Notes to Conservation Biology

1. Soulé (1987); see, also, Sarkar (1998b). No history of conservation biology exists at present.

2. See MacArthur and Wilson (1967). This theory was based on the assumption that the number of species on an island was an equilibrium between extinction, immigration, and a few other ecological processes.

3. See International Union for the Conservation of Nature (IUCN) (1980). There is no evidence that any serious internal discussion of the limitations of island biogeography occurred before its endorsement by the IUCN.

4. See Mann and Plummer (1995) for the only attempt at a detailed history of the SLOSS debate.

5. Conservation biologists in the United States have often claimed to pay serious attention to the normative basis for conservation — see Environmental Ethics.

6. Biological Conservation, Vol. 50 (1989). Caughley and Gunn (1996) was the first textbook from the Australian perspective.

7. See Margules et al. (1988) which will be further discussed below.

8. Historical material about “biodiversity” is from Takacs (1996).

9. See Takacs (1996, p. 39; italics as in the original): “In 1988, biodiversity did not appear as a keyword in Biological Abstracts, and biological diversity appeared once. In 1993, biodiversity appeared seventy-two times, and biological diversity nineteen times.”

10. See Primack (1993), which is simplistic, and Meffe and Caroll (1994) which is almost too encyclopediac.

11. Sarkar (1998b) and Kingsland (2002) appear to be the only secondary sources for this history; much more work on this fascinating topic remains to be done.

12. For more information on the NFMA, see the EMC National Forest Management Act Group Page.

13. See Zaber, D. J., “Southern Lessons: Saving Species through the National Forest Management Act”.

14. Gilpin and Soulé (1986) perceptively trace the origin of the concept of the minimum viability population to the 1976 National Forest Management Act.

15. This was Shaffer's (1978) original proposal which was widely adopted. See, for example, Hanski (1999), p. 71.

16. However, is 95 % a sufficiently high probability? Or, perhaps, it is too high? Is 100 years the appropriate time horizon?

17. This criticism was emphasized by Margules (1989).

18. As with most scientists, Caughley presumably borrowed this term from Kuhn (1962). It is being put within quotes here to note the presence of many philosophical problems with its use. For a response to Caughley, see Hedrick et al. (1996).

19. See Margules and Pressey (2000) which will be analyzed in detail in § 6.1; Groves et al. (2002) presented the Nature Conservancy's framework. Unfortunately, some of the terminology in Groves et al. (2002) is out of date. For instance, “target” is used for “surrogate.” However, unlike Margules and Pressey (2002), it draws explicit attention to the viability problem for which it should be recommended. Slightly earlier, and independent of Margules and Pressey, Craig L. Shafer (1999) of the United States National Park Service provided a sketch of a similar framework for selecting national parks, primarily but not entirely in the context of the United States. However, Shafer's outline was not as systematic as that of Margules and Pressey (2000). In passing, it should be noted that the consensus is not complete — see Soulé and Terborgh (1999) for the rather different approach of the “Wildlands Project” for North America.

20. The term “adaptive management” was invented by Holling (personal communication) in 1975. See, also, Holling (1978) for its first appearance in print.

21. This is to be distinguished from prioritization for biodiversity content (see below).

22. This is an an extension and modification of the six-stage process proposed by Margules and Pressey (2000).

23. GIS representations are “models” in a the most innocuous sense of “model,” insofar as any representation of an empirical system is a model. In the terminology of Suppes (1962), they are models of data. See Ecology for a more detailed discussion of the epistemology of models in this context.

24. Sarkar (2004) discusses this issue in more detail.

25. See, for instance, IUCN (1983), which does not offer a biological basis for this target.

26. See, for instance, Araújo et al. (2001).

27. There are also issues, important for biodiversity conservation, but not usually regarded as part of conservation biology because they are not yet sufficiently precisely defined, which will not be addressed in this entry. The most important of these are those connected with the concepts of ecological restoration and sustainability.

28. See Sarkar (1999) for arguments supporting the maintenance of an important distinction between wilderness preservation and biodiversity conservation. Callicott and Nelson (1998) collect some of the earlier contributions to this debate.

29. For more details of the argument for the change in terminology, see Sarkar (2003).

30. See, especially, the important and highly influential arguments of Guha (1989).

31. See Sarkar et al. (2004) for a discussion of the intellectual lineage of this terminology.

32. For reviews, see Csuti et al. (1997), Pressey et al. (1997), and Sarkar et al. (2004).

33. The independent introductions were by Kirkpatrick (1983) in Australia, Ackery and Vane-Wright (1984) in Britain, Margules et al. (1988) in Australia, and Rebelo and Siegfried (1990) in South Africa. Justus and Sarkar (2002) provide a history.

