Notes to Peirce's Deductive Logic

1. Peano's arithmetic, Russell and Whitehead's systems, Gentzen's natural deductive systems, Hilbert's programs, and Gödel's incompleteness theorems are prime examples.

2. See the papers by Brady, Burch, Iliff, and Merrill in Houser et al. (eds.) 1997.

3. For a number of manuscripts written between these two papers, see Dipert 2004, pp. 297–299.

4. According to Peirce's terminology, there are three kinds of predicates: ‘absolute terms,’ ‘simple relative terms,’ and ‘conjugative terms’ (DNLR CP:3.63). In modern terminology, these correspond to monadic, dyadic and ternary predicates. Also, there is a controversy between ‘relatives’ and ‘relations.’ See Merrill 1997, pp. 160–163. “I conclude that [Peirce's] simple relative terms stand for dyadic relations” (p. 162).

5. “Some As are Bs” is an existential statement. Peirce and others called them particular propositions. “As for particular propositions, Boole could not accurately express them at all” (DNLR CP:3.138).

6. In Boole's expressions, the variable v is somewhat special: it denotes an “indefinite class.” There are alternative notations adopted by Peirce for existential statements: 0ab = 0 (for “Some a is b”) and 0a = 0 (for “Some a is not b”) (DNLR CP:3.141). For Mitchell, refer to his “On a new algebra of logic,” (1883: 75).

7. Benjamin Peirce placed mathematics before logic. Charles Peirce gave full credit to his father's warning against not-so-mathematical philosophical reasoning, and this steered him away from his early ambition to combine philosophy, logic, and mathematics [CP: 1.560, c. 1905 unpublished letter-article to the editor of The Nation on pragmatism].

8. Houser correctly observes that “[w]hat is most evident in his work is the importance Peirce attached to his basic analysis of relations” (Houser et al. 1997: 14).

9. This emerges later as an issue of non-computability with relations (Dipert 1984a) and a distinction between corollarial and theorematic reasoning (Hintikka 1980 and Shin 1994).

10. A pair could consist of identical objects.

11. We return to this issue below, where we discuss Peirce's existential graphs.

12. Is it the same as Boole's enterprise? §2 of Van Evra 1997 nicely explores a subtle but important difference in the relation between mathematics and logic in Boole and Peirce.

13. The collection in Houser et al. 1997 has many valuable papers on these issues. See the ones by Van Evra, Merrill, Brady, Iliff, and Burch.

14. Our modern notation is used here. The expression ‘φ(x)’ is a formula whose unbound variable is x. More rules are found in the undated Note, CP: 3.403A–3.403M (1885b).

15. Why EG was neglected is another story which the entry does not aim to explore fully. However, it is an interesting project. See Pietarinen 2011.

16. Peirce's letter (1882) to O.H. Mitchell showed that he had started playing around with the possibility of graphically representing relations. See Roberts 1973, p. 18.

17. Peirce's theory of signs is complicated. See the entry on Peirce's theory of signs and Short 2009, Ch. 8.

18. For example, 1885a CP: 3.359–3.362, and CP: 2.247–2.249 (c. 1903, ms. “Nomenclature and Divisions of Triadic Relations, as far as they are determined”). Also, see Dipert 1996.

19. See Grattan-Guinness 2002, and Shin 2012 for a discussion of the relationship between Peirce's ideas and Kempe's.

20. For the comparison between these two graphical systems, see Shin 2002, pp. 48–53.

21. If we desire to match the syntax and the reading method in an obvious way, we may have the following alternative definition for well-formed diagrams:

  1. An empty space is a well-formed diagram.
  2. Any letter is a well-formed diagram.
  3. If D is a well-formed diagram, then a single cut of D (‘[D]’) is a well-formed diagram as well.
  4. If D1 and D2 are well-formed diagrams, then all of the followings are also well-formed:
    1. D1 D2
    2. [D1 D2]
    3. [D1 [D2]]
    4. [[D1][D2]]
  5. Nothing else is a well-formed diagram.

22. For the proof of the legitimacy of the Multiple readings algorithm, refer to Shin 2002, §4.2.2 where the equivalence of the Endoporeutic and the Multiple readings is proven.

23. “For any graph P, let ‘{P}’ denote the place of P” (Roberts 1973: 38). [My note.]

24. Although the matter is not yet settled, Dau (2006) has raised a question about one of the rules.

25. Examples in Peirce (1903b CP:4.455) nicely illustrate the visual effect of an identity line.

26. X is evenly (oddly) enclosed if and only X is enclosed by an even (odd) number of cuts.

27. For more complex examples, see Peirce 1903b CP:4.502 and 1906 CP:4.571.

28. According to the Endoporeutic reading, we get the following reading first: “It is not the case that something is good but not ugly.” If we adopt the Multiple readings, we may directly obtain the above reading: “Everything good is ugly.”

Copyright © 2013 by
Sun-Joo Shin <>
Eric Hammer

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