Supplement to Externalism and Self-Knowledge

The Epistemic Status of Self-Verifying Judgments

Predictably, Burge's view of self-verifying judgments is not universally accepted. Indeed, some philosophers “incredulously stare” at the idea that mere mortals can know anything infallibly. But substance can be given to this resistance by targeting Burge's explanation of the infallibility. Burge holds that the relevant judgments are infallible in virtue of a self-referential mechanism in the attribution (“with this very thought”). This mechanism is supposedly what “locks” the second-order judgment to the first-order thought, thus ensuring that the judgment never misses its target. Yet if the second-order judgment is self-referential, then this at best explains why the second-order judgment is locked to itself. It does not show why it is locked to the first-order thought (Parent 2007).

However, this problem can be avoided if the phrase ‘with this very thought’ in (W) is replaced with ‘forthwith’, where the latter just denotes the first-order thought expressed by the complement clause of (W). For that matter, ‘with this very thought’ could just be deleted. For plausibly, the second order judgment has a compositional structure such that the first order thought is literally an (ineliminable) part of the judgment. If so, then tokening the second order judgment necessitates the occurrence of the first-order thought—just in the way that writing ‘I am thinking that water is wet’ necessitates writing down its complement clause ‘water is wet’. Since the occurrence of the first order thought is precisely what the judgment contends, the judgment is thus invariably true, i.e., infallible (Parent 2007).

Besides having us know our thoughts too well, Burge is also criticized for having us know our thoughts not well enough. For instance, it has been suggested that a slow switch victim will not understand her own first-order thought well enough to count as knowing it (Cassam 1994, Wikforss 2004 is also relevant). Others have complained that, even if a self-verifying judgment is infallible, it is unclear whether it qualifies as genuine knowledge (Brueckner 1990; 1994).

On the latter issue, one might first allow that the relevant judgments are de facto infallible for the reason Burge says. Yet consider that if (W) is armchair-known, then (if knowledge is closed under known entailment), one might ipso facto armchair-know that:

(W*) I am not currently thinking that water2 is wet.

(Things are clearer here if we use ‘water1’ to express our Earthian concept and ‘water2’ express the Twin Earthian concept.) However, suppose a skeptic raises the possibility of a slow switch, a scenario where your water1 thoughts have been stealthily switched to water2 thoughts. When taking this possibility seriously, it seems an externalist cannot be confident about (W*) from the armchair. Yet if she does not armchair-know this consequence of (W), then (assuming epistemic closure) she does not armchair-know (W) itself (Brueckner 1990; 1994, but contrast with Brueckner 2010). Burge's second-order judgments hence fail as genuine knowledge, and the compatibilist's case falters.

The argument presses that Oscar does not know what he thinks if he cannot discriminate between water1 thoughts and water2 thoughts. This represents a kind of “discrimination requirement” on knowledge (reminiscent of Goldman 1976). And even armed with self-verifying judgments, Oscar apparently cannot discriminate in this way. Yet if Oscar lacks this discriminatory ability, then it seems he could be thinking one of two different thoughts, for all he can know from the armchair. But normally, Oscar may well know his thoughts even if he cannot so discriminate, since water2 thoughts are usually “irrelevant alternatives” that are properly ignored. In fact, adjudicating this relevant alternatives issue may be the central task with slow switch arguments, and it is more appropriate to discuss it separately (section 3.2). This controversy is certainly not unique to Burge's view.

Nevertheless, in Burge's case, the discrimination issue is one instance of a larger concern for his view. The problem is that an infallible judgment does not obviously count as bona fide knowledge. Besides discriminatory abilities, some kind of epistemic warrant also seems necessary—and it is not apparent how self-verifying judgments are warranted. However, Burge (1996) uses here the notion of an “epistemic entitlement” as what warrants a self-verifying judgment. These epistemic entitlements are reminiscent of W.'s proposal (from section 2.3) that a speaker enjoys, somewhat automatically, a warrant to one's self-attributions. Like W., Burge even describes this as the “default” epistemic status, which need not be earned via some tight, philosophical argument. However, Burge does not hold merely that the default status is granted by a convention of the “language game.” Rather, he attempts to explain the entitlement further, as rooted not only in (a) the infallibility of self-verifying judgments, but more notably in (b) the subject's capacity for critical reasoning.

“Critical reasoning” is reasoning that occurs while aware of one's reasons as reasons. Concordantly, critical reasoning assumes that we make judgments about our thoughts and their status as reasons. Yet that of course requires knowledge of what those thoughts are (cf. Shoemaker 1988, Moran 2001). Indeed, without knowledge of these thoughts, the attempt to critically evaluate them seems absurd. But for Burge, entitlement to one's second-order judgments arises in light of this. Since critical reasoning depends on knowing the thoughts deployed, that establishes an epistemic entitlement to our judgments about those thoughts. So the entitlement is not seen as assigned merely by convention; it is instead established by the need, within critical thinking, for knowledgeable self-attributions.

Of note, Burge holds that the entitlement persists even through Oscar's slow switch ordeal. Yet it may not be obvious why or even whether this is so. Moreover, some have raised a kind of Euthyphro dilemma for Burge (Peacocke 1996). Is one entitled to self-attributions because of their role in critical reasoning, as Burge would have it? Or rather, do these attributions have this role in critical reasoning because one is entitled to them? Contra Burge, the latter can seem more plausible—and so, the entitlement may need to be explained on independent grounds.Also, for a different problem with Burge's view on critical reasoning, see the supplementary document, A Problem with Critical Reasoning.

Because of such problems, others have attempted alternative explanations of our epistemic entitlement to self-verifying judgments. For instance, one's explanation might emphasize “conceptual redeployment,” i.e., that the very same concepts occur in the self-attribution as occurs in the thought itself (Peacocke 1996, although Burge 1998, p. 359 also utilizes this idea.) Alternatively, such judgments could be seen as warranted in virtue of their perfect reliability, in accord with a reliabilist epistemology (Gibbons 1996, Brown 2004). Yet another option is to regard such judgments as warranted in virtue of the target first-order states being “directly accessible” (where this is spelled out in functionalist terms) (Zimmerman 2006; 2008, cf. Shoemaker 1996). Finally, some have suggested that a self-verifying judgment counts as knowledge if, at the time of judgment, the subject is also reflectively aware of its self-verifying nature (Goldberg 2005a; 2006a).

Copyright © 2013 by
T. Parent <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.