Supplement to Relativism


Some concepts can occur in good ampliative inferences, whereas others cannot. This is vividly illustrated by a pair of odd predicates that Nelson Goodman defined in the late 1940s (see, e.g., Goodman, 1984). Although Goodman deals with predicates, it will be useful here to adapt his definitions to concepts.

  • An object is grue just in case it is observed before 2010 and is green, or else is not so observed and is blue.
  • An object is bleen just in case it is observed before 2010 and is blue, or else is not so observed and is green.

These new concepts are “positional” in the sense that they depend on location in time (here we've set it at 2010). But positionality alone doesn't disqualify a concept from a legitimate role in induction; the concept of occurring within 30 milliseconds of the big bang is positional, but it can occur in perfectly good hypotheses in cosmology.

The concepts grue and bleen may seem to be parasitic on our color concepts, but if some culture used Goodman's concepts instead of ours, their definitions of our concepts would portray the latter as equally parasitic and positional:

  • An object is green just in case it is observed before 2010 and is grue, or else is not so observed and is bleen.
  • An object is blue just in case it is observed before 2010 and is bleen, or else is not so observed and is grue.

Goodman marks the distinction between the two pairs of concepts by saying that green and blue (along with hypotheses framed in terms of them) are projectible, whereas grue and bleen (along with hypotheses framed in terms of them) are not.

To say that the concepts are projectible means that they can occur in inductively strong inferences like

All observed emeralds are green.
Hence, all emeralds are green.

By contrast, grue and bleen are not projectible; the argument

All observed emeralds are grue.
Hence, all emeralds are grue.

has a true premise, and the generalizations that all emeralds are green and that all emeralds are grue have exactly the same (observed) positive instances to date (precisely the same observed things are green and grue until 2010). But we cannot correctly project (or to infer) the hypothesis that all emeralds are grue.

It is impossible to consistently project both green and grue. The claim that all emeralds are green entails that emeralds not examined before 2010 are green; the claim that all are grue entails that those not examined before 2010 are blue, and hence not green. Indeed, if we are willing to project just any concepts, a judicious selection of weird concepts will enable us to confirm virtually anything.

Goodman's example seems less whimsical when we note that it is really just an instance of the ubiquitous underdetermination of hypotheses by finite bodies of data. Consider the case of fitting a curve to a finite number of data points. No matter how many points we have plotted thus far, many different curves can be drawn to include all of them. Such underdetermination is a general problem for any sort of inductive inference, from a child's acquisition of a first language to intricate chains of inference in archaeology or microphysics. This means that we need some way to restrict the set of hypotheses we are to consider, and focusing on those with projectible concepts is one way to do this.

Return to Relativism: §1: A Framework for Relativism
Return to Relativism: §2: Dependent Variables: What is Relative?
Return to Relativism: §3: Independent Variables: Relative to What?
Return to Relativism: §4: Arguments For Relativism
Return to Relativism: §5: Arguments Against Relativism
Return to Relativism: Table of Contents

Copyright © 2003 by
Chris Swoyer

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