid thinking of ourselves as persisting, unitary beings, he attributes this self-conception to necessary requirements for thought which do not directly support substantive ontological conclusions about the nature of the self.
A couple of contemporary views about personal identity are noteworthy in this context. Galen Strawson's (1997) view does not explicitly draw on introspective reflection, but it implies that the limits of a subject correspond to the limits of what could be introspectively grasped, at a moment. A subject is defined by (indeed, identified with) a period of experience which is ‘experientially unitary’. Since in humans an appropriately unified experience lasts no more than about three seconds, subjects are in fact very short-lived. Dainton and Bayne (2005) present a related view, which tries to avoid the result that subjects are very short-lived. On this view, personal identity is tied to (the capacity for) experiential continuity rather than experiential unity. But unlike Strawson's view, the continuity view is vulnerable to familiar objections concerning the possibility of branching streams of consciousness or ‘fission’.
The role of self-understanding in agency is a complex topic, and we can only briefly examine some leading positions on the issue here. Knowledge of one's relatively stable traits and dispositions—one's character—is believed, by some, to be crucial for the exercise of free agency. For instance, Taylor claims that self-reflection is imperative for being human (where this means, in part, being capable of agency),
[T]he human animal not only finds himself impelled from time to time to interpret himself and his goals, but … he is always already in some interpretation, constituted as human by this fact. (Taylor 1985, 75)
In a somewhat different vein, Frankfurt maintains that the capacity to rationally evaluate one's desires is required for freedom of the will. This rational evaluation issues in second-order desires, that is, desires concerning which desires to have or to act upon.
[N]o animal other than man … appears to have the capacity for reflective self-evaluation that is manifested in the formation of second-order desires. (Frankfurt 1971, 7)
It is only because a person has volitions of the second order that he is capable both of enjoying and of lacking freedom of the will. (ibid.,14)
These claims by Taylor and Frankfurt go beyond the merely pragmatic observation that a reasonable degree of self-understanding is required for effective action. Instead, they assert that what is distinctive about the exercise of a free will, in determining one's course of action, is that this exercise involves the capacity to critically reflect on one's basic goals and desires. (For a related recent view, see Bilgrami 2006.)
While Taylor, Frankfurt, and Bilgrami stress that a broad self-understanding is crucial for responsible agency, others claim that particular actions require some awareness of one's intentions in performing that action. For instance, Searle (1983) argues that intentions are always self-referential, in that when one performs an action X intentionally, the relevant intention to act includes an intention to X so as to fulfill that intention itself. Anscombe (1981) similarly emphasizes the significance of one's awareness of intentions in acting. In fact, on her view thoughts about actions, intentions, postures, etc. have a special status: it is only thoughts about such aspects of the self that are “unmediated, non-observational, and also are descriptions (e.g., ‘standing’) which are directly verifiable or falsifiable about the person” (Anscombe 1981, 35). And she also believes that action requires some awareness of these features of oneself. For criticism of the idea that action requires awareness of intention, see Cunning (1999).
One contemporary theory of practical reasoning, offered by Velleman (1989), casts knowledge of the self in a particularly important role. Velleman notes that we strongly desire to understand ourselves and, in particular, to understand our reasons for acting. On his view, this desire leads us to try to discern our action-motivating desires and beliefs. (He calls this attempt to gain self-awareness “reflective theoretical reasoning”.) But strikingly, Velleman thinks that the desire for self-understanding also leads us to model our actions on our predictions about how we will act. In this way, our expectations as to how we will act are themselves intentions to act. “Intentions to act … are the expectations of acting that issue from reflective theoretical reasoning” (Velleman 1989, 98). Thus, Velleman can say that our desire to understand what we are doing, at the moment we are doing it, is usually satisfied, since our predictions about how we will act are themselves intentions to act, and hence our beliefs about what we will do are “self-fulfilling expectations”.
Finally, there is an emerging literature which examine the effect of societal influences on subjects’ self-understanding and, thereby, on agency. See, e.g., Neisser and Jopling 1997 and Meyers 2002.
One who lacks self-knowledge may simply be ignorant about some aspect or state of the self, perhaps because he or she has not formed any relevant belief. But in extreme cases, an absence of accurate self- reflection, or ignorance about what is guiding one's reasoning, may allow one's interests to shape one's beliefs. (See the entry on self-deception.) When false beliefs are formed due to such motivations, the subject is self-deceived. The phenomenon of self-deception has received a great deal of attention; our discussion here will only touch the surface of this topic.
It seems clear that rational persons may sometimes engage in self-deception: in the face of clear evidence to the contrary, hopes and fears may lead one to believe that her spouse is faithful, or that she is popular, or (even) that she has a fatal disease. However, the idea of self-deception poses conceptual difficulties. The basic problem is that self-deception appears to involve a paradox (Davidson 1985): given that “deception” refers to a deliberate attempt to make someone believe a proposition one believes to be false, self-deception seems to require that one believes the proposition in question to be false. Yet when self-deception succeeds, one (also) believes the proposition in question to be true. And it is doubtful that a rational person can have two explicitly contradictory beliefs.
One way of resolving this difficulty is to see the self as partitioned, and to claim that rationality requires only that each “part” of the self is internally consistent. Self-deceived rational persons can be accommodated so long as the deceiving part of the self is distinct from the deceived part. This approach is exemplified by the claim (Freud 1923) that the unconscious may mislead the conscious self in an effort to shield it from awareness of painful facts.