34. These heuristic algorithms have been incorporated into a variety of software packages, e. g., C-Plan (Ferrier et al. 2000), Marxan (Ball and Possingham 2000), and ResNet (Garson et al. 2002b) which are used for conservation planning. Besides a complementarity-based heuristic algorithm, Marxan also implements a simulated annealing metaheuristic algorithm.

35. This is known to be an economical algorithm; see Sarkar et al. (2002).

36. See Kirkpatrick et al. (1983) for simulated annealing; Ball (2000) and Ball and Possingham (2000) describe its use for the CAN selection problem as implemented in Marxan.

37. Justus and Sarkar (2002) review the history.

38. The possibility of using stochastic dynamic programming for this problem was first pointed out by Possingham et al. (1991).

39. The term “objective” will be used here, rather than “target,” so as not to confuse this use of “target” with its use to indicate the desired level of representation in CANs.

40. The discussion of the rest of this section is based on Sarkar and Margules (2002); see, also, Sarkar (2002).

41. See Vane-Wright et al. (1991); Faith (1992); and Williams et al. (1994).

42. See Sarkar (1998a) and Lewontin (2000) for further discussion of this point.

43. See Magurran (1988) for a good discussion.

44. The three terms generally correspond to a sequential increase in spatial scale.

45. This important point was first emphasized by Landres et al. (1988).

46. See Nix (1982) and Faith and Walker (1996a). The use of environmental surrogates has recently become a matter of controversy. See Araújo et al. (2001) for criticism, Faith (2003) for a reply, and Araújo et al. (2003) for a rejoinder.

47. Scott et al. (2002) collect papers representing the current state-of-the-art.

48. During the last decade, the use of genetic algorithms has led to some optimism — see Stockwell and Peters (1999) and Peterson (2001).

49. The technique of using species accummulation curves to assess surrogacy was devised by Ferrier and Watson (1997) and improved by Ward et al. (1999), in both cases, working in Australia.

50. This method is similar to the more sophisticated third method below with all targets implicitly set equal to 1.

51. See Sarkar et al. (2000) and Garson et al. (2002a).

52. See, for instance, Simberloff (1998), Andelman and Fagan (2000), Lindenmayer et al. (2002) and Faith (2003); Garson et al. (2002a) are only slightly more optimistic.

53. Usually PVAs are performed using demographic models (see Boyce [1992]). However, habitat-based viability analyses (Roloff and Haufler 1997) fare no better with respect to the criticism being made here.

54. See McCarthy et al. (2003). Wimsatt (1981) calls such a reliability assessment “robust.”

55. The heuristic rules used by Cameron (2003) were suggested by the work of Sierra et al. (2002).

56. See, in particular, the influential criticisms of Guha (1989).

57. However, this terminology is not entirely satisfactory since it alludes to temporal agreement which is not at stake here.

58. It has occasionally been used to identify high priority biodiversity conservation areas, for instance, by Sierra et al. (2002) in the case of continental Ecuador. However, the utility function in this example, as is typically the case, is largely arbitrary.

59. Finding these non-dominated solutions is equivalent to finding indifference curves in economics. See Sarkar and Garson (2004) for a full description of this method.

60. See Triantaphyllou (2000) for a comparative survey.

61. See Taylor et al. (1996) and, especially, Sarkar (2004). Berry (1996, p. 2) explicitly calls for the use of a cost-benefit analysis of all scientific research on Bayesian grounds, using Bayesian methods. Even if this is not generally acceptable, there is little reason to doubt that formal decision-making protocols are likely to be valuable in disciplines such as conservation biology (and medicine).

62. The literature on bounded rationality is large. Jones (1999) provides a recent review, though one oriented towards political scientists.

63. Hubbel (2001) provides an important exception. The emphasis on particularities and place has led to claims that conservation biology is a postmodern science — see Oelschlaeger (1995). For a review, see Sarkar (1996b).

64. Kingsland (2002) has argued that the development of place prioritization algorithms shows the incorporation of techniques from operations research. While it is true that the same algorithms were also studied in operations research, during the late 1980s and early 1990s, when most of these algorithms were being developed within the biological community, there is no evidence of contact between the biologists who developed these algorithms and operations research professionals. Rather it is only after 2000 that techniques explicitly introduced within operations research, for instance, meta-heuristic algorithms such as Tabu search, began to be incorporated within conservation biology.

65. There have been several attempts in recent years, often drawing upon resources from formal learning theory, to interpret scientific theories as procedures for generating reliable knowledge, rather than the end-products of the execution of such procedures — see, for instance, Kelly and Glymour (2004). Such a view of scientific theories has much in common with the algorithmic view that conservation biology and many other applied sciences seem to require.

66. The medical analogy goes back to Soulé (1985) and has been particularly emphasized by Sarkar (2002).

Copyright © 2004 by
Sahotra Sarkar

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.