Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Spinoza's Theory of Attributes

1. All the Spinoza references are from The Collected Works of Spinoza, Vol. I, trans. Edwin Curley, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985. The following common abbreviations have been used to refer to Spinoza's writings: E = Ethics, Ep = Correspondence (epistolae), KV= Short Treatise on God, Man and his Well-being. When referring to the Ethics these common forms and abbreviations are used: ax. = axiom, cor. = corollary, dem. = demonstration, P = proposition, Schol. = scholium, e.g. “2P47” refers to Part Two of the Ethics, Proposition 47. References in the Short Treatise are given by referring to the pagination in the Gerbhart edition of Spinoza Opera, 4 vols. (Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925). These references are indicated thus, e.g. I/25= Vol. I, p. 25.

2. A more detailed characterization of the basic structure of Spinoza's metaphysics is heavily affected by the different ways in which the theory of attributes can be interpreted. For example, the construal of the infinity of attributes as numeric or as totality affects the number of attributes involved, and thus alters the characterization. This is why it is stressed that this depiction is merely rudimentary.

3. Descartes, of course, is an important example. Cf. Principles of Philosophy, Part I, §51–52, CSM, I p. 210, AT 24–25. All Descartes references are from The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, translated by John Cottingham, Robert Stoothoff, Dugald Murdoch, Vols. I and II, (Cambridge Cambridgeshire; New York: Cambridge University Press, 1984). The pagination from the standard edition of Descartes' writings edited by Charles Adam and Paul Tannery is also noted. The following common abbreviations have been used, e.g., CSM, I, p. 210, AT 25, indicates p. 210 in the first volume of The Philosophical Writings of Descartes and p. 25 in the Adam and Tannery edition.

4. Descartes makes a distinction between the principal attribute and other attributes a substance might have. What makes the principal attribute, principal, so to speak, is that all attributes of a substance must be thought of through the principal attribute. To illustrate this, Descartes explains that motion, although an attribute of Extension, is not principal, since we can only make sense of motion as occurring in an extended space. (Principles, I, §53, CSM, I, p. 210, AT 25).

5. Cf. Section 1.3

6. The issue of the number of attributes is addressed in Section 1.9.1.

7. For a full treatment of all ambiguities cf. Francis Haserot, S, “Spinoza's Definition of Attribute,” in Studies in Spinoza, Critical and Interpretive Essays, ed. S. Paul Kashap (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1972).

8. “Finally, a conceptual distinction [read ‘rational distinction’] is a distinction between a substance and some attribute of that substance without which the substance is unintelligible; alternatively, it is a distinction between two such attributes of a single substance. Such a distinction is recognized by our inability to form a clear and distinct idea of the substance if we exclude from it the attribute in question, or, alternatively, by our inability to perceive clearly the idea of one of the two attributes if we separate it from the other” (Principles, I, 63, CSM, I p. 214 AT 30).

9. It is irrelevant for this issue whether “infinite” is considered as a totality or as an infinite number.

10. There is a debate in Cartesian scholarship as to the status of individual bodies and the number of corporeal substances to which Descartes is committed. He can be seen as holding that there is a multiplicity of finite extended substances (such as a stone (AT, VII, 44)), and other places where he seems to hold that there is only one extended substance (Synopsis to the Meditation CSM II, 10, AT 14). For different views on the issue see Paul Hoffman, “The Unity of Descartes's Man,” The Philosophical Review 95, no. 3 (1986); Eric Palmer, “Descartes on Nothing in Particular,” in New Essays on the Rationalists, ed. Rocco J. Gennaro and Charles Huenemann (New York: Oxford University Press, 1999), 26–47; Alice Sowaal, “Cartesian Bodies,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 34, no. 2 (2004) 217–40; and Thomas Lennon, “The Eleatic Descartes,” Journal of the History of Philosophy 45, no. 1 (2007) 29–47.

11. For a more comprehensive survey of this issue cf. Noa Shein, “The False Dichotomy between Objective and Subjective Interpretations of Spinoza's Theory of Attributes,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, forthcoming (2009).

12. Cf. footnote 7.

13. Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, Elizabeth Sanderson Haldane, and Frances H. Simson, Hegel's Lectures on the History of Philosophy, 3 vols. (London New York: Routledge and Kegan Paul ; Humanities Press, 1974) 252–90.

14. For objections to subjectivism, see for example, Martial Gueroult, Spinoza I – Dieu (Ethique, I) (Hildesheim: G. Olms, 1968) 50 and Appendix 3; Alan Donagan, Spinoza (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1989) 70; Alan Donagan, “Essence and the Distinction of Attributes in Spinoza's Metaphysics,” in Spinoza, a Collection of Critical Essays, ed. Marjorie Glicksman Grene (Garden City, N.Y.: Anchor Books, 1973); Haserot, “Definition of Attribute,” 38; Della Rocca, Representation 157n.4, 57; and Bennett, Spinoza's Ethics 146.

15. As examples of commentators who think there are more than two attributes see Haserot, “Definition of Attribute,” 32; Della Rocca, Representation 4, 35; and Delahunty, Spinoza 117. Bennett claims that Spinoza can be read as holding that there are only two, although he admits the text is inconclusive on this matter. Bennett, Spinoza's Ethics 75–79.

16. Wolfson argues that by “infinite” Spinoza means the negation of finitude or determination. Harry Austryn Wolfson, The Philosophy of Spinoza, Unfolding the Latent Processes of His Reasoning (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard university press, 1934) 134. Allison also explains infinity in terms of not being limited, determined or produced. Henry E. Allison, Benedict De Spinoza: An Introduction (New Haven: Yale University Press, 1987) 63. Bennett argues for the view that infinite means totality rather than more than two (Bennett, Spinoza's Ethics 75–79). Aaron Garrett, Meaning in Spinoza's Method (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003) 63.