An alternative approach to this paradox is to deny that self-deceived persons ordinarily have two contradictory beliefs. For instance, Mele (1997) provides an alternative analysis of the case of the husband who believes that his wife is faithful, despite strong evidence that she is having an affair. According to Mele, the husband's desire that his wife be faithful may lead him to fail to attend to the ample evidence that she is deceiving him, or to give too much weight to her declarations of love for him. In this way, Mele claims, the husband simply avoids the obvious conclusion that she is having an affair. Mele terms his view of self-deception ‘deflationist’, in that it denies that standard cases of self-deception are especially mysterious or pose special explanatory problems. (Compare Barnes 1997.)
Another key dispute about self-deception concerns whether persons deliberately engage in self-deception. Predictably, deflationists deny that self-deception must be intentional, while non-deflationists (I'll call these ‘traditionalists’, following Scott-Kakures 2002) maintain that deliberateness is central to self-deception. For instance, Bach (1997, 105) claims that self-deception requires an “active effort” on the part of the subject. Scott-Kakures (ibid.) defends a hybrid of deflationism and traditionalism.
Holton (2001) has offered a very different way of understanding self-deception. Holton argues that cases which are ordinarily glossed as cases of deceiving oneself are, in fact, simply cases in which one is deceived about the self. If the self is not the deceiver in these cases, but is simply that about which one is deceived, then no paradox arises.
In recent years, much of the literature which addresses self-knowledge has focused on the question whether content externalism (Burge 1979, Putnam 1975) is compatible with the sort of privileged access we take ourselves to enjoy. Content externalism is the view that mental content is partially determined by factors external to the subject, such as her physical environment, the practices of her language community, or her historical context. (See the entry on externalism about mental content.) There is a natural tension between this view and the claim that we enjoy privileged self-knowledge, especially when first-person privilege is explained by a special access to ‘inner’ facts. For we are not privileged, relative to others, as to the presence of external factors in our own environment. Nearly all who accept content externalism claim that this tension is merely apparent; few are willing to completely abandon first-person privilege. Because of the popularity of content externalism, the need to resolve this tension is pressing.
Arguments to show that content externalism is incompatible with first-person privilege are principally of two types. The first (Boghossian 1989) charges that, if content is determined by environmental factors, then a subject cannot know her own mental contents without examining her environment. In response to this charge, externalists (Burge 1988, Heil 1988) have tried to show that the contents of self-attributions will appropriately track the contents of the lower-order states they concern, even if the subject remains ignorant of the salient environmental factors. Some externalists (Gibbons 1996) argue that the environmental factors which shape lower-order mental contents will also shape the contents of self-attributions. Others deny that the environment directly affects the content of self-attributions, claiming instead that self-attributions inherit their contents from the lower-order, self-attributed states. For their part, externalism's opponents have claimed that these tracking relationships are insufficiently reliable, or not of the right sort to underwrite substantive knowledge. Brown (2004) defends externalism from this objection, arguing that the alternative situations alleged to threaten self-knowledge, involving purely environmental differences, are not relevant alternatives to the actual situation. But she concedes that externalism is in tension with the robust self-knowledge posited by Fregean theories of content, and argues that this is reason to reject Fregeanism. (Wikforss (2006) similarly contends that externalism is at odds with Fregeanism, but concludes that this undermines externalism.)
The second type of argument (McKinsey 1991, Brown 1995) claims that if we can know our own mental contents through introspection, and those contents are determined in part by environmental factors, then contingent facts about the environment can be deductively inferred from introspective self-knowledge. But it is highly implausible that we enjoy “privileged access to the world”. Some externalists (Tye and McLaughlin 1998) have tried to block this challenge by saying that an introspective subject must have empirical information about the concepts which her mental states employ, and/or empirical information about the environment, in order to determine how the environment contributes to her mental contents. If this response succeeds, it shows that knowledge of the environment is empirical after all. Critics of this argument (Boghossian 1997) have claimed that the relevant information can be known non-empirically, and hence externalism implies that privileged self-knowledge does yield “privileged access to the world” after all. Other externalists (Davies 2003) have argued that one may be warranted in believing that one has a particular thought, and warranted in believing that having that thought requires the presence of certain environmental factors, while lacking warrant for the belief that those factors are present. In other words, one's warrant for the first two premises of a deductive argument does not ‘transmit’ to the conclusion. Finally, some externalists (Sawyer 1998) defend the idea that introspective self-knowledge can yield limited information about the environment.
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Anthologies on self-knowledge:
- Cassam, Q., ed., 1994, Self-Knowledge, New York: Oxford University Press.
- Gertler, B., ed., 2003, Privileged Access: Philosophical Accounts of Self-Knowledge, Aldershot: Ashgate Publishing.
- Hatzimoysis, A., ed., forthcoming, Self-Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Hill, C., ed., 2000, Philosophical Topics 28(2): Introspection.
- Ludlow, P., and Martin, N., eds., 1998, Externalism and Self-Knowledge, Stanford, CA: CSLI Publications.
- Wright, C., Smith, B., and Macdonald, C., eds., 1998, Knowing Our Own Minds, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
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