Notes to Descartes' Mathematics

1. Given the primary goal to situate La Géométrie in the philosophical debates surrounding early modern mathematical practice, there will be no discussion of Book Three, the section of Descartes' work that stands as a primary impetus in the development of modern algebra. For an illuminating treatment of Book Three, see Bos (2001), Chapter 27.

2. This is not to say that these more complicated curves were required for solutions to these problems. See, for instance, Panza (2011), 59-61 for solutions to the problem of angle trisection that did not rely on the spiral.

3. Note here the difficulty of mapping Viète's stages of exegetics and zetetics onto Pappus's stages of analysis and synthesis. Pappus claims that synthesis involves the reversal of analysis, but for Viète, there is no such reversal. Rather, the analysis that is applied in the stage of exegetics involves an elaboration of a problem in terms of equations, whereas the synthesis in the stage of zetetic involves constructions in the plane, and importantly, the analysis does not indicate how to construct the curve required to complete the synthesis. A similar issue arises in Descartes' La Géométrie (see section 3.2). As such, what we find in Viète (and later in Descartes) is that an essential ingredient of their early modern algebraic analysis is treating what is sought after as known, which is accomplished by the use of variables to represent both known and unknown quantities.

4. When Descartes presents Beeckman the specimen of algebra in 1628, he promises to supply his more complete Parisian Algebra at a later time. However, it is not clear whether Descartes actually gave Beeckman the complete Algebra, since Descartes reports to Mersenne in a letter from 25 January 1638 that no one has a copy of his Algebra (AT I, 501). What is certain is that he gave Beeckman at least some parts of that project in early 1629, because they were transcribed by Beeckman in his Journal.

5. The problem I present here is one that van Schooten uses to clarify Descartes' analytic procedure in his 1683 annotated Latin version of La Géométrie, and it is glossed over by Smith and Latham in G, p. 9, Note 12. It is worth noting that Smith and Latham's treatment of the problem is somewhat misleading. They claim that the problem illustrates Descartes' directive that we are to reduce a determinate geometrical problem to a set of equations, which we must solve simultaneously (see G, p. 9, Note 11). However, this directive from Descartes only applies when we are dealing with multiple unknowns, in which case we establish an equation for each unknown in the problem. When there is only one unknown, as in the example above, there is only equation to which the problem must be reduced. Smith and Latham claim, in contrast, that we reduce the above problem to x = b2 / (ab) and also to (a + b + x)*(x) = (b + x)2. However, these two equations are equivalent and thus, do not offer a set of equations that can be solved simultaneously.

6. In this case and throughout La Géométrie, Descartes uses oblique coordinates that are intrinsic to the problem. That is, the coordinates designate distances that are given naturally by the figures in the problem. In contemporary analytic geometry, we use typically use orthogonal axes (with x as the horizontal axis and y as the vertical axis) for our coordinate system, and these axes are, as it were, extrinsic to the problem.

7. The mesolabe compass is presented again at the opening of Book Three, where Descartes uses the compass to solve the problem of constructing mean proportionals, the same problem for which the compass was used in 1619 (see section 2.2 and G, 152–157).

Copyright © 2011 by
Mary Domski <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.