Notes to Religion and Science

1. But what about the constructive empiricist and the instrumentalist? Well, at any rate they are aiming at true predictions, or theories that make true predictions, even if not at true theories.

2. We distinguish here between belief in God and belief that God exists. Belief in God includes belief that God exists and, in addition, involves trusting God, making his purposes your own, identifying with him and/or his purposes, worship, commitment to him, and the like.

3. There are exceptions. You use a computer to calculate the product of a couple of 6 digit numbers; the computer comes up with a certain number n. Your knowledge that this product is indeed n—which is, of course, necessary—is a posteriori; it depends on your a posteriori knowledge that the computer produces the right answers. I name the actual world ‘α’; then it is a necessary truth that (say) there was a US civil war in α, but your only way of knowing this necessary truth is a posteriori.

4. Some have claimed that there are contingent truths of which we have a priori knowledge. Others claim this is a mistake; see Plantinga 1974, p. 8, fn. 1.

5. “If any simple explanation existed, it would rather be in terms of the customary ruthlessness of societal authority in suppressing minority opinion, and in Galileo's case with Aristotelianism rather than Christianity in authority” (Drake 1980, v).

6. The suggestion is not that no scientific theory can contain metaphysical elements; the suggestion is only that this particular claim is clearly metaphysical, and also clearly an add-on: not part of evolutionary theory as currently stated and understood.

7. “Obviously entailing”: according to most traditional theistic belief, the existence of God is a necessary truth. If so, however, all propositions will entail it, so that the condition in question has to be stated with more circumspection.

8. I should emphasize that HBC is a project, not a tool. The tools used by historical Biblical critics—knowledge of the relevant language, culture and history, reader response criticism, narrative criticism, ideas from social science—are also, of course, available to traditional Biblical commentators, as well as to those who address the questions addressed by historical Biblical critics but from a perspective unconstrained by MN.

9. A defeater, for a belief B I hold, is another belief D I acquire, such that, given my particular array of beliefs and the strength with which I hold them, I cannot rationally continue to accept B as long as I accept D; if D is a partial defeater for B, then I can't rationally continue to accept (believe) B to the same degree.

10. Suppose a cache of letters is discovered and the latest techniques date them to the first half of the 1st century; in the earlier letters the apostles plan the hoax, and in the later congratulate each other on the smoothness with which it was carried out … . See van Fraassen (1993), p. 322.

11. Of course we must also delete propositions that entail B, and perhaps certain propositions probabilistically related to B. In general, there will be more than one way to do this. Without getting into the details, let's say (a bit vaguely) that EBS-B is any subset of EBS that doesn't entail B and is otherwise maximally similar to EBS.

12. Alternatively, scientific naturalism should be seen as the injunction or resolve not to countenance any entities not endorsed by contemporary science; see van Fraassen (2002).

13. Or, to accommodate content externalism (“meaning ain't in the head”), on NP properties together with certain environmental properties. This qualification will be presupposed but not mentioned in what follows.

14. A similar argument can be made for the low probability of R on N&E and reductive materialism, the thought that content properties just are (complex) NP properties; space limitations prevent giving the argument here.

Copyright © 2010 by
Alvin Plantinga <>

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